2009.04.24

Robert B. Brandom

Between Saying and Doing: Towards an Analytic Pragmatism

Robert B. Brandom, Between Saying and Doing: Towards an Analytic Pragmatism, Oxford University Press, 2008, 249pp., $38.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199542871.

Reviewed by Sanford Shieh, Wesleyan University


Ever since Richard Rorty's Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature,[1] many have thought that there is a long-standing, perhaps dominant, philosophical tradition -- of which analytic philosophy is the most recent instance -- according to which the essence of language is representation of the world. On this supposed tradition, words refer to aspects of the world, and statements composed of words represent, truly or falsely, facts about the parts of the world to which words refer. Rorty also taught us that this conception of language is opposed by pragmatism, according to which the purportedly fundamental representational notions of reference and truth are in fact grounded on conceptually prior notions of the use of language, such as asserting and inferring. Brandom's monumental Making It Explicit (MIE)[2] is usually taken to be the most influential articulation and defense of pragmatism in contemporary philosophy.

We learn from Brandom's Afterword in Between Saying and Doing (BSD) that this book's project is distinct from that of MIE. In particular, in BSD, Brandom presents a new "theoretical apparatus," "meaning-use analysis," which he takes to be a way of extending, rather than opposing, the "classical project" of analytic philosophy by incorporating the insights of its pragmatist critics. Nevertheless, meaning-use analysis grew "out of [Brandom's] thinking about what [he] was doing in" MIE (234), and many of the main examples of meaning-use analysis recount arguments and doctrines from MIE. Thus, not only is this new style of analysis significant in its own right, it helps us understand better both the views of MIE and the nature of its philosophical project. I will accordingly do two things in this review. First, I will give an account of meaning-use analysis, raising a few questions along the way. Second, I will, by focusing on Brandom's analysis of modality, discuss his conception of the enterprise of meaning-use analysis and its consequences for the metaphilosophical status of MIE.

The project of BSD is motivated by a particular conception of analytic philosophy and its history. On Brandom's reading, the central concern of analytic philosophy is with semantic reduction or reconstruction relations among "vocabularies." This concern manifests itself in two core programs: empiricism and naturalism. Both seek to show how the meanings expressed by philosophically problematic vocabularies can be reconstructed from the meanings expressed by philosophically privileged vocabularies with the help of logical vocabulary, the use of which is always taken to be legitimate. These programs differ over which vocabularies are privileged, the former going for phenomenal or observational vocabulary, the latter for the vocabulary of physics or of the natural sciences. They differ to a lesser extent on what kinds of talk are problematic. Empiricism, for instance, tends to attempt to reduce objective vocabulary, talk of how things are, to phenomenal vocabulary, talk of how things seem; while naturalism tends to take objective vocabulary for granted. But both programs tend to treat modal, normative, semantic, and intentional vocabularies as targets for reconstruction.

Like Rorty, Brandom takes this classical analytic project to be decisively challenged by pragmatism, which urged a "displacement from the center of philosophical attention of the notion of meaning in favor of that of use … , replacing concern with semantics by concern with pragmatics" (3). Brandom describes three lines of argument for this displacement. First, Sellars criticizes empiricism by arguing that empiricist base vocabularies such as phenomenal vocabulary are not autonomous, in the sense that, in order to use them, one has to be able to talk of how things are, i.e., to use the objective vocabulary which is supposed to be reduced to phenomenal vocabulary. Second, Quine's critique of empiricism is based on what Brandom calls "methodological pragmatism," the view that "the whole point of a theory of meaning is to explain, codify, or illuminate features of the use of linguistic expressions" (4). Quine argues that if postulation of meanings of expressions is to do this, then it must account for the inferential role of these expressions. But the inferential role of an expression cannot be specified independently of collateral information, hence the postulation of meaning cannot account for use. Finally, and most radically, Wittgenstein criticizes the whole idea of postulating meanings to explain use. This idea presupposes that all the various uses of language are ways of doing a single kind of thing, e.g., stating facts or representing states of affairs. But in fact our linguistic practices are a "motley" of many very different, unsystematic, and indeterminate kinds, so that there is no particular reason to think that it's even possible to specify some one kind of use of language as central and explain others in its terms; language has no "downtown." From these points Wittgenstein seems to, and some of his followers do, conclude that systematic formal semantics is a fundamentally misguided enterprise, and that the philosophical study of language must be "an anthropological, natural-historical, social-practical inquiry aimed … at demystifying … and … deflating philosophers' systematic and theoretical ambitions" (8).

Brandom's response to the Wittgensteinian challenge is the program of analytic pragmatism. This rests on a rejection of the apparently exclusive choice between systematic semantic theorizing and particularist pragmatist therapy. The rejection involves two moves. First, Brandom incorporates the insights of the pragmatist critiques in the form of semantic pragmatism, "the view that the only explanation there could be for how a given meaning gets associated with a vocabulary is to be found in the use of that vocabulary" (9). Second, Brandom assumes that whatever is an "autonomous" linguistic or discursive practice must contain uses of expressions that constitute "sayings" (41), and that "[t]he core case of saying something is making a claim, asserting something" (41-42), where a linguistic practice is autonomous if engaging in it does not require participating in any other linguistic practices. That is, Brandom takes assertions to form the "downtown" of language; other sayings, such as commands, are possible only if they are part of a practice that includes assertions, because what it is to issue a command has to be explained in terms of the making of assertions. Once we adopt this conception of linguistic practice, there is no longer any principled obstacle to a systematic and determinate pragmatist account of meaning in terms of use, of "the practices by which that meaning is conferred or the abilities whose exercise constitutes deploying a vocabulary with … meaning" (9). Brandom aims to formulate such a theory of use for three purposes. First, it is to provide foundations for the classical project of analysis, by defending its privileging of logical vocabulary. Second, it is to extend that project by accounting for the semantic relations among vocabularies, which form the main business of classical analysis, in terms of relations among uses and meanings of those vocabularies; such accounts of semantic relations shows them as "pragmatically mediated." Finally, most of BSD consists of analyses of modal, normative, semantic, and intentional vocabularies -- the chief targets of the core programs of classical analytic philosophy -- in terms of pragmatically mediated relations.

As I have described it, Brandom's enterprise rests on his fundamental conception of linguistic practice. But, so far as I can tell, in BSD Brandom offers no argument in support of that conception, so those who find its rejection compelling (and Wittgensteinian) may suspect that Brandom hasn't so much met Wittgenstein's putative pragmatist challenge as passed it by. However, it seems that Brandom would stake his response to this challenge on the philosophical insight afforded by the execution of his project. So it is to his analyses that we turn.

Brandom's vindications of problematic vocabularies via meaning-use analysis have the flavor of transcendental arguments, showing those vocabularies to have to be, in some sense, already implicitly present in any autonomous linguistic practice whatsoever. The hard work of such analyses is obviously to spell out the senses of "already implicitly present." The general form of Brandom's accounts contains three steps. First, he argues that "one cannot deploy" any autonomous "vocabulary without engaging in [some] practice, or exercising [some] ability," call it P1 (28). Second, he argues that by "exercising … abilities [P1] in the right order and under the right circumstances," one can exercise another set of abilities, P2 (26); in Brandom's terms, P2 is obtained by "algorithmic elaboration" from P1. Finally, he argues that the elaborated abilities P2 suffice for using the target vocabulary (9). In addition, some target vocabularies can in turn be used to "specify" or "codify" the initial practices P1 (10). These vocabularies manifest a central theme of MIE, making abilities explicit; the interesting point here is that these vocabularies are derived from the very abilities that they make explicit.

Brandom begins with a relatively simple analysis, of the logical vocabulary of conditionals, that allows him to introduce further aspects of his conception of linguistic practices, and to argue for the privileged status of logical vocabulary. Brandom's view of conditionals, familiar from MIE, is that this locution allows one to express inferential practices, but is not necessary for participation in these practices. The meaning-use analysis that justifies this view goes as follows. Brandom, as we saw, assumes that making assertions is part of every linguistic practice. He holds, furthermore, that assertion and inference are mutually necessary practices; no one can count as participating in one without being able to participate in the other. Hence inferential practices are also part of every linguistic practice. The fundamental notion of inference is material inference, in which logical vocabulary does not occur (essentially). Participation in inferential practice requires the ability to "endorse" or "accept" material inferences, and Brandom sometimes characterizes endorsement as a differential response to material inferences, treating or taking them to be good. Going by MIE, one expects Brandom to hold that differential responsiveness only counts as endorsement if it is "caught up" in social practices, but this qualification is not explicitly made here. The crucial point is that logical vocabulary is not required in acts of endorsing material inferences. The mutually necessary abilities to make assertions and to endorse inferences can be algorithmically elaborated in the following way. Armed with these two abilities, and with the additional logical vocabulary of conditionals ('if … then') and the ability to carry out an algorithm, one can then also assert conditionals of the form 'if p then q' when one endorses a material inference from p to q, and respond to such an assertion by endorsing the inference from p to q. The elaborated ability is sufficient for the logical use of conditionals. In this sense, logical vocabulary is implicit in all linguistic practices; for this reason, the privileging of logical vocabulary in classical analysis is justified.

In addition, use of logical vocabulary equips one to say explicitly that one endorses an inference, by asserting the corresponding conditional, while without it one can only perform acts of endorsing or rejecting inferences. Clearly the underlying picture is that although endorsement involves words (those in the premises and conclusion of the inference in question) it is, in a sense, mute, a mere action. The additional vocabulary of conditionals is required for us to give voice to these actions which previously we could only perform.

Before going on, I want to register a question. One wonders whether endorsement can always be performed in the absence of vocabulary additional to that which expresses the assertions involved; after all, don't we generally use such words as 'hence', 'so', and 'therefore' when we do the sorts of things generally taken to be inferring? Does Brandom have some notion of implicit endorsement? What would manifest such endorsements? But perhaps Brandom would avoid implicit endorsement and hold instead that the use of words such as 'hence' is akin to the use of Austinian "formulae" -- paradigmatically 'I promise …' -- in making performative utterances. That is, they add nothing to what is said, but merely effect acts of inferring.

I turn now to Brandom's analyses of the classical problematic target vocabularies. First, Brandom argues that, since the validity of material inferences is sensitive to collateral circumstances, the fundamental capacity to accept or reject material inferences requires abilities to distinguish, in the sense of responding differentially to, counterfactual circumstances that affect the endorsement of a material inference from those that don't. (Again note that by MIE's lights these differential responses count as distinguishing counterfactual circumstances only when "caught up" in social practices.) These abilities can be elaborated into the ability to use modal vocabulary. In turn, the use of modal terms makes it possible to assert or reject counterfactual conditionals and thereby say explicitly what one is doing in distinguishing counterfactual circumstances that infirm a material inference from those which don't. Here an obvious question is: what is it to respond differentially to counterfactual circumstances? There is of course no special problem about responding to counterfactual suppositions, but doesn't one have to grasp modal vocabulary already to do so? Now, perhaps one doesn't need a grasp of modal vocabulary to respond differentially to non-linguistic representations of counterfactual situations, e.g., in imagination; indeed, perhaps imagining such situations is critical for planning, understanding, and predicting others' actions. But then Brandom needs a pragmatist analysis of such non-linguistic representations. So perhaps Brandom would simply appeal to the possession of dispositions to alter one's attitude to a material inference upon acquiring certain commitments?

Second, as is familiar from MIE, Brandom claims that every linguistic practice must contain assertion and inference because every such practice must include the practices of giving and asking for reasons for assertions. These practices, in turn, require the abilities to treat oneself and others as committed to, and as entitled to, assertions. These abilities are sufficient for us to use the normative terms, 'committed' and 'entitled'. And of course by using these terms we can then say explicitly that we are treating someone as committed or entitled to a claim.

Third, Brandom argues that the abilities just canvassed, to treat someone as committed or entitled to claims, can also be elaborated into the ability to use semantic vocabulary. The basis of semantic talk is the ability to treat two claims as materially incompatible, and to treat p and q as incompatible one simply has to treat anyone who is committed to p as "thereby precluded from" (120) being entitled to q. Material incompatibility is central to MIE, and the path from this notion to semantics is suggested there. Once we can treat two claims as incompatible, we can also respond to a kind of entailment relation among claims: we can take one claim, p, to be incompatibility-entailed by another, q, by treating every claim incompatible with p to be also incompatible with q. Given these two abilities, we can then use a vocabulary containing the terms 'incompatible' and 'incompatibility-entails'. In BSD Brandom works out in detail how such a vocabulary can be used to formulate a semantic meta-language for any language consisting of sentences with no logical structure. In this way, the abilities sufficient for using normative vocabulary can be elaborated into abilities sufficient to formulate a semantic theory for at least such simple languages. An obvious question about this approach is: what exactly is it to treat every claim incompatible with p to be also incompatible with q? Could Brandom perhaps be appealing to the capacity for using quantificational vocabulary at this point? But if so, can he really be taking the language in question to lack logical structure? Moreover, would he not owe us an account of the algorithmic elaboration of the abilities underlying the use of normative vocabulary into an ability to deploy quantificational vocabulary? If Brandom is not appealing to the use of quantificational vocabulary, then, since plausibly no one in fact responds to indefinitely or infinitely many claims, would Brandom perhaps again appeal to the possession of a disposition?

Finally, intentionality lies in certain things that a subject has to do in order to count as saying things about the world. There are two parts to the view. The first is Brandom's version of the familiar idea that beliefs are about the world in virtue of having empirical content, and a subject's beliefs have empirical content just in case she recognizes incompatibilities between what she observes and consequences of her other beliefs as requiring adjustment, by rejecting the observations, changing the other beliefs, or, more radically, altering the inferential connections she accepts. In Brandom's terminology, when one "expand[s] one's observations by drawing commitment- and entitlement-preserving inferential conclusions, [and] register[s] resulting materially incompatible commitments, [one then undertakes to] repair … them by modifying or relinquishing some of those commitments, or the concepts that link them inferentially" (185). The second part is Brandom's account of what makes a discursive practice one about objects. The basic idea is that, in drawing certain material inferences and in taking certain claims to be incompatible, we are implicitly taking the claims in question to be about an object. For example, a

commitment to A's being a dog does not entail a commitment to B's being a mammal. But it does entail a commitment to A's being a mammal. Drawing the inference from a dog-judgment to a mammal-judgment is taking it that the two judgments represent one and the same object. (187)

What is essential to intentionality is this practice of rectifying commitments, "[a]cknowledging the rational critical responsibility implicit in taking incompatible commitments to oblige one to do something, to update one's commitments so as to eliminate the incompatibility" (189). Commitment rectification is necessarily describable in two ways, corresponding to two senses of incompatibility. On the one hand, someone who engages in this practice treats commitments as normatively incompatible, by acknowledging that she ought to rectify the conflict. On the other hand, by this very acknowledgement she implicitly also treats "states of affairs regarding objects as incompatible in the modal sense that it is impossible for both to obtain" (193). Thus normative and modal vocabularies are required to specify what makes a linguistic practice intentional.

Given the centrality of modality in contemporary analytic philosophy, Brandom's pragmatist analysis and defense of modal vocabulary is much less likely to engender opposition than his treatments of normativity and intentionality. Indeed, a response to an earlier presentation of Brandom's defense of modal vocabulary, due to Gideon Rosen, is that Brandom's transcendental argument, while interesting, is unnecessary, since in actual historical fact suspicion of modality collapsed along with the demise of the positivists' criterion of cognitive significance on which that suspicion was based.[3] Nevertheless, it's on this analysis that I will focus, since it raises a number of interesting historical-philosophical questions, and suggests a somewhat different way of understanding Brandom's project than his own.

Brandom frames his argument historically. Noting the "remarkable, … unprecedentedly radical transformation" in analytic philosophy's attitude towards modality from "extreme suspicion, if not outright hostility" to full acceptance, Brandom asks, "what secret did we find out, what new understanding did we achieve to justify this change of philosophical attitude and practice?" (93). Brandom agrees with Rosen that the justification of modal idioms arises from the rejection of some presupposition of the logical empiricists' critique of modal concepts. But he differs with Rosen over which presupposition. It is widely accepted that the empiricists took all cognitively significant discourse to be based on perceptual experience. Only those parts of language, such as perceptual reports, that are directly verified perceptually are unproblematic. Since the application of modal terms does not appear to be fixed by perceptual experience, their meaningfulness requires defense. A standard view, articulated by Rosen, is that once Quinean (and Sellarsian) arguments demonstrated that not even the use of perceptual reports is fixed by perceptual experience, there are no longer any philosophical grounds for questioning the credentials of modal terms, which we seem, intuitively, to understand quite well. Brandom objects to this argument on the ground that it is not specific to modality, since it removes empiricist objections to all supposedly problematic terms, including normative, theoretical, and intentional vocabulary which we pre-philosophically seem to understand quite well. It's initially unclear why this is an objection, since an argument that disarms worries about non-modal as well as modal terms nevertheless surely does remove worries about modal terms. Perhaps Brandom's point is that, if Rosen were right, then analytic philosophers should have found normative, theoretical, and intentional vocabulary no more problematic than modal vocabulary. But that wasn't the case -- indeed, modal vocabulary was invoked to deal with these other "problematic" vocabularies. But perhaps Brandom is also sensitive to a much more glaring question facing this standard view, namely, since it's Quine's critique of the logical empiricists' putative conception of language that supposedly justifies the rehabilitation of modality, what are we to make of the undeniable fact that Quine throughout his writings is an unwavering critic of modality? For, Brandom goes on to outline a Humean ground against the intelligibility of modality and attributes it to Quine. The Humean idea is that all empirically accessible facts consist of what is the case, and do not settle what might be or must be the case. Brandom takes it that even Quine, who rejects the existence of any autonomous part of empirical discourse keyed directly to observation, nevertheless accepts that empirical discourse as a whole is purely descriptive of the world and involves no modal commitments.

Brandom holds that it is the rejection of the assumption of a purely descriptive part of language that justifies modal language. He argues for an innovation not in MIE, the "modal Kant-Sellars thesis": "in using ordinary empirical vocabulary, we already know how to do everything we need to know how to do in order to introduce and deploy modal vocabulary" (98). As noted above, the key step of the argument is the claim that the fundamental capacity to accept or reject material inferences requires abilities to distinguish counterfactual circumstances in which a material inference would still be endorsed from those in which it would no longer be endorsed. The argument for this claim, called the "updating argument," goes as follows. Participation in any discursive practice requires sensitivity to demands for the justification of one's beliefs. The justification of beliefs is by material inference from other beliefs. But material inferences are potentially defeasible under circumstances that are never exhaustively specifiable. So, in order to acknowledge the demand for justification of one's beliefs, one must in practice be able to distinguish, among material inferences one endorses, a set of candidates for revision in response to any change in belief. That is to say, changes in beliefs define ranges of potential defeating conditions for endorsed material inferences, and hence also ranges of non-defeating conditions.

I want to dwell on two points about Brandom's updating argument. First, Quine would surely not be swayed by it. From Quine's perspective, the ability to respond differentially to a material inference amounts, at bottom, to a standing verbal disposition, a disposition to assent to the conclusion in circumstances prompting assent to the premise. That a change in belief may infirm an endorsed material inference points to additional complexity in our verbal dispositions. In the presence of circumstances prompting, say, assent to a sentence, we may be disposed to gain or lose standing verbal dispositions that are our endorsements or rejections of material inferences. That is, we have second-order verbal dispositions to alter first-order dispositions. What the updating argument shows is that these second-order dispositions are tied to additional standing dispositions to assent to counterfactual conditionals. But this view "vindicates" modal vocabulary only in the sense of reducing it to non-modally specifiable verbal behavior. I'm of course not endorsing this Quinean view of the endorsement of material inference; but note how some questions I've raised above about Brandom's analyses suggest that he may have to appeal to dispositions to verbal behavior in any event. I am suggesting that, in order for the updating argument to succeed against Quinean modal skepticism (whatever its actual grounds may be), it has to be supplemented by an argument against the Quinean view of language, and in favor of the Sellarsian one.

Now Brandom may well claim that he had already advanced the required argument in MIE. As I have noted in the foregoing, in MIE Brandom holds that differential responsive dispositions not "caught up" in social practices are not sufficient to constitute the abilities required by meaning-use analyses. The social practices in question include the normative accountability to objects of which commitment rectification is a central instance. Brandom's view, in MIE, seems to be that mere Quinean dispositions to verbal dispositions do not amount to such social normative practices, and so are not recognizable as linguistic behavior. But why should this trouble Quine? In a recent paper, "Inferentialism and some of its Challenges," Brandom suggests that his response to Quinean modal skepticism is simply that we just "do in our ordinary linguistic practice distinguish between inferences based on their modal status as counterfactual-supporting or not."[4] Does Brandom's opposition to Quine's conception of language as a complex of verbal dispositions not rest, at bottom, on a similar claim: Quine's conception does not square with how we ordinarily treat something as a linguistic practice? In the very next paragraph from the paper just cited, Brandom says that although the counter-intuitive consequences of his view of concepts "may not sit well with our pre-theoretic talk about meaning," semantics should not be held "hostage to our casual, unreflective practices."[5] But why then privilege our casual, unreflective practices about what we take as linguistic? A fortiori, why privilege the modal aspects of our ordinary practices?

Second, although Brandom's account captures one aspect of the rehabilitation of modality in analytic philosophy, namely, Sellars's critique of what Sellars took to be the logical empiricists' grounds against modality, it does not capture other significant aspects. In particular, the popular picture of logical positivism recounted above does not fit well with all of Carnap's views on modality, and Carnap surely is a logical empiricist if anyone is. Nor is it clear that the Sellarsian picture of the empiricist as committed to a purely descriptive layer of language fits well with the basis of Quine's actual objections to modality, which, as is well-known, focus on quantification into modal contexts. I cannot, of course, adequately defend these historical-philosophical claims here.[6] I will merely give a brief sketch of Carnap's views.

To begin with, by The Logical Syntax of Language,[7] Carnap arguably no longer relied on a criterion of cognitive significance, so even if he did reject modal notions it would not be on the basis of such a criterion. In fact, Carnap was no foe of modality. Five years before "Two Dogmas," Carnap worked out and published a semantic theory for quantified modal logic,[8] a theory which he elaborated in Meaning and Necessity.[9]

Now there is a story, almost as popular as the one in which the positivists took modal notions to fail the test of verifiability, according to which they held that modal properties are not genuine properties of things, but disguised properties of linguistic expressions. Necessity, for instance, is in fact not a characteristic of states of affairs, but rather a property of sentences, namely that of being analytic. On this story Carnap may have accepted modality, but only because he had reduced modal properties to features of language. There are two substantial bases for this story. First, Carnap distinguishes between the material mode of speech, which, he seems to claim, appears to be about extra-linguistic reality, and the formal mode of speech, which, he seems to hold, is about linguistic expressions. Carnap repeatedly characterizes material mode formulations as misleading, and urges translation into the formal mode. It is easy to take this as based on the assumption that the material mode "suggests something false … and … the formal mode … tells the unvarnished truth."[10] Second, Carnap explicitly characterizes the use of modal expressions as material mode talk of which the formal mode correlates are metalinguistic predicates such as 'analytic'.

The trouble is that talk of what statements are really about is paradigmatic material mode talk. So, if Carnap is claiming that material mode talk hides its true linguistic subject matter, then the very words he uses to advance that claim would hide its true subject matter. Rather than search for the true subject of this purported claim, we can seek a conception of Carnap's use of the material and formal modes that sidesteps this difficulty. The idea is that Carnap's advocacy of syntactic sentences over their material counterparts, of replacing material mode talk with formal mode talk, is not based on theoretical claims about their genuine subject matter. His sole ground is pragmatic. The trouble with the material mode is that its use leads to controversies, especially over the foundations of mathematics, in which members of the Vienna Circle and their fellow travelers were embroiled, controversies Carnap found as intractable and confused as disputes over traditional metaphysical problems are. Translation into the formal mode provides clear and precise standards for distinguishing genuine from verbal disputes and for resolving the former. Carnap in effect asks his audience to compare the state of their philosophical debates with that of his precise syntactical investigations, saying to philosophers, "you don't have to take yourself to be advancing a substantive thesis about reality against other such substantive theses, because I can offer you a way of looking at what you want, in which it will no longer be unclear what exactly getting it involves, because you'll be doing something other than what you took yourself to be doing." In the words of another philosopher, Carnap aims to "shew the fly the way out of the fly-bottle." On this view, Carnap is not engaged in the same enterprise as traditional philosophy; rather, he proposes an activity, the investigation of linguistic frameworks, to replace traditional philosophizing. In the words of yet another philosopher, Carnap urges his audience to "change the subject."[11] Carnap's explication of necessity as analyticity must therefore also be understood, not as a claim about the true nature of modal talk, but as serving a radically pragmatic aim. Specifically, the purpose of the explication is, inter alia, to offer a way out of the dispute between Russell and C. I. Lewis over the nature of deductive implication.

If the foregoing is the right way to understand Carnap's logical empiricist view of modality, then we can hardly be sure that analytic philosophy's embrace of modality isn't, after all, a "change of fashion, the onset of amnesia, or the accumulation of fatigue" (93).

Carnap's pragmatism does not consist in a theory in which the notion of use or practice is theoretically foundational. One might say that it is practical rather than theoretical pragmatism. In this respect it seems to contrast with the pragmatism of MIE. MIE seems to aim at telling us the truth about the meanings of our words and the contents of our concepts, which is that they are determined by the correctness of inferences, or our mutual attributions of commitments and entitlements. Certainly many readers of MIE take it this way, as, e.g., defending a form of inferential role semantics. On this view the pragmatism of MIE lies in the pragmatic notions at the base of its theoretical edifices.

From the Afterword of BSD, however, we obtain a somewhat different picture of MIE, one closer to Carnapian pragmatism. The main concern of the Afterword is to defend Brandom's taking meaning-use analysis to provide a pragmatist extension of classical analytic philosophy, against the charge that philosophical programs based, as classical analysis is, on pernicious metaphysical dogmas should be rejected rather than continued. Brandom's defense rests on an account of what makes metaphysics pernicious. What is distinctive of metaphysics is its privileging some vocabularies as "universal base languages from which every vocabulary that is legitimate … can be elaborated as a target vocabulary" (223). With this privileging goes a "mean-spirited, suspicious, begrudging, exclusionary attitude" (229) towards vocabularies that resist expression in terms of the preferred universal base vocabulary; it is this attitude that, on Brandom's view, makes metaphysics pernicious. By abandoning this attitude, one obtains a defensible form of metaphysics, call it analytic pragmatist metaphysics, of which meaning-use analysis is clearly supposed to be an instance. Analytic pragmatist metaphysics aims to "constructtechnical, artificial vocabular[ies]" (227) to play the role of universal base languages, and to attempt to express all other vocabularies in their terms. But crucially, these constructions and analyses are undertaken with the "metaphilosophical attitude" of David Lewis:

what philosophers should do is lay down a set of premises concerning some topic of interest as clearly as possible, and extract consequences from them as rigorously as possible. Having done that, one should lay down another, perhaps quite different set of premises, and extract consequences from them as rigorously as possible. The point was not in the first instance to endorse the conclusions of any of these chains of reasoning, but to learn our way about in the inferential field they all define … The principal aim is not belief, but understanding. (225-226)

The point of analytic pragmatist metaphysics is, accordingly, not to establish some vocabulary as revealing reality, and to classify others as legitimate if expressible in terms of the base and unreal otherwise. The point is, rather, to learn the relative expressive powers of various vocabularies. Hence, one should "try out many different possible metaphysical base vocabularies" (229). From this perspective, the point of MIE is not to prove that meaning is in fact metaphysically determined by use, but to work out just how much of our meaning-talk can be expressed on the basis of use-talk alone. Indeed, Brandom's meta-philosophical comments in MIE suggests that he took the book to be constructing a theoretical model of certain practices, to show how they can be understood in a certain way, rather than providing the final word on the nature of representation or intentionality. So perhaps BSD has merely made more explicit (and in fewer pages) what had been Brandom's view of MIE all along.

This conception of analytic pragmatist metaphysics bears evident similarities to Carnap's program of rational reconstruction and explication. They both offer technical resources -- meaning-use analysis in one case, linguistic frameworks in the other -- associated with a liberal attitude toward philosophical practice. In each case the technical resources are intended to be relatively neutral; meaning-use analysis "aims to be adequate to express Dummett's views, Davidson's, David Lewis's, or Stalnaker's" (234); Carnap hoped that the clarity and precision of his frameworks make them useful for expressing any number of philosophical conceptions. We have just seen that the point of meaning-use analysis is not primarily to defend the truth of a particular philosophical view, but to achieve a kind of philosophical insight. In Carnap's case, the point of constructing linguistic frameworks is not to arrive at the truth about mathematics or modality, but to provide ways of expressing philosophical demands that make it possible to subject them to rational assessment.

Brandom suggests, as a slogan for analytic pragmatist metaphysics, "Metaphysical discrimination without denigration" (229); perhaps an equally apt motto would be, "In metaphysics, there are no morals. It is not our business to set up prohibitions, but to provide analyses."

In conclusion, I would like to say that while I agree with Brandom's conception of his project as an extension of the classical project of analysis, I don't think that the extension is quite what he takes it to be, namely a transformation of the core programs of classical analytic philosophy so as to meet the challenge of pragmatism. For one thing, it is not clear that the Wittgensteinian version of the challenge has been met. For another, it is not clear that these core programs are more than peripheral concerns of such a central analytic thinker as Carnap. Of course, the analytic tradition is a complex interweaving of many strands of thought, not easily reducible to some small shared set of doctrines. So I offer my difference with Brandom over the nature of his project (as well as the worries I raised above) "in the open-minded, pluralistic spirit of [David] Lewis" (228), as a suggestion for thinking of the interest and significance of Brandom's project in BSD in terms of its continuation of the Carnapian pragmatism already present in the classical tradition of analysis.[12]



[1] (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1979).

[2] (Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard University Press, 1994).

[3] "Brandom on Modality, Normativity and Intentionality," Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXIII, 3 (2001): 611-23.

[4] Philosophy and Phenomenological Research LXXIV, 3 (2007): 651-72, at 661.

[5] Ibid., 662.

[6] For more of a sketch, see my "Modality," in M. Beaney, ed., The Oxford Handbook of the History of Analytic Philosophy (Oxford: Oxford University Press, forthcoming), and for a fuller account see my The Rehabilitation of Modality in the Analytic Tradition (Oxford: Oxford University Press, forthcoming).

[7] Trans. Countess von Zeppelin, (London: K. Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co., Ltd, 1937).

[8] "Modalities and Quantification," Journal of Symbolic Logic 11 (1946): 33-64.

[9] (Chicago, Ill.: University of Chicago Press, 1947).

[10] Alberto Coffa, The Semantic Tradition from Kant to Carnap: To the Vienna Station (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1991), 325, emphases mine. This view is especially strongly suggested by Carnap's formulations in Philosophy and Logical Syntax (London: K. Paul, Trench, Trubner & Co., Ltd., 1935).

[11] This account of Carnap draws heavily on Thomas Ricketts and Warren Goldfarb, "Carnap and the Philosophy of Mathematics," in D. Bell & W. Vossenkuhl, eds., Science and Subjectivity (Berlin: Akademieverlag, 1992), 61-78; Ricketts, "Carnap's Principle of Tolerance, Empiricism, and Conventionalism," in P. Clark and B. Hale, eds., Reading Putnam (Oxford: Blackwell, 1994), 176-200; Gary Ebbs, "Carnap's Logical Syntax," in Richard Gaskin, ed., Grammar in Early Twentieth-Century Philosophy (London: Routledge, 2001), 218-237; and Steve Awodey and André Carus, "The Turning Point and the Revolution," in A. Richardson and T. Uebel, eds., The Cambridge Companion to Logical Empiricism (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2007), 165-92. Naturally these authors should not be held responsible for the shortcomings of my account.

[12] I would like to thank Steve Gross and Joe Rouse for comments on earlier versions of this review.