2009.06.29

Ronald R. Sundstrom

The Browning of America and the Evasion of Social Justice

Ronald R. Sundstrom, The Browning of America and the Evasion of Social Justice, SUNY Press, 2008, 190pp., $24.95 (pbk.), ISBN 9780791475867.

Reviewed by Lucius T. Outlaw (Jr.), Vanderbilt University


The United States is undergoing the most profound demographic changes in the country's history so that in a few decades, if not sooner, persons identified (and identifying themselves) as white and tracing their ancestry to Europe will have become part of the nation's racial and ethnic plurality, no longer its numerically dominant racial group. This historic development portends others equally historic and transformative, among these the gradual -- possibly even dramatic -- displacement of white people as the dominating group politically, economically, socially, even culturally.

This is not what this nation-state's founders envisioned or intended. Formed out of colonies of settlers from Western Europe, the United States was a quite historic political enterprise, an experiment in representative federated democratic governance at the national level that preserved increasingly more participatory democratic self-government down the levels of state, county, town and country. However, equally foundational to this new experiment was a hierarchical social ontology ordered by philosophical anthropologies of valorized racial distinctions, confirmed and articulated by the very best of prevailing scientific understandings and legitimated by the very best of prevailing philosophical and theological speculations. In these very confident polity-ordering anthropologies and ontologies, the white race ranked highest, as the superior race that had the God-given burden of responsibility of serving as the vanguard of civilization and progressive, Christian history-making. The United States was thus deemed a sacred venture in state-craft; so, too, the predominance of the superior white race and the subordination or elimination of the weaker, inferior, colored races, whether through enslavement or annihilation.

There was enslavement and genocide, and more. Two hundred plus years later, however, the Coloreds are on the threshold of predominating demographically. The United States, a nation-state by and for the white race, is going brown!

What are literate citizens, teacher-scholars and public intellectuals in particular, to make of this momentous development (which is hardly a single phenomenon)? With what appropriate terms and concepts, with what praxis-guiding agendas of understanding, should we attend to this historic moment through which we are living? Ronald Sundstrom's The Browning of America and the Evasion of Social Justice offers to assist us with these very challenging questions.

Over the last few decades, a tremendous amount of intellectual and scholarly effort has been devoted to clarifying, critiquing, even eliminating terms and concepts intended to identify, define, describe, and otherwise express understandings, valuations, and investments of various kinds and degrees in specifications of raciality and ethnicity. These specifications have served as guides to order both the political economy of the United States as well as the intimacies and relations of social life foundational to all levels of the polity and its operations, at home and abroad. Some persons advocate, even press for, the elimination of all references to and use of racial designations in governmental work and policy-making since such designations are without -- and cannot support -- "scientific" verification in the biological (i.e., genetic) makeup of human individuals long thought to share identifying racial characteristics. Many of these persons argue for "race-blind" or "color-blind" policies and practices in keeping with what some argue were key intentions and articulations in the foundational documents that gave formation to the nation-state as a formal union of independent colonies. Certainly, many of these persons argue, a necessary step in discontinuing the long history of invidious racial discrimination is to discontinue use of misguided and erroneous, "metaphysically empty" concepts of race when formulating and implementing policies and practices by which persons are selected for rewards and sanctions, opportunities and exclusions.

Other persons disagree and argue for revised conceptions of raciality -- or in some instances argue for the substitution of concepts of ethnicity for notions of raciality -- to be used to determine the best terms and means for achieving justice for persons and groups harmed by invidious racial and/or ethnic discrimination, and to be used to keep a watchful eye on policies and practices, and outcomes of their deployment, as history unfolds. Without the markers of raciality or ethnicity, it is argued, there will be no way of determining whether or to what extent invidious practices have been curtailed and with what effects on persons heretofore identified as being members of groups subjected to racialized oppressive invidious discrimination.

What have such concerns and arguments to do with the "browning" of the United States? For Sundstrom, a great deal. First, the use of "browning" to characterize the profound demographic changes underway serves to indicate that the focal agents of the changes are persons who are identified as members of bio-cultural groups heretofore distinguished by the racial/ethnic color codes as the "brown" races: that is, persons from Latin America and South Asia, the Middle East and North Africa. On what terms are these persons to be accommodated or denied opportunities and rewards, sanctioned or supported in their endeavors? In answering, we must keep in mind that the work of retributive, redistributive, or restorative justice is far from finished for persons descended from native peoples who had settled the continent eons before the coming of the rapacious, supposedly racially superior white settler-colonists who appropriated lands and resources for themselves and their descendants "by any means necessary", physical and cultural genocide included.  In doing so, the colonists also appropriated resources for the generations of descendants of African peoples, who were enslaved and otherwise oppressed for centuries with humanity-deforming consequences still being experienced today. Will the challenges of the "browning" of the United States usher in compelling opportunities for refining our terms and concepts, practices and policy-making, so that all forms of justice needed will be better worked at and achieved?

Strong and principled voices have offered seemingly persuasive and well-reasoned arguments in response to these and other important questions having to do with achieving justice in our multiracial, multiethnic polity.  This polity has a troublesome history of conditioning peoples' histories by the complications of a founding state- and people-making project -- E Pluribus Unum: Out of many [peoples], One [people] -- that, simultaneously, sanctioned racialized genocide and enslavement, and the exclusion of other "colored" non-white races. Some persons envision a United States no longer ordered by racial or ethnic considerations, where color-consciousness has been dissipated by practicing color-blindness, and by the demographic predominance of "brown" Americans to such an extent that the sorting of persons into hierarchically valued, color-coded racial and ethnic groups will not have a demographic basis. Such was the wish of Frederick Douglass: that the nation's racial population groups would intermingle and interbreed -- in his words "amalgamate' -- to such an extent that a new "blended" race, neither black nor white, would emerge and rescue our country from the scourge of color-conscious, color-valuing racialisms and racisms.

In the first chapter of The Browning of America, Sundstrom explores what he terms "Frederick Douglass's Political Apostasy". He takes into serious consideration Douglass's principled investments in the notion of human brotherhood as more ethically foundational than raciality or ethnicity and thus more appropriate as a foundation for a democratic republic with a multiplicity of races and ethnic groups since, by Douglass's reasoning, neither raciality nor ethnicity should have ethical significance. In the words of contemporary thinkers who are soul-mates of Douglass, raciality and ethnicity are "irrelevant from a moral point of view". However, Sundstrom is not persuaded by Douglass, and views the latter as a tragic figure pressed into "radical alienation" by the disappointments of the continuing ethical failures of invidious racialisms and the failure to achieve color-blindness in the organization and functioning of the United States, notwithstanding the Union victory in the Civil War and the emancipation of Negro slaves. Justice was evaded …

Sundstrom would not have contemporary heirs of Douglass's intellectual and political agendas hijack the browning of the United States in well-intentioned but misguided, even naïve, efforts to describe, define, or direct the transformation as a realization of color-blindness, for doing so would "threaten progressive color-conscious policies, and thus aid in the evasion of righting past racial wrongs" (p. 37). His efforts in the second chapter, "Color Blindness and the Browning of America", are devoted to countering this hijacking while working out careful considerations of the key notions of color blindness, color-consciousness, and the browning of America. This is a particularly meaty chapter, one worth reading for the range of voices Sundstrom surveys (and for the references!). It is also worth reading in order to savour the commendable efforts expended to highlight the virtues of each notion and some of the very important relationships of each to the realization of both backward-looking and forward-looking justice-making in our nation. Moreover, Sundstrom works with care to give respectful, though critical, treatment to the positions of the racial and ethnic "conservationists": those (this writer among them), that is, who, like W.E.B. Du Bois, argue for color-conscious policies and practices that will help to "conserve" racial and/or ethnic groups as producers and sharers of cultures the diversity of which enhances the well-being of the human species. Of course, the arguments of the conservationists are heavily challenged by prevailing understandings held by many that contemporary sciences have proven that there are no distinctive racial groups within the human species that can be singled out on the basis of biological characteristics. Accordingly, "race" can refer, at best, to social groupings by social convention, but cannot, does not, pick out "natural kinds."

Even so, the matter has not been settled once and for all. Differences and diversities of cultures and culture-making peoples (individuals who form, and are formed by, self-identifying group-distinguishing characteristics, biological as well as cultural) prevail and are the focus of democratic politics (for recognition and for life-enhancing appreciation). As Sundstrom notes:

The real moral and political work involves reconciling the fact of differences, whether these differences are socially or biologically generated, and building moral communities within and between just and stable political societies. (p. 48)

For this moral and political work principles of color-blindness are often quite appropriate, sometimes even necessary. So, too, are principles that require color-consciousness. Sundstrom assures us, through careful argument, that this important work cannot be accomplished by misappropriations of "the browning of America".

However, this development demands that the many of us who carry out this work cease thinking, talking, and acting as though the United States's racial problems are exclusively, or even primarily, matters having to do with relations between the "white" and "black" races. This has never been the case, even from the founding. Native "red" peoples were on hand and characters in the opening drama; their descendants are largely tragic figures still for whom justice in almost any form has not been realized. Likewise, "brown" and "yellow" races have been important characters in the nation-making drama, though hardly with proper billing or compensation, to say nothing of proper justice. In chapter three, "The Black-White Binary as Racial Anxiety and Demand for Justice", Sundstrom provides an educative survey of struggles over how best to take proper note of the increasing racial and ethnic diversification of the United States while continuing the work of retributive, redistributive, and restorative justice for people of African descent in particular, as well as for other peoples of color.  This work must be done while attenuating the troublesome and potentially explosive worries of those white people who equate the loss of numerical predominance with the loss of their rights and privileges long rationalized as being sanctioned and secured by their superior whiteness. Also of note, Sundstrom challenges those working for the browning of the United States not to be misled in believing that in doing so they will come to have special rank and associated privileges in a reshaped (and re-colored) racial and ethnic hierarchy. Rather, he reasons, "brown" peoples have a special responsibility not to reconfigure and further consolidate the hierarchy. Social justice is not to be evaded …

In the midst of all of the many aspects of invidious racial and ethnic oppressions that have been devised and practiced across the history of the United States, the aspect most sensitive and productive of the most grotesque violence has been that having to do with the most intimate and consequential of human involvements: intimate relations, intimate sexual relations especially, between persons of different and differently ranked racial groups. These are subjects, Sundstrom argues, that have been systematically avoided by contemporary thinkers who wrestle with race matters. He would have us stop avoiding the subject, not least because of the foundational importance of intimate relations for the formation and continuation of polities. Without such relationships, there can be no polities. There can be no resolution of our racial and ethnic difficulties without being forthright about intimate and sexual interracial matters. These, argues Sundstrom, must not be relegated to the realm of privacy and thus put off limits to philosophers and theorists of the social and political. Moreover, he would not have these matters be wedded to the "browning of America" as their presumed resolution, as Frederick Douglass had hoped out of anguished alienation and desperation. Chapter four, "Interracial Intimacies: Racism and the Political Romance of the Browning of America" is required reading for us all, if social justice is not to be evaded.

So, too, chapter 5, "Responsible Multiracial Politics". Here the reader will experience, as well as come to understand, the personal existential weight and philosophical significance for Sundstrom of political endeavours for persons whose identities are neither easily nor accurately given fulfilling, coherent, authentic, and healthy articulation and lived-experience if forced into a seemingly singular, unitary, and thus supposedly harmonious racial designation. Persons who are descendants of multiracial, multiethnic unions -- even when the races and ethnic groups are understood as social, rather than biological, constructs -- need the terms and concepts by which they can identify, identify with, and live their important various heritages, by which they can, in all appropriate instances, 'remember their grandmothers'. Needed, too, are modes of politics that sanction and nurture this important existential work as another crucial aspect of multiracial, multiethnic democratic polities, modes of politics by which persons of complex identities can be made ready for and welcomed to shared and responsible political life. Social justice without evasion …

Sundstrom offers his own conclusions to his chapter-focused discussions of the various issues being brought to the fore by the "browning" of the United States. I urge readers to consider his final offerings, but to be persuaded to them, or not, only after a careful and considerate reading of the entire book. For whether or not one is persuaded by Sundstrom, I am confident that the considerate reader will be better informed by the experience, more thoughtful about her or his own convictions regarding the matters he addresses, and better enabled to assist with avoiding the evasion of social justice.