2009.03.14

Michel Foucault

Introduction à l'Anthropologie (published in one volume with Foucault's translation of Emmanuel Kant's Anthropologie d'un point de vue pragmatique)

Michel Foucault, Introduction à l'Anthropologie (published in one volume with Foucault's translation of Emmanuel Kant's Anthropologie d'un point de vue pragmatique), Vrin, 2008, 272pp., €25.00 (pbk), ISBN 9782711619641.

Reviewed by Béatrice Han-Pile, University of Essex


Foucault's Introduction to Kant's Anthropology (henceforth IA) and his translation of the latter text make up his 'Thèse complémentaire de Doctorat', which was submitted in 1961 with his main thesis (later published as Histoire de la folie à l'âge classique). Although the translation was published in 1964 by Vrin, with a very short introduction by Foucault, the longer text (a 128 page manuscript kept at the Bibliothèque de la Sorbonne) remained unpublished until 2008. Its focus is the question of the relation between the Anthropology and the Critique, a question prompted for both exegetical and philosophical reasons.[1] Exegetical, because it is very difficult to date precisely the content of the Anthropology: although it is the last text published before Kant's death, it was also a course he gave (and constantly transformed) for over thirty years. Thus the first four sections of IA are devoted to retracing the genesis of the final version through comparison with other writings, both pre- (section 2) and post-critical (section 3).[2] Philosophical reasons, because for Foucault the key to a proper reconstruction and evaluation of both Kant's position and post-Kantian developments resides in understanding the relation between man as an empirical being and man as transcendental subject. The problem is introduced early on in IA, in the form of the following alternative:

was there from 1772 onwards, and underlying perhaps the Critique, a certain concrete image of man that no philosophical elaboration essentially altered, and which is formulated at last … in the last of Kant's published texts? … But it is also possible that the Anthropology was modified in its central elements as the critical endeavour developed. … This is to say that the Critique would add to its specific character of being a propaedeutic to philosophy a constitutive role in the birth and future of the concrete forms of human existence (IA: 12-13; note the use of the conditional and the numerous modal qualifiers).

How these speculations are to be resolved is of great importance both for Foucault's reading of Kant and for his interpretation of modernity. If the Critique turned out to be 'constitutive' for the Anthropology in such a way that the distinction between a priori conditions and empirical facts was preserved, then the Kantian project on the whole would be free of any empirico-transcendental slippage, and Kant's Anthropology could function as a model and point of reference for subsequent anthropologies. If, however, the relationship of subordination was reversed and the Anthropology 'underlaid' the Critique, then the resulting empirico-transcendental confusions would both throw in jeopardy Kant's critical project itself and cast an ominous shadow on the philosophical movements that grew from it. As is well known, five years later Foucault addressed in the Order of Things (henceforth OT), in particular chapters 7 and 9, the issue of the (in his view) nefarious role played by 'man' in contemporary thought. However IA is of particular interest at least for three reasons: (a) it is a close examination (the only long piece of writing he devoted to Kant)[3] of a text which Foucault clearly regarded as seminal, (b) it presents an interestingly ambiguous reading of Kant which oscillates between two incompatible theses (repetition or displacement of the Critique by the Anthropology), an ambiguity which is minimised but still present in OT, and (c) beyond Kant, it expands (from p. 67 onwards) on the nature and influence of anthropological thought itself and anticipates many of the themes which will be central to OT (not just the empirico-transcendental double but also, for example, the analytic of finitude as the circular attempt to give empirical conditions a transcendental role).[4]

So what does IA tell us about the relationship between the Anthropology and the Critique? Perhaps revealingly, Foucault's text is ambivalent almost to the end, and it is difficult to organise his various attempts at conceptualising the relation of the two texts.[5] Section 5 introduces the displacement thesis through an examination of the relation between Gemüt and Geist and the suggestion that the latter, as 'the principle which animates the spirit by means of the ideas' (IA: 39), may constitute the 'enigmatic nature of reason' discussed in the Transcendental Dialectics and the Canon of Pure Reason:

a worrying notion, which seems to suddenly refer the Critique at its apex towards an empirical region, a domain of facts where man would be destined to a most originary passivity. All of a sudden the transcendental would be repudiated, and the conditions of experience would refer to the primary inertia of a nature (IA: 40; note, again, the conditionals).

Foucault develops this claim by introducing the key theme of the 'originary'. Formally, this reason refers to the movement whereby transcendental conditions, which according to the Critique are timeless (being the condition of possibility of chronological time), are temporalised within experience by the Anthropology and consequently appear within the empirical field as pre-existing themselves (and thus originary, or 'primitive', as Derrida puts it in reference to Husserl).[6] Such movement is described by Foucault as follows:

the relationship between the given and the a priori takes in the Anthropology a structure which is the reverse of that which was uncovered by the Critique. What was a priori in the order of knowledge becomes in the order of concrete existence an originary which is not chronologically first, but which, as soon as it has appeared … reveals itself as already there (IA: 42).

Foucault hints (in rather Merleau-Pontyan terms) at various cases which according to him indicate the presence of the originary ('explorations of schemas which trace in space various sorts of insular syntheses', 'reorganisations in sensibility which allow the neighbouring [vicariance] from one sense to the other'). But his privileged example within Kant's work is the 'emergence of the spoken I' (IA: 41), a third term between the pure I of transcendental apperception, which accompanies all our judgments, and the empirical ego. The spoken I is the

empirical and manifest form, in which the synthetising activity of the [transcendental] I appears as an already synthetised figure, an indissociably primary and secondary structure: … when it appears, inserting itself in the multiplicity of a sensory chronicle, it presents itself as already there (IA: 41-42, my italics).

This retrospective temporalisation of the pure I into a spoken I (marked by the repeated use of the adverb 'already') disrupts the neat distinctions established by the Critique (between the transcendental and the empirical, activity and passivity, intellectual syntheses and sensory dispersion). For Foucault, the spoken I is neither the pure I of transcendental apperception nor the empirical ego offered to the inner sense through the form of time, but a hybrid form, both active and passive, a condition of possibility for experience which is nevertheless inscribed within experience itself on the paradoxical mode of self-preexistence. Thus 'what is an a priori of knowledge from the perspective of the Critique does not transpose itself immediately in anthropological reflection as an a priori of existence, but appears in the density of a becoming where its sudden emergence infallibly takes in retrospection the meaning of an already there' (IA: 42). For Foucault, such 'transposition' has two nefarious consequences. At best, the main benefit of the Critique, namely its ability to ground the possibility of secure empirical knowledge, will evaporate as it was entirely dependent on the separation between the transcendental and the empirical, the constitutive and the founded, and this will re-open the door to scepticism. At worst, anthropological thought will try to play the part previously given to the Critique and thus give transcendental value to empirical contents, in which case rather than being kept awake by the haunting questions of the skeptic, we shall promptly fall prey to the 'anthropological slumber' evoked in chapter 9 of OT.

The other, safer way to construe the relation of the Anthropology to the Critique is as a form of repetition which, while respectful of the empirico-transcendental distinction, performs two main functions: it allows for further investigations of man as an empirical being, and it prepares the passage from critical thought to the more mature 'transcendental philosophy' explored in the Opus Posthumum. This second (and incompatible with the first) interpretative line is presented in sections 7 and 8, and it is the one that Foucault will settle on in the final two sections:

the empiricity of the Anthropology cannot be grounded in-itself: it is only possible as a repetition of the Critique. … Thus the Anthropology will be doubly subordinated to the Critique: as a form of knowledge, to the conditions the latter stipulates and to the domain of experience it determines; as an exploration of finitude, to the primary and unsurpassable forms manifested by the Critique[7] (IA: 75; note that this time, the conditionals and modal qualifiers have disappeared).

This subordination of the Anthropology to the Critique is described through the introduction of another concept (symmetrical to the originary), namely the 'fundamental'. Its function is to ensure, through a dynamics which both inverts and complements that of transcendental foundation, the return from the post-hoc to the a priori. Whereas the introduction of the transcendental standpoint in the Critique was intended to determine, in advance of any empirical exploration, the universal structures to which experience would necessarily have to conform, the Anthropology's insistence on the fundamental emphasises the obligation, in order to avoid a relapse into naive empiricism or a 'naturalistic perspective in which a science of man would involve knowledge of nature' (IA: 49), to refer empirical contents back to their transcendental conditions. Thus while the world is our 'source' of knowledge, it can only be so on the basis of a 'transcendental correlation between passivity and spontaneity' (IA: 54). The world provides sensory impressions which, received through the forms of space and time (passivity), are synthetised by the activity of the understanding (spontaneity). Similarly, the world can only be a 'domain for action' against the background of the 'transcendental correlation between necessity and freedom' (IA: 54) detailed in the Transcendental Dialectics (third antinomy), which explains how human beings can both be empirically determined and noumenally free. Whereas the originary marked the displacement of the empirico-transcendental distinction, the fundamental is meant to reassert it in such a way that any empirical content is systematically referred to its transcendental conditions of possibility. Thus by means of its insistence on the fundamental, Kant's Anthropology provides the model of an empirical investigation which extends the scope of the Critique without contradicting its achievements. By contrast one must, Foucault tells us,

in the name of what anthropology must be in its essence in the whole of the philosophical field, reject all these 'philosophical anthropologies' which present themselves as a natural access to the fundamental. … Here and there one finds at play an illusion which is typical of Western philosophy since Kant (IA: 77).

In this vein the last two sections of IA are devoted to exploring, mostly on a promissory note, the consequences of the setting aside of the 'Kantian lesson' (IA: 75) exhibited by various post-Kantian attempts to 'exert critical thought at the level of positive knowledge' (ibid). What is characteristic of such cases is that the originary takes over the fundamental and 'deploys itself without any difference from the problematic of the necessary to that of existence; it confuses the analysis of conditions and the interrogation of finitude. One day one will have to envisage the whole development of post Kantian philosophy from the perspective of this maintained confusion, of this denounced confusion' (IA: 67). For Foucault, Husserlian phenomenology is a typical example of such a development (and Husserl is the only such philosophical example identified by name in IA): while it was meant to 'liberate the regions of the a priori from the forms in which reflections on the originary had confiscated it, the effort to escape from the originary as immediate subjectivity ultimately referred to the originary conceived in the density of passive syntheses and of the already there' (IA: 67). Foucault expands on this theme in his analysis of the cogito in OT:

If man is … that paradoxical figure in which the empirical contents of knowledge necessarily release, of themselves, the conditions that have made them possible [the originary], then man cannot posit himself in the immediate and sovereign transparency of a cogito [the 'immediate subjectivity' referred to in IA]; nor, on the other hand, can he inhabit the objective inertia of something that, by rights, does not and never can lead to self consciousness (OT: 322).

The first half of this sentence points to the inscription of the transcendental within the empirical characteristic of the originary (thus the contents necessarily release 'the conditions that have made them [transcendentally] possible'). Since it now appears determined by empirical contents, subjectivity cannot be defined a priori, in the 'immediate and sovereign transparency of a cogito', yet nor can it be naturalistically reduced to empirical processes.

Thus an intermediate level is introduced, that of temporal and spatial passive syntheses which denote a form of spontaneous activity but are structurally incapable of being captured by consciousness: they are a dependent aspect of conscious experience in the sense that, while they are a condition of its possibility, they are never given on their own (for Husserl we only apperceive intentional wholes) and can only be characterised abstractedly, by means of such technical procedures as the epochê and transcendental reduction. A structural instability follows from this. On the one hand, man 'extends from a part of itself not reflected in the cogito [the passive syntheses] to the act of thought by which it apprehends that part' (OT: 322), presumably with the hope of establishing a mediated (rather than immediate, as in the Cartesian cogito) self-transparency. Should all these contents become fully known, perhaps the possibility of a clear foundation for knowledge would be restored.[8] On the other hand, such an attempt is doomed from the start: man 'extends from that pure apprehension [the act of thinking] to the empirical clutter, … the weight of experiences constantly eluding themselves [passive syntheses]' (OT: 322). The more man tries to clarify these experiences by apprehending them in thought, the more they recede from consciousness. Correlatively, such experiences are both perceived as external to the activity of thinking itself and yet as somehow constitutive of the thinking subject: thus 'the question is no longer: how can the experience of nature give rise to necessary judgments? But rather … how can [man] be in the forms of non-thinking' (OT: 324). Yet the very formulation of the question is symptomatic of the anthropological inflection of the Copernican turn. Only within the analytic of finitude can the issue of the paradoxical identity between man as a transcendental subject and man as an empirical content, and the idea of a third, originary level, appear and become of central importance.

Thus the mistake of subsequent 'philosophical anthropologies' will be to 'give anthropology the value of a critique, a critique freed from the prejudices and the inert weight of the a priori, whereas it can only give access to the region of the fundamental if it remains subordinated to the Critique' (IA: 76). OT will develop this prophetic announcement in great detail through the introduction of the twin themes of man as the empirico-transcendental double and of the analytic of finitude as the type of inquiry which, unbeknownst to itself, seeks to ground transcendental conditions in empirical determinations and thus perverts the Kantian legacy. It goes beyond the remit of this review to examine in detail the ways in which OT tries to cash out the promissory notes of IA. [9] Note, however, that Foucault's analyses of the doubles, while they do a great deal to clarify the structure of the analytic of finitude, remain notoriously allusive and shy away from the sort of case studies that could establish their relevance to contemporary thought, and in particular to phenomenology, one of Foucault's main targets. This, and modal uncertainties in the text about the necessary (vs contingent) character of the anthropological shift to the originary, makes them difficult to evaluate.

This raises two crucial questions: firstly, was the transition from criticism to the anthropological slumber necessary? In this respect, IA is of particular interest because (contrary to OT) it suggests that the answer has to be negative. Kant himself succeeded in avoiding the confusions of the originary and thus showed that a form of anthropology which remains faithful to the spirit of the critical project was possible. Yet remember that although, on balance, Foucault did reach this conclusion, the detail of his analyses in IA is much more ambiguous and points out repeatedly that there are ways of construing the Anthropology as a displacement, not just a repetition, of the empirico-transcendental divide. This suggests that from the start Foucault was somewhat unsure about the modality of his claims, and that the overall verdict of IA may have been at least partially guided by his desire to rescue Kant from the post-Kantians. This, however, raises a second question: was Foucault right in his identification of cases in which the Anthropology allegedly blurred the empirico-transcendental divide? Or could alternative readings be plausibly envisaged? For example, in the test case of the 'spoken I', one could also see the 'emergence' of the originary highlighted by Foucault as a false problem arising from a misapprehension of the nature of transcendental conditions and a conflation between two different things. These are on the one hand, the developmental perspective in which a child will learn to speak and develop rational abilities and, on the other, the fact that if or when someone is in possession of such abilities, then this will entail that a certain number of transcendental conditions must hold at that particular time, in particular that we should be able to synthetise the sensory manifold by means of judgments which involve the pure I of transcendental apperception. But it does not follow from this that such an 'I' itself should be recaptured within the element of the genesis that the developmental story focuses on. In other words, one could imagine an alternative interpretation according to which, rather than a temporalisation of the transcendental, what is at stake is an instantiation which can be identified at a particular time (say, once the child has learned to speak) but which itself is not temporal. In such a case, there would be no reason to think that the 'synthetic activity of the I appears as an already synthetised figure, as an indissociably primary and secondary structure' (IA: 41). On the contrary, these formulations could be criticised for coming dangerously close to the sort of error denounced in the paralogisms of pure reason, namely the confusion between the formal, atemporal I of transcendental apperception and a substantial ego developing itself through time.

This reading is not without difficulties (and developmental stories are notoriously difficult to accommodate with the framework of transcendental philosophy), but it is not without plausibility either. This, per se, could be enough to make us wonder whether Foucault's identification of empirico-transcendental confusions may not have been hasty in other instances as well. This is a question I must leave open, although it is not hard to imagine other cases. For example, Sartre's early thought could be interpreted, not as a victim of the confusions specific to the originary, but as an attempt to reinstate the empirico-transcendental distinction in its original purity, in particular by insisting on the pure activity of consciousness and the impossibility of identifying it with any empirical content (in The Transcendence of the Ego). At any rate, it remains that IA forms the pre-history of OT, a matrix in which several of Foucault's central claims were first introduced and tested out. Readers should feel privileged to have access to the laboratory of thought, so to speak, where a very influential book was slowly distilled.



[1] Note, however, that although it is very relevant to Foucault's own concerns (thus already in 1952-3 he was teaching a course on 'Knowledge of Man and Transcendental Reflection' at the University of Lille, his oldest preserved manuscript), this question is not particularly central to more recent commentaries on the Anthropology, which tend to focus more on historical issues or on its relation to the Critique of Practical Reason and to the Critique of Judgment. See for example: J. H. Zammito, Kant, Herder and the Birth of Anthropology, Chicago: Chicago UP, 2002; G. F. Munzel, Kant's Conception of Moral Character: the 'Critical' Link of Morality, Anthropology and Reflective Judgment, Chicago: Chicago UP, 1999; B. Jacobs & Patrick Kain (eds.), Essays on Kant's Anthropology, Cambridge: CUP, 2008. The closest approach I could find is that of P. R. Frierson (Freedom and Anthropology in Kant's Moral Philosophy, Cambridge: CUP, 2003). The book starts (p. 2 ff) by quoting Schleiermacher's remark that there is a potential conflict in the Anthropology between two claims: (a) insofar as human beings are the objects of anthropological study, 'nature is choice' (e.g.: they are determined by empirical causes); yet (b) Kant also holds that our nature is what it is by virtue of the choice of our intelligible character, and thus 'choice is nature'. This raises issues similar to those Foucault is interested in but in the practical rather than in the epistemological register (e.g. the relation between the empirical and the noumenal rather than between the empirical and the transcendental). Like Foucault, Frierson concludes that Kant's account is not incoherent (see in particular chapters 5 and 6).

[2] Note that the sections are not numbered in the original text but simply separated by stars. I have numbered them for ease of reference. All translations are mine.

[3] The various versions of 'What is Enlightenment' are significantly shorter.

[4] See in particular p. 75 ff).

[5] Here is a shot at such organisation: while the first four sections try to establish the relation between the Anthropology and various other texts, sections 5 and 6 explore the displacement thesis and introduce the theme of the originary. By contrast, sections 7 and 8 develop the repetition thesis and explore the idea that the Anthropology, while 'repeating' the above distinction, would 'convey' [acheminer] the Critique towards 'transcendental philosophy', itself understood in the light of the Opus Posthumum as a bridge between the system of the (a priori) metaphysical principles of the science of nature and physics as an (empirical) scientia naturalis. Finally, sections 9 and 10 decide in favour of the repetition thesis and expand on the consequences of anthropological thought trying to pass itself off as an empirical form of criticism.

[6] Cf. J. Derrida, Le problème de la genèse dans la philosophie de Husserl (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1990). For a more detailed account of these temporal paradoxes, and on the relation between transcendental conditions and empirical determination in the early Foucault's work, see B. Han-Pile, ''The Death of Man': Foucault and Humanism', in Timothy O'Leary & Christopher Falzon (eds.), Foucault and Philosophy, Oxford: Blackwell, forthcoming.

[7] Such as the impossibility of an intuitus intellectus in the case of human beings.

[8] Note that this is, in fact, a fallacy since even if the empirical limitations that bear on the transcendental could be spelled out, the fact would remain that the mere presence of empirical determinations at the transcendental level is enough to invalidate the possibility of providing universal and necessary conditions for knowledge.

[9] See H. Dreyfus and P. Rabinow: Michel Foucault: Beyond Structuralism and Hermeneutics, Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1983, in particular Part I, chapter 2; G. Gutting: Michel Foucault's Archaeology of Scientific Reason, Cambridge: CUP, 1989, in particular chapter 6; B. Han-Pile: Foucault's Critical Project: Between the Transcendental and the Historical, Stanford: Stanford UP, 2002, in particular part I.