2009.03.22

Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.)

Moral Psychology, Volume 1: The Evolution of Morality: Adaptations and Innateness

Walter Sinnott-Armstrong (ed.), Moral Psychology, Volume 1: The Evolution of Morality: Adaptations and Innateness, MIT Press, 2008, 583pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780262693547.

Reviewed by Jon Tresan, University of Florida


Walter Sinnott-Armstrong approves of the recent tendency to "mine cognitive psychology and brain science, as well as evolutionary biology, for general philosophical lessons" (xiii). He has compiled three volumes on moral psychology with the aim of "bringing together some of the most innovative, insightful, and informed philosophers and psychologists working [on morality] in this new way" so as to "make it easier for anyone -- philosopher, psychologist, or neuroscientist -- who is considering joining this movement to discover how exciting it can be" (xiv). Volume two covers the social psychology of morality, and volume three is about the brain. This review is of volume one, which is about the evolution of morality. Given his aim, it constitutes an outstanding success.

There are seven main papers, two responses to each, followed by the author's response. Each of the main papers is clear, plausible, and interesting, as are most of the responses. They brim with empirical facts of consequence. Professionals will of course want to read this book. Students of the field -- would-be joiners of the movement -- will find it very helpful.

Joiners, or their teachers, might start with Debra Lieberman's paper on incest. She defends two planks of the 'Westermarck hypothesis' about incest aversions and taboos. First, incest aversion tracks extended childhood association. Belief that X is kin isn't necessary for developing the characteristic aversion to sex with X. Second, the cultural taboo against incest is largely a byproduct of incest aversion rather than, by socialization, the other way around.

Her case for the first hypothesis seems unassailable. Childhood coresidence makes evolutionary sense: it was a blatant cue of kinship for our ancestors. Dispositions to be averse to sex with coresidents would significantly promote genetic health, at the low cost of occasionally preventing sex between nonkin coresidents or allowing sex with kin noncoresidents. Lieberman shows in detail that "Coresidence duration with a sibling does indeed predict levels of disgust associated with sexual behavior with that sibling" (181). Practices such as kibbutzim and Taiwanese minor marriages are "natural experiments", since coresidence and kinship come apart. "As the WH predicts, those who coresided during childhood showed little sexual interest in one another when they reached adulthood" (180). (Lieberman is silent, though, about incest aversion to noncoresidents believed to be kin. Coresidence and belief in kinship might each suffice for aversion.)

In defense of the byproduct thesis, Lieberman shows that "Longer periods of coresidence duration predicted stronger moral opposition to third-party sibling incest" (182). Apparently, if you don't want to do it, you don't want others to do it either. I cannot see how this helps the byproduct thesis, except by confirming an implication. It is what we should expect on the cultural product thesis too. If we are strongly averse to incest because of our socialization, our socialization probably made us strongly averse to others doing it as well.

The main reason to start with Lieberman is her lucid, succinct account of various ideas in evolutionary psychology which go without saying for many but which joiners might not know (166-169). She describes in general terms why we care at all about how people behave. Ultimately it's because they can devote themselves to us, or murder us, or anything in between. What people in the past did affected our ancestors' genes in regular ways that were subject to influence by others. Caring about behavior was an efficient, reliable way of promoting the exercise of that influence. Thus, we have innate behavioral biases, behavior attachment mechanisms.

These are not just biases to behave in certain ways (e.g., aversion to incest), but biases about which behavior occurs, regardless of its agent (e.g., moral sentiments underwriting the incest taboo). Many papers in this volume emphasize these two different ways of caring about behavior, with guilt and indignation often taken as paradigmatic. Lieberman is right to find it striking that we care in these two ways about such similar behaviors. She is probably also right that, in the case of incest, the other-directed concern is largely underwritten by the self-directed concern (as we'll see, Sripada and Prinz agree). However, incest may be rather distinctive in this regard. For instance, it's implausible that our moral opposition to brutality, betrayal, hogging, and shirking are mere by-products of our aversion to ourselves behaving in those ways. Many have speculated that the evolutionary story is the other way around: norm-enforcing outrage at these sorts of transgressions constituted a significant selection pressure favoring the development of specifically self-directed opposition such as guilt.

Attachment mechanisms involve two sorts of dispositions. There are dispositions to acquire the characteristic attachments to what is presented in certain ways; e.g., infants become attached to what is presented to them in the ways parents characteristically are, and vice-versa. Second, there are dispositions partly constitutive of the attachments thus acquired; e.g., the favorable dispositions to one's children partly constitutive of parental love. Lieberman's paper is mainly about the first kind of disposition: we become averse to sex with those who are presented in the way coresidents are. The paper by Leda Cosmides and John Tooby is mainly about the second kind of disposition: how precisely we react to behaviors to which we are morally opposed. Their concern is not incest but cheating, by which they mean accepting the benefits of a deal without living up to one's end.

Obviously we dislike cheating, but Cosmides and Tooby are interested in a further non-obvious way we might react to it. They are interested, not in our emotional reaction to cheating, but in our cognitive reaction. They show that certain cognitive skills receive a boost when we become aware of cues correlated with cheating. We become better at detecting cheating.

They employ the Wason test, which prompts subjects to search for counterexamples to propositions of the form P→Q. Apparently, if people want to know whether P→Q and they know P, they readily check whether Q. They are far less apt to check whether P if they know not-Q, typically doing so in less than a third of cases. For instance, when asked to check whether some condition is an invariable symptom of a disease, they readily check whether people with the disease have the symptom. But they far less often check whether people who lack the symptom have the disease.

The numbers are already striking. But even more striking is that when P and Q suggest the possibility of cheating, more than two-thirds, often around 75%, do check for P if they know not-Q (84). For instance, subjects were tasked with finding out whether teenagers broke the rule if you borrow my car then you have to fill up the tank with gas; when informed that the tank had not been filled, 76% checked whether the car had been borrowed. This is a localized effect, found even when the rules are personally irrelevant (if a man eats cassava root, he must have a tattoo on his face).

A brief methodological digression. The Wason test involves searching for counterexamples to P→Q. Some have suggested that this undercuts Cosmides and Tooby's case, since they are not actually asking subjects to search for counterexamples to conditional rules. A counterexample to the borrowing the car rule would be a case in which you borrow my car and don't have to fill up the tank with gas. Subjects are not asked to look for cases that counterexample the rule (i.e., so there isn't even a universal rule) but for cases that violate the rule. But although this is an unfortunate unclarity, it isn't a deep problem. Searching for violations of a rule does involve searching for counterexamples to a conditional -- it just isn't the deontic conditional which expresses the rule. Rather, it's the conditional that we may not make false if we are to abide by the rule -- for example, if you borrow my car then you fill up the tank with gas. That is the conditional to which subjects are looking for counterexamples. Thus, the difference is merely that, when the experiment involves a rule, the conditional to which subjects are looking for a counterexample is not the one Cosmides and Tooby explicitly present, whereas in non-rule cases they do explicitly present it. Nevertheless, both cases involve a search for counterexamples to a conditional. The fact that subjects do tend to check whether someone borrowed the car, if informed that that person didn't fill up the tank, is thus striking in just the way Cosmides and Tooby say.

Cosmides and Tooby rule out many domains broader than cheating as triggering the effect; for instance, it is not merely deontic content. They did not explicitly investigate the extent to which the boost in scores is due to an increase in motivation (i.e., the boost in cognitive skills is not direct but mediated by a boost in the subjects' desire to know). Examples such as those involving cassava roots suggest that it is not merely this, but I would like to see motivation tested by rewarding subjects for getting it right. I doubt that only 26% would check if $1,000,000 rode on it and they had plenty of time. Of course, even if that's so, the effect needn't always be entirely mediated by motivation. And their claim that the tendency is innate could stand: we could be innately disposed to acquire the motivation.

I'm afraid Cosmides and Tooby obscure their contribution by mis-stating what they have shown. They reject the natural interpretation of their data: "[our] theory is not about cheater content boosting the application of predicate logic" (160). They take themselves to have shown "something far more radical: that a logic of social exchange inhabits the cognitive architecture, … and operates according to its own procedures, which sometime sharply diverge from inferences licensed by predicate logic" (160). Their evidence for this is that people spontaneously make inferences about social exchange not licensed by predicate logic (72-78). For instance, presented with "if you give me x, I'll give you y", we infer such things as that if we don't give x, we won't be given y, and that if we do give x we are entitled to y. Neither follows from the original conditional, which merely states what will happen if we give x.

This is confused. There is a better hypothesis about why we make those inferences. We assume -- based on context (which can include the content of the utterance) -- that the speaker means to convey something other than the merely predictive conditional her words might suggest. If so, then positing a 'logic of social exchange' is like positing a 'logic of party attendance' to explain why -- when presented with "everyone was at the party" -- we refuse to infer that Barack Obama was there. We're not following different inference rules, we're interpreting pragmatically, and the commitments we ascribe on that basis license our inferences by the standard rules.

Cosmides and Tooby may have been thrown off by the fact that, plausibly, another cognitive element of our cheater detection mechanism is susceptibility to certain beliefs, such as those about obligations and permissions (75). Awareness of cheating cues may cause a relaxing of the standards of evidence required for inducing such beliefs. This could make subjects seem to be applying different inference rules, since they make different inferences, and the differences aren't explained by differences in the probative value of their premises. But a shift in one's standards of evidence is not an adoption of new inference rules. If you become paranoid, you more readily draw certain conclusions from the same data (they're after you). But that isn't because you are applying different inference rules.

That said, Cosmides and Tooby's paper is long and dense but worth it. It has much more than I've described, including a more detailed introduction to evolutionary psychology (especially 53-55, 58, 65-71, and 80-83).

The papers by Chandra Sripada and Jesse Prinz -- and the responses by Gilbert Harman, John Mikhail, Susan Dwyer, and Valerie Tiberius -- constitute a brief, comprehensive, yet highly accessible introduction to the moral nativism issue. The 'morality' in question is not our tendency to be moral but our tendency to develop moral (vs. nonmoral) traits: moral emotions, beliefs, and practices. Prinz's paper is especially comprehensive: he discusses

supposed universal moral norms, universal moral domains, fixed stages in moral development, and precursors to morality among nonhuman animals. His wide-ranging romp touches on moral modules, moral emotions, the linguistic analogy, and the distinction between morality and convention. (xviii)

I would suggest that readers start with Sripada, as Prinz's conceptual framework is less transparent. Sripada elegantly distinguishes three possibilities, from strongest nativism to weakest: the 'simple innateness model', principles and parameters, and innate biases. My only complaint is that, as Harman notes, he doesn't give mixed positions their due.

Readers will be inclined to read Sripada and Prinz as holding opposing views, since Sripada defends innateness and Prinz opposes it. However, they mean different things by "innate". For Sripada, x is innate if its emergence doesn't depend on a specific cultural environment (323). Prinz recognizes that morality -- moral traits, not some specific moral code -- is innate in that sense. What Prinz denies is that moral traits emerge from tendencies to develop them in particular. They are, he says, "nearly inevitable consequence[s] of other capacities" (404). For instance, Prinz suggests that moral outrage and guilt are largely manifestations of broader tendencies to feel anger and sadness. As a case in point, he notes that the capacity for perspective taking is not distinctively moral, and suggests that the "tend[ency] to show third-party concern … may be a consequence of the fact that we are good at taking the perspective of others. When we see the victim of a transgression, we imagine being that victim, and we experience anger on her behalf" (404). If so, then moral outrage at third-party victimization is not innate in his sense but it is in Sripada's.

They thus disagree less than it seems. According to Sripada, incest taboos are innate, which Prinz denies. But their accounts of the source of those taboos are much the same. Both accept the second Westermarck hypothesis, that incest taboos are by-products of incest aversion. Since incest aversion is liable to generate a taboo in any cultural environment, Sripada concludes that the taboo is innate. But Prinz suggests that incest aversion is not distinctively moral: "It may long predate the emergence of our species and … of morality" (379). If so, then the taboo is not innate in his sense.

Sripada takes his main challengers to be not non-nativists, but stronger nativists. Both he and Prinz take us on a whirlwind tour of cross-cultural variations in moral traits, designed to tell against a stronger nativism. (They have a common foe which is another reason it would be confusing to set Sripada against Prinz.) Both argue that, in Sripada's words, "There are certain high-level themes that one sees in the contents of moral norms in virtually all human groups -- themes such as harms, incest, helping and sharing, social justice, and group defense. However, the specific rules that fall under these themes exhibit enormous variability" (330). For Sripada, this shows that (only) the themes are innate, as the more specific rules are culturally idiosyncratic. For Prinz, the universality of the themes is due to the prevalence of the relevant nonmoral dispositions, so they don't support nativism.

Since both Sripada and Prinz aim to debunk nativist claims, one must turn to the respondents (Harman, Mikhail, and Dwyer) for a defense. Each makes a strong case, but Mikhail especially so. He cites striking evidence that "the moral competence of both adults and children exhibits [cross-culturally] many characteristics of a well-developed legal code, including abstract theories of crime, tort, contract, and agency" (354). For instance, "justifications and excuses [for killing] … are remarkably similar and consist of a finite list of familiar patterns: mistake of fact, necessity, self-defense, defense of others, duress, insanity, provocation, and a handful of others" (357). Of course, the details vary, but these are hardly 'high-level themes'.

Evolutionary considerations play four different roles in this volume. First, in Lieberman and in Cosmides and Tooby, they direct our attention to patterns of behavior we wouldn't otherwise have noticed. In these papers, evolutionary considerations are relevant to what's innate. Unfortunately, Sripada and Prinz are a bit perfunctory when dealing with evolution. They give no detailed examination of the relevant evolutionary environment. Nor do they consider the advantages of genetic assimilation. Genetic assimilation, sometimes called 'the Baldwin effect', is the process whereby traits go from being learned to being innate. It occurs because, if a trait is regularly adaptive, it's more efficient and reliable for it to be innate than learned. This is relevant to the question of nativism because certain moral traits -- such as moral con-attitudes elicited by brutality, betrayal, hogging, and shirking -- were likely regularly adaptive in the evolutionary environment, and are also among those observational that data most strongly suggest are innate. This poses a challenge to Prinz: why wouldn't we have acquired innate con-attitudes to those behaviors? (For a nice introduction to genetic assimilation, see Evolution in Four Dimensions, Jablonka and Lamb, 285-292.)

Evolutionary origins are also the target of inquiry, in papers by Geoffrey Miller and Peter Tse. Miller's concern is the role of sexual selection in the evolution of virtue. Traits are sexually selected insofar as they evolved because our ancestors with them were more likely to be chosen as mates. Miller makes a strong case that sexual selection is liable to have had a significant influence on the evolution of virtue. Crucially, even if a trait is originally selected for some other reason, if it is relevant to mate choice, sexual selection can "supercharge" its development (234). Suppose, for instance, that altruism, fidelity, and temperance make males better fathers, and so, over time, females acquire an attraction to males with those traits. If the moral traits and the attraction to them are heritable, then the male offspring of altruistic, faithful, temperate males will be more attractive, and thus have better reproductive prospects. The attractiveness of those traits is thus itself a source of their adaptiveness. But that is a reason -- beyond good fathering -- for its also being adaptive to be attracted to males with those traits, for the male offspring of virtuous males are also the offspring of the females who mate with them. If that yields an increase in attraction to those traits, then that increase in turn makes the traits more adaptive, leading to increase in the adaptiveness of being attracted to them, and so on in a self-promoting cycle. So it is not implausible that "sexual selection amplified [helped amplify?] our standard social primate virtues into uniquely elaborated human forms" (221).

But what got the ball rolling in the first place? This is a central question, since the pressures at work will help explain the features of the elaborated traits. Miller suggests that "Our mate preferences for moral virtues may be explained by costly signaling theory" (217). Virtue can be costly to its owner, promoting altruism and loyalty when selfishness and betrayal might confer advantages. Thus, like the peacock's burdensome tail, they can serve as indicators of fitness which cannot easily be mimicked. Sexual attraction to the virtues -- the reality of which Miller ably documents -- would thus guide mate-choosers to more fit partners, thereby conferring an advantage on the chooser.

Insofar as the virtues originated as costly signals, a robust tradition in thinking about the evolutionary origins of the virtues may be based on a mistake. As with the peacock's tail, it would be a mistake to look for their origins in some predictable contribution to the safety or resources of their owners or their groups. "the demands of costly signaling vastly underspecify the precise design details of fitness indicators … Any indicator will do, as long as it is costly, complex, and hard to fake … [Thus] signal evolution is highly stochastic and path dependent" (265).

With Catherine Driscoll, I suspect that Miller over-states the extent to which the virtues evolved due to being costly signals for sexual selection. And in a very interesting part of his paper, Miller himself does suggest ways sexual selection may have worked with other selection pressures to produce "more extreme, more costly, more prosocial version[s] of the moral virtue[s] than the [others] could achieve alone" (234). For instance, by conferring reproductive benefits on deviators from Pareto-inferior equilibria, sexual selection may have enabled "prosocial virtues [to] establish a genetic beachhead in an otherwise selfish population, long before group-level equilibrium selection [could] favor morally unified groups" (235).

Oliver Curry gives a fascinating reply to Miller in which he elaborates the plausible view that a significant adaptive feature of the virtues was their conflict-resolution role. He reminds us of the advantages of a mixed hawk (dominant) and dove (submissive) population over one entirely hawkish or dovish. He suggests that two dominant conceptions of virtue -- the 'pagan' and the 'Christian' -- can be understood as "adaptations for competing without coming to blows; they serve to avoid, forestall, or defuse more violent means of competing for scarce resources" (250). In short, the pagan virtues are the virtues of the hawk; the Christian virtues, those of the dove. Although I don't think the division is as neat as he suggests, he makes a strong case that humans do indeed display hawk and dove virtues.

In his paper, Peter Tse offers an account of the "common root cause" of "art, music, dance, analogical reasoning, abstract thought, the spontaneous generation and use of symbols, and the ability to reason abstractly about others [and] events, as well as the ability to manipulate symbols recursively and syntactically" (270). According to Tse, the crucial development was the capacity for "cross-modular binding". This involves the breaking down of barriers between object files, so that arbitrary representations become bound together in memory in the way that they do when they are associated via salient repetition. But unlike mere association, the process can be deliberate, can bind utterly unrelated representations, and needn't involve repetition. Thus, we can simply choose that a tree represents our spouse. It can be deliberate, but needn't be: a man "may see a tree standing next to a bush, and this may remind him of his wife and son because of their similar size relationships" (275).

Tse elaborates his account in a variety of interesting ways. He points out that the uniquely human ability to dance to music is presumably made possible by the breakdown of neural encapsulation: it had to be that "neurons tuned to auditory stimuli could entrain motor neurons, allowing auditory rhythms to trigger rhythmic motoric behavior" (278). He casts a stark light on cross-modular binding by describing its appearance in various disorders, such as schizophrenia and synesthesia.

Tse's is the only paper centered around the unveiling of a new hypothesis, and it seems promising. His paper also has the least obvious link to the concerns distinctive of moral philosophy, though of course it may be the most generally relevant of all the papers in the book. To be sure, symbolic capacity -- and thus, if Tse is right, cross-modular binding -- also made possible certain moral traits. Tse and Kathleen Wallace discuss some of these, including sadism, tokenization, and of course moral judgment itself. The bottom line seems to be that, at this point, it's not clear that much of immediate relevance to first-order moral thought or metaethical inquiry would follow from the truth of Tse's hypothesis. Perhaps the most exciting prospect is that it will underwrite the kind of predictive genealogy practiced by Lieberman and Cosmides and Tooby, directing our attention to patterns we wouldn't otherwise have noticed.

The last paper I will discuss, which is the first in the book, is the only one which is primarily philosophical. Owen Flanagan, Hagop Sarkissian, and David Wong (FSW) sketch a naturalistic moral theory which elaborates the thought that "Morality evolved and developed in order to coordinate and harmonize the interests … of humans living in mutually dependent communities" (10). Duke naturalism, as they call it, combines an austere metaphysics and respect for science with a mildly relativistic realism, and compatibilism about moral responsibility. (This brings out the fourth role of evolutionary facts in this volume: they are relevant to moral philosophy.) Non-philosophers will find this paper a cogent introduction to a cluster of attractive big-picture ideas about morality.

I would like, though, to make some cautionary points. First, the objections and replies are too cryptic, and the replies are presented as decisive when they are conversation starters at best. Second, (FSW) assume certain normative views, but this fact is obscured, first by the suggestion that certain loaded descriptions are merely neutral characterizations of the field of inquiry, and second by the suggestion that they have provided empirical scientific support for those views.

For instance, they defend the relevance of empirical science to normative moral theory against both Kantian and Humean challenges. The Humean point, on which they focus, consists in a dilemma. Inferences from the empirical to the moral either include moral premises or do not. If they do, those premises are apt to be as controversial as the conclusions, so no normative theoretic progress is made. If they don't, the inference is barred by an is-ought gap.

Their main reply is that "The smart naturalist makes no claims to establish demonstratively moral norms. Instead, he or she points to certain practices, values, virtues, and principles as reasonable based on inductive and abductive reasoning" (14). There is almost no further elaboration. (FSW) do purport to give samples of this sort of reasoning. But what they in fact do is simply assume certain normative theoretic views and discern the relevance of empirical data by reference to them.

Unfortunately this is obscured by their introduction of those assumptions as neutral characterizations. For instance, (FSW) characterize normative theory as "concerned with articulating and defending which virtues, values, norms, and principles will reliably guide favorable character development, intra- and interpersonal well-being, social coordination, and harmony" (10). Deontologists might beg to differ, insisting for instance that whether respecting autonomy is virtuous is not to be determined by its impact on such things as well-being, social coordination, and harmony. Proponents of the moral standing of non-humans might also balk, as they would to this assertion: "If ethics is like any science or part of any science, it is part of human ecology, concerned with saying what contributes to the well-being of humans, human groups, and human individuals in particular natural and social environments" (18). This is presented, not as following from empirical data, but as securing its relevance. It might, and that might be important. But what normative theorists want to know is whether empirical data is relevant to it.

It's no help to read them, charitably, as not ruling out any substantive views. That enhances credibility at the cost of normative relevance. They won't have said much more than "normative theory is concerned with articulating and defending which virtues (etc.) have the features specified by the true normative theory". That can't have any normative impact. (To be fair, (FSW) are ready to allow that "there is no such thing as "transcendent rationality", no ultimate or non-question-begging way of establishing one's viewpoint over another" (18).)

Similarly, (FSW) dismiss the Moorean 'open question argument' too quickly. They take the "allegedly devastating question" to be "But is that which is said to be 'good', good?" (15). But that is the relevant question only for naturalists who identify goodness with (the property of) being said to be 'good'. And few naturalists make that suggestion, for good reason: it implies that if we had called rape 'good' then rape would have been good. Those familiar with the literature will know what they mean, but others may be at a loss.

Their response to the open question argument consists solely in pointing out that naturalistic realism is compatible with the non-existence or inaccessibility of interesting necessary and sufficient conditions for moral properties. That is an important point, as is William Casebeer's Quinean reminder that analyticity is itself in question. But the open question argument has proved much richer and more robust than that. For instance, Moore also believed that it is introspectively obvious that moral evaluation doesn't just have a different content, it is radically different than ordinary description. Moore says: "Everyone does in fact understand the question "Is this good?" When he thinks of it, his state of mind is different from what it would be, were he asked "Is this pleasant, or desired, or approved?" It has a distinct meaning for him, even though he may not recognize in what respect it is distinct." Expressivists and projectivistic error theorists would agree. Indeed, they would argue that Moore, too, failed to recognize in what respect it is distinct: they will say he mistook a psycho-semantic difference for a metaphysical one. But the elegant evolutionary-cum-philosophical systems of Blackburn, Gibbard, Kitcher, Joyce, etc., are unmentioned. Outsiders, many of whom I hope read this book, may thus misperceive the dialectical terrain in moral theory. (Cannibal/Missionary/Moral Twin Earth-style arguments, also undiscussed, can similarly lay claim to being the 'kernel of soundness' in the open question argument.)

Philosophical issues pop up throughout the book: morality as an evolutionarily intelligible myth (Michael Ruse); further defenses of naturalistic realism (Casebeer, Peter Railton); the relative plausibility of relativism (Railton, Valerie Tiberius); whether there is a domain general "ought" (Cosmides and Tooby against, Ron Mallon and Jerry Fodor for); the meaning of "moral" -- vs. nonmoral, not immoral (Arthur Wolf, Richard Joyce, Lieberman); the (ir)relevance of the nativism issue to traditional philosophical questions about moral motivation and moral epistemology (Tiberius); and the normative implications of various scientific hypotheses (Miller, Tse, Wallace). For metaethicists I would recommend especially Railton, Joyce, and Tiberius, and I finish by discussing a dispute between Railton and FSW.

The dispute concerns 'relativism' vs. 'relationalism'. The relativism in question is 'appraiser relativism', according to which "evaluation is always indexed (tacitly if not explicitly) to particular standpoints, societies, times, and so forth" (43). Relationalism is a version of 'agent relativism', which has it that the propriety of acts depends on facts about the context of action, such as whether it really helps satisfy the basic needs of the local community. As FSW note (49-51), both of these could be true; at least, relationalism could be true from our standpoint. Railton suggests that relationalism is attractive, and accounts for the data which draws us to relativism (42-44).

FSW respond that relativism is suggested by cultural moral disagreement. For instance, in contrast to a community dominated by ideals of autonomy, in "a Confucian community, … the preservation of certain relationships embodied in an ideal of social harmony would be very high in determining what the true moral duties are in that community" (49). "Hence, the moral truths of one community will be relative to it in the sense that other moralities and other configurations of moral codes will be ruled out for it" (50). But this still doesn't get us relativism, any more than does the fact that differing conventions regarding insulting gestures make it the case that waving to a stranger with an open hand is okay in one culture but not in another. Moral practices are themselves relevant to what has the relevant local impact, so relationalists will affirm that practices influence duties. FSW would reply that different moral practices are also liable to involve judgments with different truth-conditions playing analogous functional roles. But why should we take this to imply that the judgments which play those roles have, cross-culturally, identical indexical semantics? It seems at least as likely that the judgments would have somewhat different semantics, as "yard" and "meter" have different semantics despite playing similar roles in measuring practices.

Summing up, one is reminded of G.E.M. Anscombe's admonition in 1958 that "it is not profitable for us at present to do moral philosophy" and that it "should be laid aside" until we have an adequate moral psychology. One cannot read this volume without feeling that we are well on our way.