2009.05.26

Helen Small

The Long Life

Helen Small, The Long Life, Oxford University Press, 2007, 346pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199229932.

Reviewed by Sarah Conly, Bowdoin College


This is a pleasant book to read. The subject is old age, an issue central to more and more of us as technology and improved living conditions combine to assure that old age will last longer than it ever has. Small discusses a number of literary and philosophical writings on old age, ranging from the (relatively few) positive accounts through many portrayals which see old age as positive only insofar as it is preferable to death. The writings she discusses, including poetry, philosophical essays and books, novels, and a few scientific treatises, are of a sufficiently broad range that most people are unlikely to be familiar with all of them, and almost no reader will have paid the attention which Small has to their portrayals of age. For me, then, the most enjoyable aspect of the book was simply the exposure to the writings of those I hadn't read, or whose writings on old age in particular I hadn't paid sufficient attention to. Small is able, too, to bring our attention to parallels we might not otherwise ponder, and which historical analysis per se would not normally yield. For example, she compares Aristotle's pessimistic depiction of old age in the person of Priam, the failed king of Troy, not only with Plato's more positive account of old age, as one might expect, but with Shakespeare's depiction of King Lear, where the vices of old age bring ruin. Each chapter addresses a different (putative) aspect of old age, and reflects on the truth of the suggestions the author makes, both those intended and those unintended, the explicit and the implicit. She reaches, as she says, "no great conclusions." (p. 265)

As this may suggest, Small does not present what a philosopher would recognize as an argument. Her general suggestion is that different evaluations of old age depend on different opinions about what in life is valuable, which is straightforward enough, but hardly insightful. And, for the most part, I don't see this thesis applied to the writings she discusses, in the sense that it is used as a tool for analysis. Rather, she analyzes the different writings and tries to discover and articulate the particular author's opinion of old age (or sometimes, what his other opinions suggest that his opinions about old age would be) and what assumptions that opinion rests on. The "first" aim of the book, she explains, "has been to extend the range and deepen the content of current thinking about old age." This is accomplished primarily by exposing to us the many and varied depictions of old age she includes, and heightening our comprehension of these by her own, and others', critical remarks on each. The advantage of this absence of argument is that the discussions of each particular author are broader and more nuanced than they would presumably be if they were cited only to support a thesis. On the other hand, if the book is looked to for a philosophical analysis of the role of old age in life, or what makes old age bad or good, or how the extension of our lives into longer periods of old age does or should change our analysis of what a good life is, that is absent. It is not, then, a work of philosophy, but a work of literary criticism, where the topic is not old age itself but different authors' opinions of old age, with Small's comments on these. (The Long Life won the 2008 Truman Capote Award, the largest annual cash prize for literary criticism, administered by the University of Iowa's Writers' Workshop.)

One thing that saves this from being a simple anthology on what famous writers have thought about old age is the fact that Small groups philosophers and writers together in surprising ways. Chapter 1 discusses Plato and Thomas Mann, with excursions into Nietzsche, Lukacs, and Derrida; chapter 2, Aristotle and Shakespeare; chapter 3, Epicurus, Alasdair MacIntyre, David Velleman, Michael Slote, and Saul Bellow; chapter 4, Norman Daniels on the distribution of resources between the old (who consume them disproportionately) and the young, and poets Philip Larkin and Stevie Smith; chapter 5, Derek Parfit's Reasons and Persons and Balzac's Le Pere Goriot; chapter 6, Adorno, Dickens (The Old Curiosity Shop!) and Samuel Beckett; chapter 7, Bernard Williams, J.M. Coetzee, and Philip Roth; and chapter 8, an overview of recent evolutionary theory, a brief excursus on the 19th and 20th century science fiction of immortality, and a discussion of Alzheimer's, largely presented through Michael Ignatieff's Scar Tissue.

As the pairing of philosophers and novelists or poets suggests, the common chapter structure is an initial exploration of a philosopher's (or some philosophers') expository writing, followed by a discussion of the way this is illustrated or denied by a fictional or poetical account. The success of these pairings is varied. Some don't yield any insight. Having now re-read both Reasons and Persons and Le Pere Goriot, I still don't see that Parfit's comments on identity of the self through time (or the lack of it), nor his insistence on person- and time-neutrality reasons for action, are particularly illustrated by Balzac's study of a society corrupted by the need for money, even though father Goriot is indisputably old and his daughters indisputably selfish. The chapter reminds me of a chef who wants to astound us by his creativity and hopes his daring will hide the fact that, say, blueberries and licorice don't actually go together in a way that heightens our appreciation of either. In other cases, the pairing is apt, but not surprising. Aristotle, in the Nicomachean Ethics, does say that a life cannot be happy if it ends badly, and Lear’s certainly ends badly, but again, this in itself doesn't lead me to a new understanding of Aristotle or Lear. So, to some extent the chapter pairings (or triplings) seem designed to impose a unity which the sources themselves don't support, and this can be distracting. I enjoyed Small's discussion of Balzac, for example, but enjoyed less those points where she strained to show its particular relation to Parfit.

A second thing which distinguishes this book from an old age anthology, and which is more successful, is that Small engages in a great deal of commentary on the authors she presents, some explanatory, some critical. Again, I find the quality mixed. I very much enjoyed her discussion of Saul Bellow, for example, for whom "life in old age is not a progress story, or a quest, or a story of improvement, but a careering plummet through time towards death." (p. 112) On the other hand, her criticisms of Aristotle in chapter two seemed unfounded. I had trouble both with her interpretation of Aristotle's position, which, according to her, is that living to old age makes a good life almost impossible, and the conclusion she draws from that, that insofar as his account makes old age a bad thing it must be wrong. That is, her argument appears to be neither valid nor sound. This evaluative assumption arises throughout, that philosophical accounts or fictional representations which make old age out to be almost inevitably bad must have something wrong with them, and it could use more support.

It is certainly possible that our modern ability to have a longer old age detracts from our lives rather than adding to them, and this should be given its share of attention if we are planning to evaluate old age at all. Saying, as Small does, that Aristotle should provide different criteria of virtue for old people because they can't achieve virtue as he describes it makes one wonder what Small thinks the point of moral theory is -- not, surely, to provide standards we can be sure everyone can meet. As I have said, though, this is not a philosophy book, so the lack of argumentation may perhaps be excused. It does make it less interesting to philosophers than it might have been if some of these strands were pursued more substantively. On the whole, though, the book is pleasant to read, informative, and thought-provoking. There is, to say the least, a great display of knowledge. Occasionally the eruption of erudition made me feel like a goose being prepared for foie gras, but for the most part I enjoyed the far-reaching collation of facts and works. Certainly the subject matter is an important and neglected one, and Small's work will no doubt prompt further exploration of the many questions she raises. I recommend it for anyone interested in wandering the literary maze of old age.