2009.03.19

M. Jamie Ferreira

Kierkegaard

M. Jamie Ferreira, Kierkegaard, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 200pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405142786.

Reviewed by Edward F. Mooney, Syracuse University


Jamie Ferreira has written in short compass a subtle account of a writer in many ways uniquely difficult to summarize. Kierkegaard managed to deliver an abundance of 'perspicuous presentations' of the literary, philosophical, and religious strata of the culture he inhabited, and of the psychological, or 'spiritual' types it enclosed or set free. These efforts were, as Ferreira points out, simultaneously poetic and philosophical. The same Wittgenstein who called Kierkegaard the best of 19th century philosophers, wrote that 'philosophy ought really to be written only as a poetic composition'. And is there only one way to write a poetic composition? Kierkegaard's works are infinitely inventive in genre and presentation, which only adds to the difficulty of summarizing. Ferreira claims, and I agree, that no other thinker writes across as great a number of genres with as many literary devices, often deployed for novel and enigmatic ends -- not Plato, not Rousseau, not Sartre, not Nietzsche. He puts at his disposal lyric, satire, novella, slapstick, gentle humor, irony, bathos, fragment, tome, epistolary exchange, titillating confession, feuilleton, sermon, sophisticated academic polemic, newsprint screed, literary criticism, sociological analysis, journals, a book of absolutely nothing but prefaces, a 500 page 'postscript' to a book called Philosophical Fragments (or perhaps better, 'Crumbs' or 'Scraps' -- smuler) -- a 'postscript' that includes at the end its own retraction. Ferreira's challenge is to bring out an underlying order to this apparently unruly yet alluringly brilliant outpouring.

Those who know Ferreira's previous Kierkegaard work will not be surprised at her meticulous care in rendition as she undertakes walking us through the twisting arguments of over 30 books in under 200 pages. The effect is like letting the eye follow the strings of streets and buildings in those marvelous etched overviews of Paris, streets laid out with care, with glimpses of the partial exteriors of hundreds of varied buildings and the occasional park or riverbank, cramped, in miniature, yet inviting and riveting nonetheless. Before beginning these street-by-street, building-by-building walks, she provides general cautions.

One caution is her reminder that Kierkegaard's writings are not just poetic philosophy (or philosophical poetry) but simultaneously psychological, personal and religious, and that in their attack on bourgeois culture, they are also sociological and political. Apart from his 'discourses', which assume the recognizable shape of a sermon, no single piece of his output can be pigeonholed. Fear and Trembling, Kierkegaard tells us, is a dialectical-lyric -- but exactly what genre is that? The Postscript is not just 'unscientific'; it is "a mimical-pathetical-dialectical compilation" -- and what's that? Nor can we pigeonhole the oeuvre in toto. We're dealing with multiple dimensions, imbrications, and tangles. Kierkegaard continually confounds the ready-made distinctions among the psychological, personal, literary, religious, moral, and social (and so forth). An overview can't tease out each of these dimensions and their interweaving in a particular work, but we need Ferreira's caution that these texts are multi-layered in this way.

There is a second caution to bear in mind. Kierkegaard hardly ever leaves us with a simple conclusion or position. He develops positions contrapuntally and in tension with their contraries, avoiding dialectical "one-sidedness", as Ferreira puts it. Truth may involve the subjective standpoint, but it is also, we're told, objectivity. The ethical life may be an advance on the rootlessness of the aesthetic, yet that very rootlessness can verge on the religious. By constantly qualifying his positions, Kierkegaard escapes premature closure or theoretical finality. Pronounced theses can solidify into one-sided dogmas. He subverts this possibility by having earlier texts qualify later ones, by having this pseudonym counter that, by having the author of Postscript take back his arguments at the finish. Dialectical and dialogical tensions put on hold simple once-for-all conclusions. Furthermore, his lavish use of pseudonyms (Hilarius Bookbinder, Johannes de Silentio, The Watchman of Copenhagen, and over half a dozen others) leaves it always open for a reader to inquire whether a position is Kierkegaard's or only the pseudonym's -- the pseudonym perhaps speaking against Kierkegaard. It only complicates matters that even the signature "S. Kierkegaard" seems to function sometimes as a pseudonym. If this is a dizzying hall of mirrors, it is also irresistible and revealing.

Ferreira's third caution makes salient a feature of Kierkegaard's corpus often overlooked or underplayed. Specialists know that alongside the pseudonymous production (Either/Or, Fear and Trembling, and the like) Kierkegaard published many slim books of sermonic 'discourses' or 'talks' under his own name. Ferreira makes this fact explicit, employing the interweaving strands in a 'visual' organizational device. As she sees it, rather than a single line of publication, Kierkegaard's works appear as a double unfolding. As Either/Or appeared, so did a set of 'complementary' discourses; along with Fear and Trembling, a different set of coordinate discourses appeared. It's like a double helix, two spiraling lines in temporally extended conversation. Ferreira is the first to tell the story of Kierkegaard's authorship keeping these talks constantly in view along with the wider drama of the pseudonyms.

There are over 85 non-pseudonymous 'discourses' in all, constituting one string of the double helix. To philosophers used to the impersonal address of argument, these must appear something of an awkward curiosity. If only for this reason, it's worth saying a bit about their nature before moving to those texts that are cast more argumentatively. The sermonic or devotional talks no doubt function to keep Kierkegaard's religious motives and vocation always explicit, for himself and for others. Keeping two strands in motion also allowed him to approach a single conundrum simultaneously from two perspectives. Kierkegaard's discourse or sermon on Job has quite a different 'feel' from the discussion of Job that appears in Constantine Constantius's Repetition -- published on the same October day as the discourse and Fear and Trembling. (The massive Either/Or had come out in February: 1843 was a miraculously abundant year for Kierkegaard.) These talks are meant to inspire and touch their readers in intimate, religious ways. A number of them are called, in English translation, 'edifying', or 'upbuilding'. In an age of bodybuilders and heavy lifting, the muscularity saturating 'upbuilding' makes me flinch -- though there is hardly a translation alternative. Ferreira gives a gloss on these beautifully crafted devotions that happily veers in quite another direction. They are, she says, "humble, sad, but hopeful". Filling in, we might say that they bring us to humility: craving transformation of spirit, there is no button to push to athletically 'Just do it!' Realigning the soul is terribly difficult, if not entirely out of our singular power. Beyond humility, sadness supervenes: earnestly pondering one's failings is a sad, if not painful business -- so much do our spiritual lives leave to be desired. Yet these talks are hopeful: the speaker addresses us in hope, in faith and in love, and is a ministering conduit for the power of these. The talks are "humble, sad, but hopeful" -- 'upbuilding' misses the mark; 'downsizing' might push in a better direction; 'devotion' would be best (apart from dullness and lack of warrant in the Danish).

It's little surprise that philosophers have preferred Kierkegaard's dialectical works -- Postscript, or Sickness Unto Death, for instance. Spiritual devotion seems miles from critical, conceptual analysis -- even when these discourses gather in a longer work like Works of Love, on which Ferreira's Love's Grateful Striving is a classic commentary. Ferreira's exposition in the introduction at hand encourages the philosophical and sermonic to be an inter-animating pair. Although someone at ease deciphering "The Seducer's Diary" (one of several 'aesthetic' pieces bound up as Either/Or 1), or paraphrasing the Postscript, might stumble reading a discourse (and vice versa), a quiet discourse meditation on Job's suffering, nevertheless, must have some bearing on the picture of Job's suffering that the more philosophical Repetition invokes.

The second strand of the 'double helix', the pseudonymous works, includes more than one philosophical masterpiece as it weaves in and out of the discourses. In addition to Either/Or and Postscript, we find ten other familiar pseudonymous works, including Fear and Trembling and Repetition. Specialists may wonder whether some of Kierkegaard's volumes fit neatly on a double helix. Perhaps the early Concept of Irony with Constant Reference to Socrates, or the late Attack on Christendom, or the influential Two Ages: A Literary Review, or the posthumous The Point of View of My Work as an Author belong on a third strand of authorship. Be that as it may, Ferreira acknowledges such issues, matters that shouldn't distract us from her notable accomplishment.

Rather than walking at a snail's pace, chapter by chapter, book by book, through her renditions, let me comment instead on broad aspects of Either/Or and of Postscript, two relatively familiar Kierkegaardian works. Perhaps my brief comments can suggest Kierkegaard's continuing philosophical appeal in the 21st century.

Traditionally seen as the official opening of the Kierkegaardian performance, Either/Or is too often seen as a call to make a radical choice between two distinct ways of life. The alternatives are taken to be the 'aesthetical' life (the 'either' of vol. 1) and the 'ethical' life (the 'or' of vol. 2). This is MacIntyre's early view in After Virtue, but one he later questions, and rightly so. For one thing, within each volume there is leakage of material from the other, so the two 'life-views' can't be as oppositional as one might suppose. In addition, volume two has an appendage that introduces a potential 'third way' -- a pastor's sermon, that can be taken as an admonition to the ethical 'Judge William'. Finally, there is plenty of evidence that Judge William is not an advocate of Sartrean 'radical choice'. What is interesting is the extent to which the aesthetic and the moral might be mixed (an issue of interest to Iris Murdoch and Sabina Lovibond, for example), and the extent to which, as the Judge has it, responsibility for self is also acknowledgment of the historical and cultural forms of life one inherits, however one edits or disowns or reproduces these in practice. Ferreira opens some of these issues before moving on through the illuminations and the complications of Kierkegaard's next packet of pseudonymous production.

"Packet," of course, is a diminishing gesture meant to ease my conscience as I leap over the several texts that deserve exactly the care Ferreira accords them. Between Either/Or (1843) and Postscript (1846), which seems like a short calendar gap, we have the mansions of Repetition: A Venture in Experimenting Psychology; Fear and Trembling: A Dialectical Lyric; Philosophical Fragments: A Crumb of Philosophy; The Concept of Anxiety: A Simple Psychologically Orienting Deliberation on the Dogmatic Issue of Hereditary Sin; Prefaces: Light Reading for People in Various Estates According to Time and Opportunity; and Stages on Life's Way: Studies by Various Persons. (Sickness Unto Death and Practice in Christianity, among other works, appear after Concluding Unscientific Postscript to Philosophical Crumbs: A Mimical-Pathetical-Dialectical Compilation, an Existential Contribution.)

For those new to Kierkegaard, one sinks or swims with the vagaries of "subjectivity". Everything hinges on whether this concept appears wildly opaque and perverse or instead acquires a manageable and facilitating focus. As Kierkegaard employs the concept, subjectivity invokes a first-personal point of view especially with regard to ethical matters bearing singularly on the individual. The contrast (objectivity) is third-personal points of view that bear on everyone and no one in particular. Subjectivity refers to an actor's (or sufferer's) standpoint rather than a detached observer's perspective. Sometimes it evokes the position of decision; at other times it evokes the patient position of receptivity to passions or appeals, the needs or requirements of others or of one's position 'before God' (the latter functioning often like a Kantian regulative principle). Thus Kierkegaardian subjectivity is not a Cartesian epistemological standpoint, or a cognitive vice, as when a scientist or positivist condemns a position as "too subjective". It is a worthy moral, ethical, or religious ideal, something to achieve or strive for. If another calls for help, I'm addressed as a subject, not as an object, as a humanely responsive creature, not as an information processor in a field of merely physical-push-and-pull. If we join Johannes Climacus (who gives us Postscript) in averring, famously, that truth is subjectivity, then we hold that the straight and true way of being for humans is the way of responsiveness to an array of broadly moral ideals that call on us as subjects, and to which we are subject.

To be human is to be caught in tensions between where one is at the moment and where one senses one ought to be. Transposed into the metaphysical more or less Hegelian idiom of Climacus, the subjective thinker is a moral responder who -- unlike a data-collector or theory-constructor -- lives in 'contradiction'. He or she would be -- but isn't -- fully responsive to first-personal avowals he or she has sincerely made of love or friendship, vocation or piety. To be human is to live in the tensions of subjectivity, suffering the inevitable gap between performance and aspiration. The greater my moral sensitivity to my own inner life (and its public expressions), the greater my experience of failing. Becoming subjective increases the poignancy of unending moral seeking and suffering. A carelessly inattentive life is empty of moral suffering; the acute alertness of a Socratic life (what Climacus calls 'religiousness A') manifests an extraordinarily high degree of painful awareness of the gaps between performance and aspiration. The Christian subjectivity of 'religiousness B' only ratchets up the 'contradiction' or 'paradox' of leading a life of unimaginably difficult demands.

There is a wide cultural arena where subjectivity marks shortfalls from an ideal of objectivity essential to science and from an ideal of reasonableness in public deliberation, adjudication, and compromise. Kierkegaard has no problem with increasing one's objectivity in research and deliberation. He questions whether a humane life can be exclusively impersonal research and deliberation, with no admixture of intimate concern, passion, or reflection. Subjective attention means cultivating intimate self-exploration, attending to the dark center of one's motives, and to the shifting and obscure edges of moral identity in climates of reflection that are adverse or hostile to such attentions. Subjectivity means vigilant attention to myself as actor and receptor, resisting the temptation to leap out into more tractable arenas of public appraisal, deliberation, and moralizing, or of public and academic theory construction and validation, where the anomalies of my personal aspirations and shames are deemed, from the objective point of view, more or less irrelevant.

Ferreira manages with fine-grained precision to chart a double strand through Kierkegaard's life-works, 1843-55. Only a miniaturist of her especially sharp eye and steady hand could accomplish this in anything like the accuracy and detail everywhere so evident. For anyone who knows the great challenges of even a tiny corner of the total shelf of Kierkegaard's publications, this is as an impressive accomplishment.