2009.06.31

Rae Langton

Sexual Solipsism: Philosophical Essays on Pornography and Objectification

Rae Langton, Sexual Solipsism: Philosophical Essays on Pornography and Objectification, Oxford UP, 2009, 405 pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780199551453.

Wellesley College

Reviewed by Mary Kate McGowan, Wellesley College


Sexual Solipsism: Philosophical Essays on Pornography and Objectification is a collection of fifteen essays by Rae Langton, a leading political philosopher and feminist. Although many of the essays have appeared before, this collection brings together in one handy volume all of her important work in this area. Three of the essays are previously unpublished and offer new material as well as responses to critics. Most of the essays have been at least slightly revised. There is some repetition, which ensures that each essay is intelligible in isolation. Langton's crisp, clear, and careful argumentation proves that philosophy has much to offer the socially, politically and even legally charged issues addressed here. This book will not disappoint.

What, one might wonder, is sexual solipsism? To understand, consider first a solipsist who believes that she is the only person who exists. If solipsism is false, she will fail to treat people as people. In short, she will treat people as things. Suppose instead that solipsism is true but that one does not realize it. In such a case, one treats things that are not people as if they are. In short, one treats things as people. As Langton stresses, these two forms of solipsism (treating persons as things and treating things as persons) come in more localized sexual forms. After all, sexual objectification essentially involves treating a person as a thing, while the consumption of pornography involves treating pornographic objects (in other words, things) as sexual partners (in other words, people). There is also an important connection between these two forms of sexual solipsism. According to Langton's MacKinnon-inspired view of pornography, consuming pornography (which, as we just saw, involves treating things as people) brings about the sexual objectification of women that, in turn, involves treating women as things. This relationship between the two forms of sexual solipsism connects pornography to the sexual objectification of women.

Essays on Pornography

There is considerable controversy over the free speech status of pornography. Most feminists who argue that pornography ought to be regulated (and there are many who believe that it should not be) focus on an alleged connection between pornography and harm. Typically, they claim that pornography somehow causes harm and that the harms caused are sufficiently great to warrant regulation. Following Catharine MacKinnon, however, Langton here pursues a different approach (MacKinnon 1987, 1993). Rather than focus on the harms allegedly caused, Langton explores the hypothesis that pornography actually constitutes harm. In her "Speech Acts and Unspeakable Acts", published in 1993 and reprinted here as chapter 1, Langton uses the tools of speech act theory to develop her analysis of this constitutive approach. Although this may be initially surprising, speech can constitute harm. Suppose, for example, that an executive verbally enacts a new hiring policy for his company when he says: "From now on, we only hire men. Women are just too damn irrational." This utterance both causes and constitutes harm. It causes the harm of discrimination by causing a discriminatory hiring practice. Since it also enacts a discriminatory policy, it also constitutes the harm of discrimination. According to both MacKinnon and Langton, pornography works in a similar way. It causes women harm and it does so, in part, by enacting social norms that are (at least partially) constitutive of women's subordinate social status.[1]

Again following MacKinnon, Langton focuses on two harms allegedly constituted by pornography: subordination and silencing (MacKinnon 1987, 1993). I consider each in turn. First, according to Langton, pornography subordinates women because it is an illocutionary act (speech act) of subordination. Akin to the executive who enacts a discriminatory policy, pornography somehow enacts social norms that subordinate women, according to Langton, by ranking women as inferior, legitimating discriminatory behavior towards them and depriving them of important powers. Although this is an extremely interesting and fruitful proposal, this speech act approach nevertheless faces several challenges. It is unclear that pornography can helpfully be understood in speech act terms. (Who is the speaker? Assuming there is an identifiable speaker, does that speaker have an identifiable communicative intention? If so, is that intention compatible with pornography doing what Langton contends? If not, does it even make sense to think of pornography as a speech act?)

Much of Langton's ensuing material focuses on the question of authority. Clearly, some speech acts require that the speaker have, and be exercising, some form of authority. Notice that it is only because the executive has the authority to do so that his words can enact a hiring policy for his company. Since Langton maintains that pornography enacts social norms, and since enacting such norms appears to require authority, Langton must treat pornography as authoritative speech and it is not at all clear that it is. Both Judith Butler and Leslie Green argue that Langton's approach is undermined because this authority condition is both necessary and unsatisfied (Butler 1997, Green 1998). Although Langton here deftly responds to these criticisms, she does not establish that pornography actually has the requisite authority. She shows only that others have not shown that it does not. Of course, this is a complex empirical matter and one should not attempt to settle such matters from the philosopher's armchair. Fair enough. Nevertheless, there is still the unsettled philosophical question regarding what would constitute the requisite authority. A positive characterization of the informal, implicit, non-institutional sort of authority at issue remains important work to be done.

Langton also argues, along with MacKinnon and Jennifer Hornsby, that pornography silences women in such a way that it violates women's right to free speech (MacKinnon 1987, 1993; Hornsby 1993). If this is correct, then the free speech right of pornographers (to produce, distribute and consume pornography) is in direct conflict with the free speech right of women. According to Langton and Hornsby, silencing is systematic communicative interference constituted by (a systematic pattern of) hearers failing to recognize the communicative intention of speakers. Pornography is alleged to bring about silencing since consuming (certain sorts of) pornography brings it about that (some) men fail to recognize (some) women's intention to sexually refuse. When this happens, those women thereby fail to communicate their refusals to those men and they are thus silenced.

Many are critical of this work on silencing. Daniel Jacobson argues that a right to free speech cannot involve a right to illocution and that their work on silencing relies on false assumptions about the role of hearer recognition in successful speech acts (Jacobson 1995). Judith Butler argues that silencing is everywhere and this is a good thing since the possibility of reinterpreting speech is the best route to positive political change (Butler 1997). Ronald Dworkin argues that treating silencing as a violation of the right to free speech (absurdly) assumes that this right guarantees an encouraging respectful audience and perfect understanding (Dworkin 1993). Although Langton skillfully and successfully responds to these important criticisms, there are other important issues not addressed either by her or by her critics. Langton does not discuss, for example, whether consuming pornography really causes such silencing (and, if so, how exactly). Even more important perhaps, the question of whether there are any actual cases of silencing, and how we would prove it, is not addressed. Granted, this is a tall task. It would require proving, for example, that a particular rapist, on a particular occasion, failed to recognize a woman's communicative intention (as opposed to, say, falsely believing that her refusal was insincere or recognizing but ignoring her refusal). As one can see, important work remains to be done. This is hardly surprising (and hardly a criticism) when one cuts new ground as Langton has done.

Finally, I would be remiss if, when discussing Langton's work on pornography, I did not also mention her brilliant "Whose Right? Ronald Dworkin, Women and Pornographers." In this essay (chapter 6), she carefully lays out Dworkin's system and methodically argues that his positions on segregation and affirmative action actually require him to reject (rather than uphold, as he does in Dworkin 1981) the standard liberal defense of pornography. This is a stunning exemplar of feminist political philosophy: a careful and ambitious argument for a surprising and important conclusion.

Essays on Objectification

Langton's treatment of sexual objectification is also both subtle and complex and I cannot do justice to it in what little space remains. Instead, I shall focus on just one of many interesting threads. This one concerns a connection between objectification and autonomy. To objectify someone is typically understood to involve regarding (and perhaps even treating) her as a mere plaything to be used and violated (Nussbaum 1995). Such a stance offends her autonomy by assuming that she has none. Nevertheless, as Langton here stresses, there are other ways to objectify that also offend autonomy but do not deny it. In fact, these other forms of objectification actually presuppose, in some sense, the affirmation of autonomy. Consider, for example, sadistic rape. Here, the rapist derives sexual pleasure from the victim's terror and this requires regarding the victim as having a will (and thus as being no mere thing). In this way, we see that the connection between objectification and autonomy are not quite as straightforward as some have supposed (Nussbaum 1995).

This insight also has consequences for a feminist interpretation of pornography. Some feminists, for example, argue that pornography is autonomy-affirming since it portrays women as actively choosing to engage in sex. Comparing this to the repressive sexual norms of the 1950's, pornography can thus seem liberating and hence socially good. Opening up the possibility that autonomy-affirmation can be perniciously paired with one of these other forms of autonomy offense, Langton here demonstrates the complexity of pornography's social meaning. Is it really so liberating to portray women as choosing to engage in sex that is both painful and degrading? As one can see, the issue is not so simple.

Another important theme in Langton's work on objectification concerns the complex way that expectations shape the social world. Our gender norms prescribe how men and women ought to be and, by so doing, help to make us that way. Such self-fulfilling beliefs, as Langton calls them, both make the world conform to our expectations and mask the fact that this is what's happening. In this way, our gendered behaviors can come to seem both natural and just.

The book is full of unexpected, but welcome, twists. Langton finds surprising comrades to feminism in the history of philosophy. Although Kant is not usually seen as a feminist, Langton's use of his work certainly is. Hume's work on projection is also applied to the masking of social construction and Descartes' rationalism is celebrated as a reliable method for ridding oneself of prejudicial beliefs. She also draws on contemporary philosophical work in resourceful and imaginative ways. Recent work on color perception is applied to the projective aspects of sexual objectification, current epistemology is used to support the claim that pornography generates (a problematic form of) knowledge, and work on the difficulties associated with deciding to believe are applied to her assessment of self-fulfilling beliefs. Finally, although Langton is definitely an analytic philosopher, she occasionally alludes to work in the continental tradition. Continental feminist work on projection is applied to both sexual objectification and the manner in which its construction is hidden, and existentialist bad faith comes up when discussing how some participate in their own objectification.

In sum, the book is superb. Many are inclined to dismiss feminist scholarship on the grounds that it lacks clarity and rigor. Langton's work is a prime counter-example. It is both clear and careful. Some are suspicious of feminist scholarship since it has a clear agenda and that agenda is thought to undermine the integrity of the work. Langton's scholarship proves that this suspicion too is misplaced. As we have seen, Langton believes that women are oppressed via sexual objectification and that the consumption of pornography contributes, in complex ways, to women's inferior social status. Thus, although it is clear that Langton has a substantive agenda, it is equally clear that she has rigorous arguments in support of that agenda. Finally, Langton is not merely preaching to the choir. She is keenly fair-minded. She engages openly with critics. She explicitly states her assumptions and she herself identifies the work that remains to be done in supporting the views that she here endorses. This is feminist scholarship at its very best. It's first-rate philosophy.

References

Butler, Judith. 1997. "Sovereign Performatives" in Excitable Speech: A Politics of the Performative, New York and London, Routledge: 71-102.

Dworkin, Ronald. 1981. "Do We Have a Right to Pornography?" Oxford Journal of Legal Studies I: 177-212.

Dworkin, Ronald. 1993. "Women and Pornography," The New York Review of Books, 21 October: 36, 37, 40-42.

Green, Leslie. 1998. "Pornographizing, Subordinating and Silencing" in Censorship and Silencing: Practices of Cultural Regulation, Robert C. Post (ed.), Los Angeles, CA, Getty Research Institute for the History of Art and the Humanities: 285-311.

Hornsby, Jennifer. 1993. "Speech Acts and Pornography," Women's Philosophy Review 10: 38-45.

Jacobson, Daniel. 1995. "Freedom of Speech Acts? A Response to Langton," Philosophy and Public Affairs 24: 64-79.

Langton, Rae. 1993. "Speech Acts and Unspeakable Acts," Philosophy and Public Affairs 22: 305-330. Reprinted in Sexual Solipsism: Philosophical Essays on Pornography and Objectification, Oxford, Oxford University Press: 25-87.

MacKinnon, Catharine. 1987. "Francis Biddle's Sister: Pornography, Civil Rights, and Speech," in Feminism Unmodified: Discourses on Life and Law, Cambridge, MA, Harvard University Press: 163-197.

MacKinnon, Catharine. 1993. Only Words, Cambridge, MA, Harvard University Press.

Nussbaum, Martha. 1995. "Objectification," Philosophy and Public Affairs 24: 249-291.



[1] Although MacKinnon believes that pornography causes a variety of substantive harms to women, she argues that it ought to be regulated because of the harms it constitutes. According to MacKinnon, pornography violates women's civil rights. Langton is here less concerned with regulation than she is with philosophically substantiating the claim that pornography constitutes harm.