2009.06.28

Irving Singer

Philosophy of Love: A Partial Summing-Up

Irving Singer, Philosophy of Love: A Partial Summing-Up, MIT Press, 2009, 125pp., $14.95 (hbk.), ISBN 9780262195744.

Reviewed by Erica Lucast Stonestreet, College of St. Benedict/St. John's University


Irving Singer's Philosophy of Love: A Partial Summing-Up traverses different paths through themes of his work that will already be familiar to his readers. In fact, a reader might wonder what, if anything, this new book adds to his wide-ranging body of work. A new contribution, however, is not the intention; instead, Singer takes his audience on a personal philosophical journey through his love affair with humanism in general and philosophy of love in particular. Because of this, the book visits its themes without regard to historical chronology, unlike his more systematic works. Over the course of the discussion, Singer recounts his distinction between bestowal and appraisal, his preference for the idea of love as wedding rather than merging, his sense of love as an imaginative and creative acceptance of another human being, the pluralistic nature of love (love of things, of persons, and of ideals), and the hope that a dialogue between humanistic and scientific thinking on love can add much more to the conversation on both sides.

No doubt because of its origin in a series of radio interviews, the book has the wandering, personal character of conversation, with natural breaks and jumps and tangents. Its structure is admittedly "amorphous"; it lacks an overarching thesis and may for this reason be disappointing to someone who is looking for a systematic introduction to the philosophy of love that does some philosophical work. In this respect, the fact that the book opens with a question -- Is romantic love a recent idea? -- is a bit deceptive. If one keeps in mind that the book is a personal work, however, the question comes to make sense: this is the question that started Singer himself out on his journey. He began with the suspicion that the notion of romantic love as a recent invention was incomplete at best, and set out to find out whether this suspicion would be borne out. Hence his trilogy, The Nature of Love, which is a detailed exploration of the intellectual history of love in the Western world, beginning with Plato. So, too, the partial summing-up begins with Plato.

Singer recounts his interpretation of Plato's sense of love as a striving toward the Good, starting with overindulgence in sex (to purge oneself of these more earthly desires) and proceeding from there in stages toward the ultimate goal in life, full perception of the Good. His treatment here differs in focus, though not ultimately in substance, from his treatment of the same ideas in The Nature of Love. Since he sees the Platonic journey from "primordial" love of carnal and sensual pleasures to intellectual and spiritual love of the Good as "the most fertile and powerful single body of thought on love that anyone has ever created throughout Western civilization," his presentation of Plato's ideas is one of the longest and most sustained in the book, a total of six pages.

From this beginning in Plato, Singer steps back and remarks on the way the dialectic of ideas proceeds. Plato's idealism and the "vertical" progression from a baser kind of love to a nobler one contrasts with the more "horizontal" thinking of later times -- more empirical thinking which, according to Singer, avoids the attempt to find a single key to the universe and instead allows us to see love in its diversely plural manifestations. This is an important strand of his own thinking, and occurs throughout the book. Love is not just love of persons; it is love of things and ideals as well, and each of these categories can have endless variations within it. In separating these three types, Singer characterizes himself as a maker of distinctions, claiming that the best we can do as philosophers is explore a vast subject matter and try to clarify it "with ever-finer analysis or dissection."

As Singer continues his reflections, the sections make something of a patchwork. The structure of the book is neither historical nor fully thematic -- more like a concept map.  Although transitions between ideas are often made by returning to Plato, several of them feel artificial and do not seem to grow organically from the end of a previous line of thought. This sort of jump is natural in conversation, though somewhat difficult to follow in writing.

Despite the sometimes desultory course of the discussion, a few themes recur. Perhaps the most important of these has already been mentioned: Singer's insistence on the pluralistic character of love. The most prominent meaning of this lies in the repeated reminder that love can have many different objects. (One might wonder where religious love, which he discusses in detail in other works, fits into his categories of love of people, things, and ideals, or whether he would add a fourth category.) Most discussions of love center on romantic love, which is between people, and Singer's discussion spends proportionate time on romantic love. However, he reminds us how the love of things and ideals can be good, and includes examples from his own life: how he loves the writing process, loves the computer he uses in it, loves humanism and philosophy.

Pluralism causes Singer to resist both the narrowing or reductive tendencies of figures like Plato and Freud, and also the expansive tendencies of figures like Nietzsche. His pluralism helps to support his criticism of Freud's reduction of all love to libidinal desire, though he does not elaborate the critique in great detail in this work. Pluralism also suggests to Singer that Nietzsche's notion of "amor fati," stretched into a love of everything, goes too far. We can love many different kinds of things, but only so many total objects. It is simply impossible to be familiar enough with everything in the universe to bestow on it all the value and attention that characterize love.

Although we are limited in the number of things we can love, Singer does not diminish the importance to us of loving in itself. In his preface, he writes, "I realized that understanding love or its related conditions required an investigation into problems about meaningfulness in life as a whole and the human creation of value in general" (xvii). Our lives are most meaningful when we love objects outside ourselves, and love loving those things. This is a strand of thought that Singer has in common with Harry Frankfurt. Readers who know Frankfurt's recent Reasons of Love will find that Singer mentions many harmonious ideas, though the two philosophers come to them from quite different directions. Singer writes that "What matters most is doing what you can for the sake of living most fully in the present… . Only by exercising a vital effort of this type can you love the life in others and in yourself" (96-7). Singer and Frankfurt both believe that love involves bestowing value on the beloved (though at this point in his thinking Singer makes less of this aspect of love than he used to). Frankfurt adds that in doing so, the lover's welfare is bound up with the beloved's, and in that sense it becomes a part of the lover. This is in turn good for the lover because loving things motivates him or her to act on their behalf or in enjoyment of the things loved, and thus gives him or her reasons to keep going. Singer is less explicit in this book about the logic here, but he agrees with the thrust of Frankfurt's conclusion.

Toward the end of the book, Singer picks up a theme that first appears midway through: the relationship between scientific and humanistic thinking on love. As a humanist who takes a naturalistic stance, Singer acknowledges with some admiration the interest and importance of work taking place in cognitive science. Yet, he suggests, "There is a lack of proper recognition of the role of feelings, of affective realities, that are not wholly amenable to the current modes of investigation" (57). The scientific approach is too "rationalistic" and therefore rests on a fundamental mistake. He believes that we need a "completely new lexicon and analytic approach" to understand the affective side of love in all its glory and messiness: emotions, intuitions and instincts, sexual desires, and so on. He expresses a worry that the humanities are undervalued in the name of technological advancement and pragmatic values. Still, he offers little in the way of concrete suggestions as to how the collaboration between them would look (though he does mention that his work on love and sex is an effort in this vein).

What is the interest of a book like this, if it does no new philosophical work and treats no theme with much depth? Why should we be interested in one man's reflection on his own thought over a long career? Again, the book's origin as a series of interviews holds a clue. Imagine the perspective of interviewer or audience: here is a philosopher who has spent a long time ruminating on themes that matter a great deal to most of us. Here is a man who can talk graciously and thoughtfully about things that matter. He has written volumes on love, creativity, and meaning in life -- things most people experience and would like to understand better -- with both precision and insight. Isn't that a man you'd like to talk to? In this respect he does not disappoint, though he can offer no ultimate answers. Perhaps this is as close as he comes to a single summary of his thinking on love:

Like the world itself, love is an emanation grounded in matter, and comparable to its parental origin. It is a dynamic and always changing process. At the same time, it can empower us to live our brief lives with significant fulfilment, sometimes with joy, and often with a sense of residual satisfaction. (105)

Most people don't know what philosophers really do, and what insights philosophy can (and can't!) offer. It is best, then, to read the whole book as an offering to non-philosophers concerning what the humanities, and philosophy in particular, can contribute to a holistic approach to the expansion of human knowledge.

Singer writes:

If you are a philosopher, you can only make a personal portrait that may be true to yourself, to your times, to your style of thought or writing, and thereby proffer imaginative and possibly genuine insights into the nature of human experience. If what you write is both lucid and suggestive, it may excite the imagination of other people, and that's marvelous. (95)

Using these criteria, Philosophy of Love is marvelous, although it is not a work of philosophy in the strictest sense, and will not satisfy those who seek an organized, sustained inquiry about love. The "ventures up the tree of the human spirit" Singer describes within it constitute a needed defense of humanism in a time when the world seems to be growing more pragmatic and less reflective. In addition to introducing some important themes in the philosophy of love, the book should remind humanistic philosophers why they do what they do, and it should whet the appetites of a broader audience for further reading.