Annette C. Baier

Death and Character: Further Reflections on Hume

Annette C. Baier, Death and Character: Further Reflections on Hume, Harvard UP, 2008, 288pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674030909.

Reviewed by Charlotte R. Brown, and William Edward Morris, Illinois Wesleyan University


In 1991, Harvard University Press published Annette Baier’s A Progress of Sentiments. Subtitled Reflections on Hume’s Treatise, it is one of the few works in recent decades that treat the Treatise as a systematic whole. Nearly twenty years later, it is both a classic of Hume scholarship and a vivid expression of its author’s personality. The 14 essays collected in Death and Character, some previously published, join two other collections largely concerned with Hume-related topics, Postures of the Mind (Methuen, 1985) and Moral Prejudices (Harvard, 1994).

Death and Character is divided into two parts, corresponding to a distinction Hume made at the beginning of An Enquiry concerning Human Understanding (EHU) between “two species of philosophy”, the “easy and obvious” and the “difficult and abstruse.” The concept of character loosely connects the essays in Part I, while Part II’s primary concerns are the changes Hume made in his writings after the Treatise, especially those he made in recasting Book 1 as EHU. Concluding the collection is a study of Hume’s brief autobiography, “My Own Life”, which contains Baier’s reflections on Hume’s reflections on his character on the eve of his “cheerful death”.

The title of this collection was inspired by Hume’s practice in The History of England of concluding his discussions of rulers and other notables with a section on their “death and character”. It also reflects Baier’s pleasure, upon her retirement, at having the leisure to “really read” Hume’s History. While the fruits of her study are most immediately evident in Part I, Baier believes her close reading of the History affects the character of the entire volume. She regards her “lengthy excursion” in the History as an exercise that “seems to have cleared some mists and preconceptions from my mind, so that I could see what I, and my respected teachers and colleagues, and friends in the Hume Society, had missed” in Hume’s “abstruse early writings” (x).

While the chapters in Part II are definitely as advertised, those in Part I are by no means “easy and obvious”. Both parts make serious demands on any reader, who must know Hume’s philosophical works, especially the Treatise as well as The History of England, and who must also have the history of England as well as a working knowledge of much recent Hume scholarship at her mental fingertips. In both parts, Baier is more than willing to go beyond anything Hume explicitly said. This is especially evident in the second part, where she deliberately reconstructs what Hume said in order to provide a better account of what he should have said. At times, it is hard to see just where Hume ends and Baier begins.

Baier’s “further reflections on Hume” range more widely over his writings, especially The History of England, than did her earlier works. They continue to reflect her “Hume obsessed” philosophical persona, while exhibiting a greater willingness to insert personal reminiscences, some of which are hilarious. In one essay, she reports that her interest in personal identity may go back to one of her earliest pronouncements, one that became part of family lore. Apparently, she said at one point: “I don’t like being me”. Locke and Hume got her puzzled about the philosophical problem of personal identity. She confesses she found Hume’s account puzzling:

When I read Hume’s words about perceptions succeeding each other with an inconceivable rapidity, in perpetual flux and motion, I wondered if my mental life was unnaturally sedate and slow, as “infinite variety of postures and situations” and “perpetual flux” seemed gross exaggerations of the modest variety in conscious life. But I tried on Hume’s persona, moved my eyeballs in their sockets more, stood on my head, pressed one eyeball to double my world, and did other recommended philosophical exercises. (29)

Part I

In “Acting in Character”, the most overtly philosophical of the six essays in Part I, Baier explores the role that character plays in ordinary explanations of action. She appeals to a number of Hume’s character sketches from the History to “illustrate and confirm” her central theses. Since for Hume one of the historian’s tasks is to uncover the “true character” of the individuals he writes about, she thinks that reflecting on his character sketches should help to determine when it is appropriate to cite character traits in explaining what people do.

Baier wants to debunk the theory — generally attributed to Davidson — that a desire plus a belief about how to satisfy it are the central components of any satisfactory explanation of intentional action. She also wants to debunk the view that Hume himself endorsed the desire-belief model of explanation. It is “Humeans” — not Hume — who believe that the central elements of any explanation of action consist in a desire plus a belief about how to satisfy it. Agreeing with David Velleman, she argues that sometimes we may satisfactorily explain action by appealing to a person’s character traits. Not only may we explain action by appealing to a person’s character traits, but also explanations in terms of character traits do not necessarily reduce to desire-belief explanations. For example, Hume thinks that the key factor in explaining Charles I’s various “mis-moves” is his weak character, in particular his bad judgment in choosing advisors, which led him to adopt dangerous and inconsistent means to his ends. Similarly, the key factors in explaining Cromwell’s willingness to have Charles tried and executed are his ambition and his ruthlessness.

Baier assumes a certain picture about the role of explanation once prominent in analytic philosophy of action. According to that view, explanations are called for when we are puzzled by what an agent is doing. Thus explanations are relative to what we know about the agent and to how puzzling we find her actions. An explanation is successful when we are no longer puzzled or, at least, are less puzzled. An explanation fails if it explains what we find puzzling by something more puzzling.

According to this conception of explanation, most ordinary human actions require no explanation. Baier has in mind such ordinary actions as getting up in the morning, eating breakfast, and going to work. These actions, she insists, are self-explanatory. Likewise, many of our actions spring from desires universally shared by all human beings. In most cases, there is no need to explain why people want food, liquid and sleep. To say that someone has these needs and wants is just to emphasize that she is human: “Most human action is boringly normal, and does not call for any explanation, given accepted views of human nature” (14).

“What calls for explanation”, according to this view, “does so against a background of normal activity that does not” (12). It is when the desires or beliefs “behind the action” are somewhat out of the ordinary that we may need to appeal to an agent’s character traits to explain what they did. For example, Hume thinks that Charles I’s move to impeach parliamentary leaders so “amazed” the world that it cried out for an explanation.

Baier claims that character “like human nature, seems ever-present and always to some degree relevant” in explaining action. How, she asks, could our character — what we are like — not be a factor in what we do? The kind of person you are may help to determine what desires you have and act on as well as what beliefs you form, just as Cromwell’s ambitiousness explains his strong desire to rule.

According to Baier, it is the really “unusual cases” where someone acts out of character that are most puzzling to us and most in need of explanation. Out-of-character actions “may just be the cases where belief and desire” explain what the agent is doing. In support, she briefly looks at some of Hume’s discussions of actions that are out of character. One example is when Henry II made Becket Archbishop of Canterbury. He badly misjudged Becket’s ambitious character because he believed that Becket agreed with him about the role of the church. Another example is his hypocritical display of grief at Becket’s tomb, which was motivated by his desire to secure better relations with the church.

Baier’s “unexciting conclusion” is that it is appropriate to explain human action by citing character “when the action is not so ordinary and everyday as to be self-explanatory, nor so unusual for this particular agent as to seem out of character” (20). Baier believes that most of us, most of the time “act in character” and thus character is “usually relevant in explaining what we do”. Even when we act out of character, she thinks that it is unlikely that we ever act wholly out of character. Baier says that even though Henry misjudged Becket’s character, which was out of character for him, it was nevertheless in character for him to rely on and trust his friends. Thus, even when we act out of character, the beliefs and desires that explain our out-of-character action may themselves be in character. For Baier, the character traits of agents — rather than their beliefs and desires — are privileged in explaining human action.

In three other essays, Baier makes even more extensive use of Hume’s character studies from his History. In “Hume’s Excellent Hypocrites”, she discusses four sorts of hypocrisy: (i) the mild hypocrisy in “polite posturing” or everyday politeness that doesn’t deceive; (ii) the hypocrisy of pretending to a religious faith when you don’t have one or to a firmer faith than you have, an “excusable strategy” for people living in countries with an established religion; (iii) the hypocrisy in clerics, which Hume believes is their “occupational vice”; and (iv) the hypocrisy of rulers. Rulers were expected to be hypocritical for the public good and to protect their own power. Since the monarchs Hume discusses have a “presumptive permission” to put on shows of hypocrisy when it serves their interests or the interests of their country, the royal acts of hypocrisy he mentions will be “glaring”. Two such “excellent hypocrites” were Henry II and Elizabeth I. Both faced a dangerous rival — Becket in Henry’s case and Mary Stuart in Elizabeth’s. Both took steps to make sure their rivals were killed. Both afterwards put on public displays of grief and then resumed ruling well. Hume doesn’t condemn Charles II for his “sustained hypocrisy” of putting on a show of being a faithful Anglican, even though he was either a deist or Catholic. He loved his country enough to pretend to the established religion. Instead, Hume condemns James II for his open display of Catholicism.

Baier claims that if monarchs have a “presumptive permission” to put on displays of hypocrisy, what we should notice is when they are in situations where we expect them to be hypocritical, but aren’t. One such case is Henry VIII. We might have expected him to display hypocrisy in claiming “principled reasons” for divorcing Catherine of Aragon, but he didn’t. He was sincere — at least, according to Baier’s Hume.

In two other essays, Baier looks at Hume’s treatment of a particular historical character. In “Hume’s Treatment of Oliver Cromwell”, she focuses on Hume’s explanation of why Cromwell, late in life, refused the crown — even though his ambition was to rule and to fulfill a prophecy made earlier that he would be the “greatest man in England”. She thinks Hume’s explanation is important because it shows how ruling passions such as Cromwell’s ambition to rule and his religious zeal may continue throughout a person’s life, yet be tempered by experience, and can “progress from criminal excess in youth to humanity and justice when older and wiser” (80). In this essay, she returns to her previous reflections on hypocrisy and wonders whether Hume thinks Cromwell is a hypocrite. According to her, Hume judges him to be a “consummate hypocrite” during his rise to power, yet he never accuses him of being a religious hypocrite. She also argues that Velleman’s theory of reasons for action fits Hume’s account of the forces that drove Cromwell to refuse the crown better than the standard “Humean” belief-desire model.

It should be no surprise to anyone familiar with what Hume says about religion in his other works that in the History he is equally condemnatory of it. What is surprising is that in the History, Hume seems to favor conformity to established religion; in many cases it doesn’t seem to matter what religion it is. In “Hume and the Conformity of Bishop Tunstal”, Baier examines Hume’s treatment of Cuthbert Tunstal, who was bishop of London when Henry VIII began to oppose Rome. Tunstal managed to live through the reign of 4 monarchs. A Catholic throughout, by turns he conformed to the established religion of Henry VIII, Edward VI, and Mary Tudor, even though he had theological disagreements with the first two. He refused to accommodate Elizabeth I by signing an Oath of Supremacy, so he died in his “guest/prison” bed a “good Catholic”.

What Hume finds displeasing in priests and clerics is their fanaticism — their drive to make martyrs of people who disagree — and their zeal — their drive to make new converts. Tunstal was complicit in the death of some dissenters and failed to intervene in the death of many others. So why did Hume judge him to be “relatively pleasing, as priests go”? To answer that question, Baier says, we need to understand why Hume favors conformity to established religion. According to her, Hume may believe that religion can’t be abolished from human nature altogether, so the best religion is one that acts to temper, or even prevent, religious fanaticism and zeal. Hume suggests a policy of putting clerics on a state payroll in order to “bribe them to indolence”. Having an established religion may help preserve internal peace. Tunstal, Hume says, had his “priorities right”. His compliance was due to a “sense of duty”, which led him to believe that concern for public peace should trump private opinion. Baier claims that Hume’s attitude toward established religion is a mixture of “realism, irony, despair, and moral satire” (96). His aim was to provoke readers to think about the role of religion in society. Even if he admired Tunstal, his ultimate goal was the abolition of religion.

In “Hume’s Deathbed Reading: A Tale of Three Letters”, Baier is interested in Hume’s own character as revealed not only by the way he faced death, but also by what he was reading shortly before he died. Why, however, is there a mystery about what he was reading? Didn’t Adam Smith report in one of two letters he wrote about Hume’s death that he was reading Lucian’s “Dialogues of the Dead”? Didn’t he report in both that Hume was joking about what excuses he might offer Charon to delay his death? Since the standard excuses — wanting to see his daughter married, his house completed, or enemies revenged — weren’t options for him, Hume thought he might say he was busy editing his published work and wanted to see what effect they would have, especially “in hastening the downfall of the prevailing system of superstition”.

The problem is that none of Lucian’s “Dialogues of the Dead” contain any of the excuses Hume considered and ruled out. However, there is a third letter, written by Hume’s physician, William Cullen, which is now readily available in full to Hume scholars in James Fieser’s Early Responses to Hume. Not only does Cullen report that Hume was reading Lucian’s “Kataplous” or “The Downward Journey”, but also this work contains many of the excuses Smith mentions Hume rejected. There was, and continues to be, a great deal of interest in how Hume, “the Great Infidel”, faced death. To be reading and “mock-casting” himself in a Lucian dialogue was certainly offensive to Christian ideas about how we should face death. Hume, even on his deathbed, was mocking superstition.

Part II

In the seven chapters that comprise the “difficult and abstruse” Part II, Baier turns her attention to "the Treatise and its relation to the works in which Hume ‘cast anew’ the material in its three books" (vii). While she says a bit about Hume’s rewrites of Books 2 and 3, primarily to dump on A Dissertation on the Passions as a disappointingly short and superficial take on Book 2, Baier’s real interest and her focus in Part II is on the changes Hume made in transforming Book 1 into EHU.

Baier acknowledges that “there is some repetition” in these chapters, and indeed there is. This is not necessarily a bad thing. It allows Baier to return, again and again, to a few core theses about Hume’s changes to Book 1, why he made them, and what she thinks he might have done with them. Each time she returns to a topic, she approaches it from a slightly different perspective of emphasis and detail, which fleshes out and makes richer the results of her “further reflections”.

Baier believes the key to understanding why Hume made the changes he did in EHU can be found in the concerns he expresses in his Appendix to the Treatise, which was published along with Book 3 in 1740. Hume worries there about various aspects of his theory of belief, in particular whether “vivacity” is the best way to characterize “the nature of this feeling or sentiment” (T 624). His most dramatic revelation, however, is that “upon a more strict review” of his account of personal identity, “I find myself involv’d in such a labyrinth, that … I neither know how to correct my former opinions, nor how to render them consistent” (T 633).

Baier asks what prompted Hume to make this confession. She plausibly conjectures that the two early reviews of the Treatise, which we know he read, occasioned his second thoughts. The reviewers targeted the very topics that Hume revisited in the Appendix and that he either dropped altogether or changed considerably in EHU. They mocked his use of “vivacity” to characterize belief, ridiculed his views on the causation of belief, and roundly rejected his account of personal identity as decidedly inferior to Locke’s.

The young Hume, Baier concludes, took their jibes to heart. In EHU, he doesn’t mention personal identity, drops his account of vivacity transmission in causation and belief formation, and modifies his definitions of cause accordingly. These changes, she maintains, aren’t related only because the same sources prompted them. They are also importantly and intimately interrelated philosophically, even if Hume himself failed to see all of their ramifications because “he underestimated the resources of his own theory of the human understanding” (181).

Baier’s “main aim” in Part II is “to show the unexploited richness of [Hume’s] positive theory of mind” (182). Her project consists partly in explaining the philosophical significance of the changes Hume made in EHU, and partly in imaginatively reconstructing an “account Hume could indeed have given of what he called himself” (181).

Turning first to the changes Hume made in his definitions of cause, Baier suggests that in reflecting on the Treatise definitions, Hume must have noticed that they didn’t “bear their own survey”. Realizing this prompted his changes to them, Baier maintains, for his EHU definitions do “bear their own survey”.

In the Treatise, Hume defined cause twice, first as a philosophical relation, as

an object precedent and contiguous to another, and where all the objects resembling the former are plac’d in like relations of precedency and contiguity to those objects, that resemble the latter,

and as a natural relation, as

an object precedent and contiguous to another, and so united with it, that the idea of the one determines the mind to form the idea of the other, and the impression of the one to form a more lively idea of the other. (T 170)

In EHU, Hume drops the philosophical/natural terminology, which Baier, along with almost everyone else, regards as an improvement. Nevertheless he again defined cause twice over. His first definition drops the Treatise‘s requirement of “contiguity”:

An object, followed by another, and where all the objects similar to the first are followed by objects similar to the second. (EHU 76)

The second drops the requirement that there be an “impression” of the cause, as well as the requirement that the cause “form a more lively idea” of its effect:

An object, followed by another, and whose appearance always conveys the thought to that other. (EHU 77)

Although some readers noticed the contiguity requirement’s absence in the first definition, almost all of them failed to appreciate its connection with mental causation, which the Treatise definitions — apparently unintentionally — rule out.

Baier highlights both points, and adds a previously unnoticed one of far greater significance: dropping the contiguity requirement, while necessary for accommodating mental causation, is not sufficient. Since the Treatise‘s second definition required “an impression” of the cause, it too rules out mental causation. The absence of this requirement is, for Baier, “the most important missing ingredient in EHU”. Mental causation is at the very foundation of Hume’s account of the understanding, since impressions are the mental causes of the ideas that copy them. Nevertheless our consciousness of a mental cause — an “internal impression” or an “impression of reflection” — is immediate. Baier rightly emphasizes that mental causes are impressions, and it isn’t possible to have an impression of an impression: “We are conscious of our own perceptions, when they occur, and when we recall them, but they are not the sort of thing of which we could have sense impressions” (259). Noticing this change in Hume’s second definition and appreciating its significance is an important discovery on Baier’s part. It is perhaps the most substantial philosophical contribution she makes in this volume, all the more remarkable because it has for so long been hidden in plain sight.

Mental causation, Baier believes, was the focus of Hume’s worries in the Appendix (234). While accommodating mental causation is a significant step toward resolving Hume’s Appendix problems with personal identity, however, it doesn’t take us all the way there. We must also look at the changes Hume made in his account of belief formation, where the central change is his abandonment of what Baier calls the “theory of vivacity transmission”. These changes are not, Baier maintains, “independent of his changes to the second definition of cause” (222).

In the Treatise, an idea becomes a belief by having its level of vivacity raised almost to that of an impression, as in causal inference, where an associated impression transmits some of its vivacity to the idea. The Treatise‘s second definition of cause incorporates the essence of the theory of vivacity transmission in its specification that the impression of the cause “determines the mind” to “form a more lively idea” of its effect. In the EHU definitions, the theory of vivacity transmission disappears; we have only the claim that the “appearance” of the cause “always conveys the thought” to its effect. While this weaker statement doesn’t explicitly rule out vivacity transmission, it doesn’t explicitly require it, either.

At times Baier seems ambivalent as to whether all the machinery of the theory of vivacity transmission has been completely dropped in EHU. Be that as it may, however, she is unequivocal in her conviction that Hume needs it: “he must keep this key concept” of “causally efficacious mental vivacity” (195). She thinks that “Hume somehow failed to realize that the theory could have done more for him than he seems to realize” (146). That “neglect of his own theory of what enlivens ideas was sufficient cause for his Appendix dissatisfaction” (160).

Even though she is a staunch supporter of the theory of mental vivacity, she thinks it needs to be modified. It must be broadened to include not just impressions, but any “functional equivalent” of an impression. Then “anything that conveys ‘present reality’”, anything “that brings conviction of [its] own occurrence”, “should count as an impression” (142). The theory, so broadened, would not only include memories, but it would also permit “presentations” and “appearances” of impressions, when impressions are causes, to "serve as vivacity-equivalents of impressions of causes" (218). Then Hume’s original “official definition of belief could still work for belief in the causes of our sense impressions” (218).

Baier is insistent that the theory of vivacity transmission is not only necessary for resolving Hume’s Appendix worries about personal identity, it is also required in general for his account of the understanding. So

although he did indeed have good reason to change his definitions of cause, and modify the account of belief if his causal claims about the mind’s belief-forming habits were to bear their own survey, he did not, I think, have good reason to give up altogether on his “extraordinary” and extraordinarily systematic causal claims about what enlivens ideas and produces beliefs and intentions. (228)

Given the EHU changes in his definitions of cause, which he did make, and the related changes in his account of belief, which Baier thinks he should have made but didn’t, Hume could have included a revised version of his Treatise theory of vivacity transmission, which EHU doesn’t explicitly include but also doesn’t rule out. With these changes, Hume

could also have returned to his Appendix difficulties about the causal relations within the series of perceptions making up a person-history. These difficulties should no longer have been too hard for him. He did not do this. (222)

Whatever Hume himself might have thought about “these difficulties”, they are apparently not too hard for Baier, who sets out to resolve them for him.

We begin with her proposed reconstruction of Hume’s account of personal identity, and then turn to the question of how successful a response it is to Hume’s worries in the Appendix.

Baier’s first item of business is to explain how her reconstruction explains our belief in personal identity. Even if, as Hume thought, that belief is, strictly speaking, false and is thus a “fiction”, it is nonetheless a belief, so Hume owes us some account of how we can come to believe it. Since it is a belief, “it must have vivacity, and must, by the account of belief, derive its vivacity from something else that has it” (191).

We can account for this belief, according to Baier, with the revised theory of vivacity transmission. Her revised theory no longer demands that mental causes in one’s own case, including the feeling of necessity in any causal inference, require an impression, even a memory-impression, for us to be aware of them. On the revised theory, the causal links among the various perceptions that make up a person-history exhibit “causally efficacious vivacity transmission”, as well as transmitting content. Baier adds:

Then one can proceed to look at these causal vivacity dependencies within the series of one’s own past and present perceptions, see how beliefs sometimes but not always involve impressions as the source of their inherited vivacity, [and] reassure oneself of the efficacy of the experience of constant conjunctions in past impressions to cause a vivacious feeling of necessity in any causal inference. (204)

Exactly how does Baier’s reconstruction respond to Hume’s own statement of his worries about personal identity in the Appendix? This is less clear.

In the Appendix, Hume’s concerns involve “two principles, which I cannot render consistent, viz. that all our distinct perceptions are distinct existences, and that the mind never perceives any real connexion among distinct existences” (T 636). The principal difficulty with understanding Hume’s problem is that his two “principles” are obviously consistent. Many readers have therefore assumed that he meant to say that they are inconsistent with some third principle. Baier’s tack, while original, is a version of this general approach. “Hume”, she maintains, “needed to find real connections between the perceptions in a mental history” (167). “To get a contradiction, we need to add ‘We have reason to believe there are real connections between the successive perceptions in a person’s life’” (148). And “surely”, she maintains, these connections “are really there” (167).

Baier resolves the inconsistency her third principle introduces by rejecting Hume’s second principle. Then she wonders whether her appeal to “real connections” doesn’t raise a question of its compatibility with Hume’s first principle:

Can Hume reconcile his claim that the perceptions in the bundle of the person are distinct existences, with believing that they, at least sometimes, derive or inherit their vivacity from earlier perceptions in the bundle? Do such “real connections” threaten their distinctness? I think they do, although some degree of independence may be combined with vivacity dependence. (171)

She answers this question by qualifying Hume’s first principle. For Baier, vivacity transmission, especially when an impression causes its copy-idea, prevents the perceptions from being genuinely distinct, although she believes they still somehow retain some unspecified degree of independence.

When Baier, speaking on Hume’s behalf, says the connections are “really there”, the “real connections” she is talking about are simply causal connections. Even if Hume dropped the theory of vivacity transmission in EHU, in the Treatise vivacity transmission was part and parcel of his account of causal inference. Neither the connection produced by the associative tie between cause and effect, nor the transmission of vivacity from cause to effect should threaten their “distinctness”, since we can clearly conceive of the cause occurring and the effect not occurring. That should be true for Hume at least, but apparently not for Baier, who valiantly but unsuccessfully, in our opinion, makes a concerted attempt to maintain that the causal tie is actually stronger than Hume realized. Her case for this claim goes well beyond anything than can be regarded as a sympathetic reconstruction.

Irrespective of what one thinks of Baier’s case for her reconstruction, however, there is a more fundamental difficulty with treating the “real connections” Hume mentions as causal connections as he understands them. When Hume uses similar language elsewhere, he is generally referring to the stronger connections other philosophers claim to have found in causal relations, objects, or selves, and which he repeatedly argues are incoherent or unintelligible. That he has this strong sense of “real connection” in mind when he states his second “principle” is evident in the sentence that immediately follows his statement: “Did our perceptions either inhere in something simple and individual, or did the mind perceive some real connexion among them, there would be no difficulty in the case” (T 636). Hume’s language is intended to direct us back to the section on personal identity, where he asks whether identity is

something that really binds our several perceptions together, or only associates their ideas in the imagination. That is, in other words, whether in pronouncing concerning the identity of a person, we observe some real bond among his perceptions, or only feel one among the ideas we form of them. (T 259)

It is clear that Hume’s view of causation commits him to the latter view in both cases, and that the former, stronger view is the one he rejects in “Of personal identity” (T 1.4.6) and references in the Appendix. Identifying Humean causation with “real connection” in this sense, therefore, can’t be the solution to Hume’s perplexity in the Appendix.

Baier offers another source of Hume’s worries about personal identity in the Appendix, and provides yet another reason for the centrality of Hume’s theory of vivacity transmission. It is also related to the title of this collection. Baier writes, “I suggest that part of Hume’s concern with his account of personal identity, as dependent on relations within a series of distinct perceptions, lay in its inadequate account of death” (vii). To be more precise: “Immortality threatens Humean persons if their perceptions’ vivacity and its brain-enabled transfers are left out of the picture, as they are in ‘Of Personal Identity’ and the Appendix” (162).

In the Appendix, Hume describes death as “nothing but an extinction of all particular perceptions” (T 635). Baier maintains that since Hume believes that it is in the nature of perceptions to be “perishing existences”, “he is wrong about the implications of his own theory” (162). As long as the “content-tied vivacity” of perceptions “is passed on, their individual perishing does not entail the death of the perceiver … particular perceptions are constantly being extinguished, but as long as their content-tied vivacity is preserved, annihilation of the person is postponed” (162).

Baier argues that

unless the vivacity of past perceptions, and their causal powers, are taken to be somehow preserved in dreamless sleep, then death cannot be distinguished from sleep, and so cannot be assumed to be “annihilation” and the prospect of an awakening should haunt the philosopher on his deathbed. (162-163)

Therefore, death should be construed as mental vivacity’s “total loss, not just its being left in storage” (162).

Baier is right to say that mental vivacity must be totally lost in death, but in fact Hume’s original characterization covers this case. If our mental vivacity can’t be passed on to others, then the only way vivacity can be transmitted is by its being passed on to my later perceptions.

My dreamless sleep doesn’t count as my death because it is at best the extinction of all my perceptions in a particular given point in my personal history, and that means that it isn’t the total extinction of my perceptions, once and for all. When there is a total extinction of my perceptions in this latter sense, I’m dead, and so is the possibility of vivacity-transfer of any of the vivacity of any of my former perceptions.

Baier has been misled by what is in fact an ambiguity in “extinction of all particular perceptions”. Read Hume’s way, which is the most natural way to understand this phrase, there’s nothing wrong with his account of death. That makes it highly unlikely, in our opinion, that it was one of Hume’s concerns in the Appendix.


Baier ends her collection with an interesting, full-length discussion of Hume’s short autobiographical piece, “My Own Life”, which he wrote four months before his death. She says that she is the first to connect Hume’s original discussion of personal identity in the Treatise with “his last version of his own mental life”. She maintains that although Hume earlier had difficulties in accounting for why people persist through time, in his last work he had no such difficulties in “claiming the life of his mind, as his own”, and in making connections between the earlier and the latter parts of his life. Following his practice in the History of England, Hume ends his narrative with a paragraph on his own “death and character”.

Hume begins by announcing that having spent most of his life “in literary pursuits and occupations” he will focus on his writings. Since he also intended to have “My Own Life” included in future editions of his collected works, concentrating on his intellectual endeavors is appropriate. Baier suggests that we should read his autobiography as a kind of curriculum vitae. If we look at it in this way — as a selective narrative for posterity — the things Hume included, and, more importantly, the things he excluded in his account of his life make much more sense. After all, who would include their academic failures or love affairs in their c.v.? Hume wanted above all to be remembered as a great writer and included material relevant to that end. Moreover, the narrative Hume offers connects his earlier interests and ambitions with his later ones. As a young person, he wanted to become a great writer and the last thing he wrote, Baier says, had that end in view. He was, she concludes, “true to the very end”.

One sub-theme that runs through several of the essays, especially those in Part I, concerns how not only character but also age influences an agent’s deliberations and decisions. Baier reminds us of Hume’s remark that we don’t expect self-command from younger people, and suggests that as we age, “old passions sometimes get tempered, old frenzies calmed” (15). She thinks that as Hume aged, his hostility to religion may well have been tempered. She reports that when an evangelical woman — the wife of a candle maker — tried to convert Hume, he was kind to her and bought a bunch of candles. The idea that passions may be tempered or calmed is evident, Baier maintains, in Hume’s account of Cromwell’s refusal of the crown and his assessment of Tunstal. Baier also believes that as we grow older, we become more reluctant to make “new departures”, provided things are going reasonably well for us. In a parting shot at the belief/desire theorist, she says that to explain this tendency by claiming that we have a “desire to keep things as they are” is to debase the meaning of desire.

Bair’s ruminations on age aren’t the only byway she takes in the course of these reflections. In following associative paths wherever they may lead her, Baier effectively constructs her own private labyrinth, even as she stalks the minotaur in Hume’s. While her meanderings can be exasperating to those who prefer linear arguments and expect roadmaps, these sidetracks are always worth pursuing, not only for their further perspectives on her subject, but also for the insight they provide into the sparkling intelligence of one of Hume’s most perceptive readers ever.