Wendy Donner, Richard Fumerton


Wendy Donner and Richard Fumerton, Mill, Wiley-Blackwell, 2009, 212pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781405150880.

Reviewed by Fred Wilson, University of Toronto

Imre Lakatos had the habit of dividing philosophers into several different philosophers: there was not just Popper but Popper1, Popper2, and Popper3. The present book does something like that. It is in the Blackwell Great Minds series, and the great mind is John Stuart Mill. Except that the book seems to be about Mill1 and Mill2. Mill was an undivided great thinker; he was an empiricist who used his empiricism to defend utilitarianism, and a utilitarian who used his utilitarianism to defend his empiricism. But this book is less than a complete study of Mill; it is rather a bare conjunction of two longish essays, one on Mill the utilitarian, by Wendy Donner -- this is Mill1 -- , and a second on Mill the empiricist logician and metaphysician, by Richard Fumerton -- this is Mill2. And when I say a "bare conjunction," I mean just that: the essays are so disjoint that neither refers to the other! One really does come away with the impression that there are two Mills, Mill1 who was a great mind in ethics, and Mill2 who was a great mind in logic and epistemology -- two Mills who seem never to have met one another.

But the essays, both of which are excellent, despite their limitations, make clear that our two Mills were in fact both "great minds."

First the essay on Mill1, by Wendy Donner. This of course discusses the theory of value and the utilitarian ethics. It avoids the all-too-common problems one finds in treatments of the principle of utility, the introduction of contrived and/or highly abstract examples designed to show that the principle couldn't possibly be sound -- examples that say more about their creators than they do about Mill's moral theory. Instead of such a descent into scholasticism, Donner offers a careful exposition of what Mill actually said about value and about the principle of utility -- and so, for example, instead of quibbling about the quality/quantity distinction, she shows how it does in fact make sense, shows how Mill defends it, and shows how it is important indeed for Mill's treatment of a wide variety of social issues. Scholasticism is carefully avoided, in favour of a sensitive treatment of the real, and really important, issues. In particular, Donner focuses on the importance of the concept of development and self-development -- the development of our individual capacities for intellectual and emotional growth (in which context the notion of qualitatively superior values finds an important place).

The discussion of the theory of value and the principle of utility is followed by a discussion of liberty, showing how the notion of self-development justified by the principle of utility is at the core of the justification of the principle of liberty. Then comes a discussion of Mill's views on the topic, often neglected in philosophical treatments of Mill, of education. Maximizing utility demands self-development and this in turn requires the appropriate education. Next there is an exposition of Mill's political philosophy, emphasizing liberal principles and democracy for civil society, that is, a civil society based on the idea that the appropriate structure will have an educational role in fostering self-development. The qualifications about democracy to which Mill returned in various ways are carefully noted. Nor are the discussions uncritical: the treatment of the issue of polygamy in Mormon communities in On Liberty, chapter 4, is found to be incompatible with the freedom required for self-development. Donner concentrates on the impact of indoctrination on women, which is needed to make it acceptable to them that multiple marriage is the only alternative to no marriage, but there is also the impact on men who must expect and accept non-marriage for themselves if multiple marriage for a few men is to be possible.

This is followed by chapters treating two specific applications of these principles: one the subjection -- and liberation -- of women, the other environmental ethics. Both discussions are neat, and the latter is quite original. Donner is critical of the defense of a gendered division of labour found in The Subjection of Women. Interestingly, she misses Mill's role as a founder of the Commons Preservation Society, and his emphatically stated view that, in economics, any account of production should include not just the production of material goods but also the preservation of natural beauty (Political Economy, Bk. 4, chapter 6).

It is perhaps also worth noting that Mill's "proof" of the principle of utility, a "proof" which is neither deductive nor inductive, is central to his defence of the principle of utility. But Donner avoids the notorious difficulties it raises by avoiding the "proof" altogether, an unfortunate omission.

Now for the essay on Mill2, by Richard Fumerton. Fumerton reads Mill, not unreasonably, as a "radical empiricist." All our ideas (concepts) are derived, one way or another, from sense impressions given to us in experience, or from impressions (for example, of various passions, of impressions of our body from the inside, and of ideas simple and complex) given to us in inner awareness. These impressions of sense and inner awareness, from which derives the cognitive content of all our (intelligible) ideas, are also the facts which form the foundation of empirical knowledge. Fumerton compares Mill's views on reference to more recent accounts, such as those of Russell and Kripke, in ways that more often than not illuminate the views of both the earlier and the later thinker. The same holds for epistemology. Mill's view is that whatever knowledge we have is either knowledge of impressions or derived therefrom by induction. Fumerton raises the obvious problems with the attempt to justify induction and compares, wherever appropriate, the view he is discussing with more recent views, e.g., those of the reliabilists. He is rightly sceptical of Mill's argument for the empirical nature of the laws of arithmetic -- though, when one recalls that Frege and Russell held that the laws of logic (and therefore, as required by their logicism, the laws of arithmetic) are very broad generalizations about objects in the universe, then Mill's views are perhaps not all that strange.

Fumerton is also unsympathetic to Mill's views on the justification of induction. Mill argues that the law of universal causation is a law, a law at the generic level, about laws at the specific level. Because a possible hypothesis at the specific level will have several possible competitors for being true, simple enumeration will not be a reliable form of inference, so the acceptance of a law at this level will require the elimination (by Mill's methods) of the competitors. The use of these methods requires the assumption of the law of universal causation, the assumption that there is a law there to be discovered. But as one moves up the generic hierarchy, the possible competitors become fewer in number, and without competitors to be eliminated the method of simple enumeration becomes more reliable. One can therefore rely upon simple enumeration to justify the law of universal causation. Even then, however, induction makes an inference that goes beyond the evidence available from the past: there is still an inference from sample to population. To that extent, all our inductive inferences are uncertain. That, however, is simply a fact, a fact about the world and our capacities for coming to know it. Of course, if there were objective necessary connections, then there would be a bridge between sample and population, and we could infer with certainty that what holds in the sample also holds in the population. But we have no impression of such an entity and must therefore reckon the idea of such a connection to be meaningless and a disguise for mysticism. It is a fact, then, that inductive inferences are always hazardous, and, as it is a fact, about us and the world, we must simply accept it as suc and not struggle fruitlessly against it. Mill's point, which Fumerton misses, is that we should accept this fact as our fate; we should stop worrying about it and stop looking futilely for a solution to the problem of induction -- which is not a problem but rather a pseudo-problem because it admits of no solution. Since it is unavoidable, we should accept the fact that induction is open, and get on with things, living our lives in the best way we can -- guided of course by the principle of utility (as Mill1 would argue).

Fumerton gives a nice discussion of Mill's metaphysics. Mill takes the causes of our sense impressions to be "permanent possibilities of sensation." Fumerton carefully looks at whether this means that Mill is a phenomenalist, discusses the problems raised by Chisholm and Sellars, and ends up being not quite certain. If Mill's views on physical objects are thought to be generally problematic, his views about our inferences to other minds are even more so, but Fumerton avoids this issue.

This essay on Mill2 concludes with a discussion of Mill's metaphysics insofar as it is relevant to the issue of whether value is objective (as Mill denied) or subjective (as Mill believed -- his view of value judgments as imperatives is best construed as a form of emotivism). Fumerton's essay does not pursue these issues further, which is a shame. This the closest we come in this book to seeing how Mill1 and Mill2 mesh as the complete Mill (no subscript).

The authors miss two things that provide the linkage. One is the platonic metaphysics of William Whewell which provided the basis for a non-empiricist philosophy of science and for an objectivist ethics, and thereby provided a defence for a conservative deductivist methodology in science and a conservative defence of the moral status quo as a set of self-evident moral principles -- as well as a defence of unreformed universities and authoritarian methods of instruction. Donner's Mill1 has Whewell as an opponent who must be refuted if Mill's utilitarian and liberal programmes for democracy and education are to be accomplished. But the refutation of Whewell is, in the end, a matter of metaphysics, that is, Mill2. Donner does not see this, nor does Fumerton recognize the importance of Mill's critique of Whewell (whose name appears in neither the bibliography nor the index) for his programme for the improvement of mankind. Nor does Fumerton see that Whewell's platonic ideas or forms determine not only what, objectively, ought to be but also what things are essentially and thereby constitute objective necessary connections, which challenges at its heart Mill's empiricist epistemology and inductivist philosophy of science. Whewell challenges both Mill's utilitarianism and his empiricism: Mill's case against his philosophy is important to both Mill1 and Mill2: it is therefore a shame, let us say, that both our authors neglect this aspect of what Mill's great mind confronted.

In addition, both authors largely ignore Mill's associationist psychology. This is central to Mill's critique of Whewell, providing an associationist account of abstract ideas. This account was aimed at, first, refuting the platonic and innatist view of our basic concepts in morality (e.g., justice), showing how these concepts, while originally not sought for their own sake, could become, through association, ends in themselves; and how they come to have a unity and a unique feel that leads thinkers like Whewell to conclude, wrongly, that they are objective qualities or forms outside sensible experience, known rather by Reason or rational intuition. That our abstract ideas do not point to non-empirical entities or to non-empirical ways of knowing is one conclusion justified by Mill's associationism. The associationist account of abstract ideas was aimed at, second, refuting Whewellian conclusions in epistemology and the philosophy of science similar to those in ethics. The associationism aims at showing how our judgments of certain basic facts in science, such as space and causation, and even the axioms of mechanics, come to have a feeling of necessity, of bindingness, that metaphysicians like Whewell can misconstrue as, again, rational intuitions of objective necessities. The psychology needs to be given a much more central place in joining Mill1 and Mill2 into the unified great mind of John Stuart Mill.

But, if the two essays are only partial pictures of one great mind, they are nonetheless both very good within their chosen limits. I should add that they are both clearly structured and clearly written. Each is strongly to be recommended for both students and scholars aiming at a better understanding of the thought of John Stuart Mill.