Nathan Salmon

Content, Cognition, and Communication: Philosophical Papers II

Nathan Salmon, Content, Cognition, and Communication: Philosophical Papers II, Oxford University Press, 2007, 361pp., $55.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199284726.

Reviewed by Elia Zardini, Arché, University of St. Andrews


1. Introduction

This is the second volume of the collected philosophical papers of Nathan Salmon. As with the first volume (Salmon [2005]), the publication of this book is most welcome. It collects together for the first time a group of papers by one of the most original, provocative and influential philosophers of language of the last three decades, constituting an extremely valuable resource for scholars in philosophy of language, philosophy of mind and epistemology. As the title aptly indicates, the issues dealt with in the various papers focus on three main broad areas: direct reference and belief, apriority and the semantics/pragmatics distinction. These areas might seem diverse and unrelated. But it is no accident that they constitute the three main focal points of a collection of papers by the author, since one of the doctrines for whose ingenious and sustained defence Salmon has made himself known over the years -- Millianism -- has momentous consequences in all three areas. That being noted, I hasten to add that, while the bold exploration and defence of Millianism certainly takes up a substantial part of these collected papers, it by no means exhausts the significance of the philosophical material contained in them, which abounds with other stimulating arguments, observations and views. I will give a perforce brief and incomplete presentation of the various papers, highlighting what I regard as the most interesting arguments and claims, and pointing out some problems that I believe affect them.

2. Direct Reference

The collection is divided into four parts. Part I explores various themes concerning direct reference in natural language. In "A Millian Heir Rejects the Wages of Sinn" Salmon embarks on a staunch apologetic of Millianism -- roughly speaking, the doctrine that the contribution of a proper name to the semantic content expressed by a sentence in which it occurs (what Salmon calls 'the name's information value') is exhausted by the name's referent. (I'll follow Salmon in thinking of semantic contents as propositions and in calling 'singular propositions' those propositions expressible by sentences containing Millian proper names.) Some of the main and most straightforward objections to the view come from a cluster of intuitions directly or indirectly concerning semantic content. Firstly, there seem to be differences in semantic content between sentences that only differ with respect to co-referential proper names, as in:

(1) Phosphorus is Phosphorus.

(2) Phosphorus is Hesperus.

which, given certain plausible assumptions concerning the compositionality of semantic content, would imply that the information value of 'Phosphorus' is different from that of 'Hesperus'. Secondly, ordinary speakers informed of the extent of the Babylonians' astronomical knowledge typically judge:

(3) The Babylonians believed that Phosphorus is Phosphorus.

to be true, while also judging:

(4) The Babylonians believed that Phosphorus is Hesperus.

to be false. However, given certain natural assumptions about the semantics of belief ascriptions, Millianism requires (3) to be true iff (4) is.

Salmon's reply to both objections is elaborate (and was developed at greater length and detail in Salmon [1986]). He first argues that analogous problems arise on just about every theory of semantic content, so that the objections are likely to overgeneralise. The first objection is then addressed by saying that the informativeness of (2) may be due not to the content semantically expressed, but to some other content that is typically pragmatically imparted by an utterance of (2). Relatedly, Salmon addresses the second objection through his well-known analysis of belief ascriptions involving (more specifically, existentially quantifying on) the triadic BEL relation between subjects, structured Russellian propositions and guises (in which the propositions are presented to the subjects), and through the postulation of pragmatic mechanisms exploiting the elements introduced by the analysis. Here, I briefly want to mention a specific problem with understanding the notion of guise. How can a proposition have guises? Salmon's thought (at least in Salmon [1986], p. 108) was that grasping a singular proposition requires grasping the objects that constitute it. Such objects can typically be grasped under different modes of presentation. A guise of a proposition will then be composed (among other things) by certain modes of presentation of the objects that constitute the proposition. This simple and appealing thought generates, for each singular proposition s and each mode of presentation m of an object o constituting s, a class of guises of s agreeing in presenting o under m. As far as I can see, however, this does not yet get us anywhere near to generating, for each singular proposition s and distinct modes of presentation m0 and m1 of an object o constituting s at two different positions p0 and p1 (say, as the "subject" and "direct object" of s), a class of guises of s agreeing in presenting the object in p0 under m0 (and not under m1) and in presenting the object in p1 under m1 (and not under m0). (Needless to say, guises along these lines are required by Salmon's treatment of (3) and (4).) Indeed, it is hard to see how that could in principle be done, since it would seem that [the object in p0 = o = the object in p1] and the context 'x presents y under z' would seem to be extensional. This problem naturally calls for a notion of a mode of presentation of a certain object "as it occurs in a certain position in a proposition", but it is unclear what sense to make of such a relativised notion: objects don't seem to be presented to us relative to positions in a proposition.

Admirably (and typically) enough, Salmon tries to turn the tables and show how consideration of belief ascriptions actually provides an argument in favour of Millianism. He correctly notes that the standard semantics of quantification requires that a de re belief ascription like:

(5) For some x, x is Venus and Jones believes that x is a star.

is true iff the embedded open sentence

(6) Jones believes that x is a star.

is true under some assignment A assigning Venus to 'x'. He then argues that what A assigns to 'x' can only be Venus itself -- for, if a mode of presentation were also assigned, (6) under A would be de dicto rather than de re. I think this sub-argument is objectionable in two respects. (The overarching argument for Millianism is completed by the (controversial) claims that what goes for variables under an assignment goes for constants, and that proper names in natural language are constants.) Firstly, from a witnessing assignment for (5) (namely A) specifying a mode of presentation it doesn't follow that (5) itself (which is true because of A) specifies a mode of presentation (just as from a witnessing assignment for 'For some x, x is the shortest spy' specifying a particular person it doesn't follow that that merely existential statement itself specifies a particular person). Secondly, even if (5) specified a mode of presentation (as it could do for example on the theory mentioned at the end of section 4), it would still count as de re at least in the deep (and admittedly hard to characterise more exactly) sense of purporting to describe a situation in which Jones is in a certain kind of cognitive connection with Venus (as well as in the more operational sense of the term 'Venus' being intersubstitutable in it with any co-referential term).

In "Reflexivity" Salmon elaborates further his Millian theory of belief ascriptions in a sustained discussion of what he calls 'the Richard-Soames problem' (see Richard [1983] and Soames [1985]). Supposing:

(7) The astronomer believes that Phosphorus outweighs Hesperus.

to be true, the theory validates the move to:

(8) The astronomer believes that Phosphorus outweighs Phosphorus.

If the astronomer is rational, the plausible psychological principle:

(L1) If c believes that φa, then c believes that something is such that φit.

would then lead us to expect: