2009.07.17

Sydney Shoemaker

Physical Realization

Sydney Shoemaker, Physical Realization, Oxford UP, 2007, 151pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199214396.

Reviewed by Brian P. McLaughlin, Rutgers University


 

This is an admirably ambitious book. Sydney Shoemaker attempts to provide a comprehensive metaphysics -- a rare aim in the analytical tradition. The book draws on work of his spanning a period of nineteen years, but is by no means a rehash of views he has previously expressed in print. His views have evolved, in some cases even from those expressed in fairly recent papers; they are, moreover, systematically developed and integrated in ways that go beyond his previous work. Some new topics are also addressed in this book. Shoemaker tells us:

The purpose of this work is to give an account of property realization and microrealization and the relationship between them, and to discuss their bearing on a number of central topics in metaphysics and the philosophy of mind. These topics include mental causation, personal identity, material constitution, emergence, and the phenomenal character of sensory states. (p.4)

Further topics discussed include, among others: physicalism, functional properties, disjunctive properties, the problem of the many, and the perdurance/endurance debate. The book is must reading for anyone who works in analytical metaphysics or the metaphysics of mind.

The book is also hard. The writing is extremely compressed. The topics mentioned above, as well as others, are covered in just 144 pages of text. Little time is spent on intuitive motivation, examples, or responding to anticipated objections. Also the book contains a number of Shoemaker's own technical terms. Nevertheless, although it is a hard read, the book is well worth the effort. Dense with philosophically rich material, this book is sure to inspire a secondary literature.

The book has six chapters. Each can be read in a single sitting. In chapter one, Shoemaker introduces some of the central ideas in the book and provides a glimpse of the subsequent chapters. In chapter two, he presents his own, original account of what it is for the instantiation of one property to be realized in the instantiation of another, and argues that his view of how the mental is physically realized vindicates our belief in the causal efficacy of the mental. In chapter three, he presents his account of what it is for a property instantiation to be realized by a microphysical state of affairs. In chapter four, he argues that there are no functional properties (in any sense that would contrast with other sorts of properties); rather, what is the case is that certain concepts are functional concepts. Further, he makes a case that emergent properties, in a sense of emergence similar to C. D. Broad's, are compatible with physicalism. Finally, he addresses the circumstance in which a disjunction of properties is itself a property. In chapter five, he, among other things, defends the view that some objects materially constitute other objects, defends endurantism (three dimensionalism) over perdurantism (four dimensionalism), and addresses the question of what it is for the members of a set of micro-entities to make up a macroscopic object. Finally, in chapter six, he addresses certain issues concerning the physical realization of qualia.

The book also contains a short, yet illuminating appendix on Shoemaker's well known causal theory of properties (CTP) -- the theory that properties have their causal profiles essentially. Shoemaker tells us:

The causal profile of a property consists in two sorts of causal features -- forward-looking causal features, having to do with how the instantiation of the property contributes to producing various sorts of effects … and backward-looking causal features, having to do with what … can cause the instantiation of the property (p.12).[1]

Although he continues to embrace CTP, Shoemaker says that he does not presuppose it in the main body of the book (p.ix; p.142). He relies in the book, he says, "only on the weaker thesis that each property is individuated by a causal profile in the sense that it and it alone has that profile in the actual world and worlds nomologically like it" (p.142). Moreover, he tells us: "Those who reject CTP -- and I take this to include most contemporary philosophers -- could consistently accept all of the central claims in this work" (p.142).

There is much that I find attractive in the book. I am in sympathy with Shoemaker's view that there are no functional properties (in any sense that would contrast with other sorts of properties); rather, it is the case that certain concepts are functional concepts (pp.56-67). Moreover, unless the 'physical' in 'physicalism' is tied very closely to received views in current physics, I think that Shoemaker succeeds in making the case that causal power-endowing emergent microstructural properties (emergent in a sense similar to C. D. Broad's sense) are compatible with physicalism (pp.71-79). Further, I think that his distinction between "thick properties" (properties that can be possessed only by things that have a certain sortal property) and "thin properties" (properties such that there is no specific sortal property that their bearers must have) is a useful one (chapter five). Lastly, I think that his discussion of W. E. Johnson's notion of immanent causation (causation among successive internal microstates of a persisting object) is insightful, and will be of use to those who, unlike myself, wish to defend endurantism (pp.39-42; and pp.97-113). (I should note, though, that Shoemaker's defense of the endurantism is inconclusive. He makes a case for it mainly by making a case against perdurantism. His case relies on the assumption that perdurantism stands or falls with David Lewis's[2] solution to the problem of temporal intrinsics (pp.97-100). In fact, it does not so stand or fall. Let it suffice to note that in the most extensive defense of perdurantism to date, Ted Sider[3] does not rely on Lewis's solution to the problem of temporary intrinsics.[4])

Although there is much in the book that I find attractive and of value, in this review I will focus on some unresolved issues and some internal tensions in Shoemaker's metaphysics of mind and in his discussion of realization, the core notion of the book.[5]

1. The Too Many Minds Problem

Shoemaker maintains that human persons are neither identical with coincident human bodies nor identical with coincident human animals (see pp.88-96). He holds that it is rather the case that a human body coincident with a human animal materially constitutes that human animal; that a human animal coincident with a person materially constitutes the person; and, so, that a human body coincident with a person materially constitutes the person as well. There fails to be identity in any of these cases, Shoemaker tells us, because human bodies, human animals, and human persons have different persistence conditions, and so differ in some of their modal properties. Shoemaker appeals to a familiar neo-Lockean thought-experiment, in which a person's cerebrum is removed from his skull and kept intact, to make the case that human persons are not human bodies or even human animals. He maintains that persons fail to be identical with coincident human bodies or human animals since the persistence conditions for persons involve psychological continuity, and the persistence conditions for human bodies and human animals do not. Human animals have biological persistence conditions.

Shoemaker acknowledges that his view seems to face what he calls "the too many minds problem" (p.91).[6] If a human body, the human animal that it constitutes, and the human person it constitutes are all numerically distinct, then are there three subjects of mental states, where we ordinarily think there is only one? His answer is no: only the person has mental states. In his discussion of the problem, he tends to focus on persons and their bodies, rather than on persons and human animals. Even if, however, human bodies lack mental properties, the question remains whether human animals have them. Moreover, if there are any mental properties that human animals (biologically individuated) can have, then Shoemaker faces a too many minds problem. In his discussion of the many minds problem, Shoemaker seems to focus on a restricted class of mental properties. He says, for instance, "the neo-Lockean denies that the body and the (biologically individuated) human animal … have the psychological properties distinctive of persons" (p.89). In addition, he says: "the person will have psychological properties that the coincident body and biological animal do not have" (p.89). Let's set aside the psychological states distinctive of persons, whatever they are exactly, and focus instead on states such as feeling pain and other bodily sensations. Shoemaker claims that mental properties are thick in that their bearers must have a sortal property, and says: "the sortal property is person, or perhaps mental subject" (p.92). Dogs, of course, are not persons. Nevertheless bodily feelings (and many other sorts of mental states) are by no means exclusive to persons. Dogs feel pains, and so are in that sense mental subjects. Why, then, can't human animals (biologically individuated) feel pain, and so be mental subjects? If, however, there is a human animal that feels a pain and a numerically distinct yet coincident person that feels a pain, then Shoemaker is stuck with the too many minds problem. Suffice it to note that the too many minds problem is unresolved in the book.

2. Reductive vs. Non-Reductive Physicalism

Shoemaker remarks that properties other than mental properties are physically realized, and so "the notion of physical realization will have application whether or not physicalism is true" (p.9). He goes on to note:

Nevertheless, much of this work will be concerned with the physical realization of mental properties, and this does require the truth of physicalism. I will not undertake to establish the truth of physicalism, or to defend it against standard objections; my concern will be with what must be true of mental properties and their instances if physicalism is true (p.9).

As we will see, however, there are tensions in what Shoemaker says about what must be true of mental properties and their instances if physicalism is true.

Shoemaker tells us:

The notion of realization figures prominently in recent discussions of physicalism. Most frequently it figures in discussions of "multiple realization," and the use of this idea to support the version of physicalism (or materialism) known as non-reductive physicalism -- it was the acceptance of this idea that the same mental property can be realized in different ways that led to the widespread rejection of the psychophysical identity thesis. But it is arguable that this notion provides the most revealing characterization of physicalism itself: physicalism, we can say, is the view that all states and properties of things, of whatever kind, are physical or physically realized. (p.1)

He holds that mental properties are multiply realizable by physical properties. (Indeed he holds that "all properties that figure in our ordinary talk and thought are multiply [physically] realizable" (p.84). Although he does not explicitly say this, I think that he holds as well that the properties posited by the special sciences are multiply realizable by the properties posited by microphysics.) Furthermore, he appears in places to accept what he calls "the core 'multiple realizability argument' against type physicalism" (p.11). He seems take himself to be weakening the reductive physicalist thesis that all states and properties of things are physical to the non-reductive physicalist thesis that all states and properties of things are physical or physically realized.

Shoemaker also says other things, however, that indicate that he thinks mental properties are identical with physical properties. He takes his account of realization (to be discussed in Section 3 below) to be a version of a higher-order property account (see p.14). He tells us:

a multiply realized property can be thought of as a higher-order property, which something has just in case it has some lower order property satisfying a certain condition, it can equally be thought of as a disjunctive property, the disjuncts being all the properties satisfying that condition. (p.79)

He also says: "If there is a set of all the possible realizers of a second-order property, the second-order property will be necessarily coextensive with the disjunction of the members of the set, and arguably will be identical with it." (p.17)

Further, he says: "multiply realizable properties are necessarily co-extensive with disjunctions of their possible realizers, and arguably identical with them" (p.55-6). Shoemaker seems to hold that, given that no two properties are necessarily co-extensive, mental properties are identical with the physical properties that are disjunctions of their physical realizers. (It should be noted here that although Shoemaker does not think that all disjunctions of properties are properties, he thinks that the disjunction of physical realizers of a mental property are properties (see pp.79-87).) Thus, it seems that Shoemaker embraces type physicalism after all. He holds that every mental property is identical with a physical property. Although he nowhere discusses the matter, his brand of physicalism is, by his own lights, equivalent to the thesis that all states and properties of things are physical. His disagreement with traditional type identity theory is merely over the sorts of physical properties with which mental properties are identical. The sorts of physical properties that traditional identity theory maintains are mental properties are typically just (at best) disjuncts of physical properties that are mental properties.

In any case, for better or worse depending on one's point of view, even given that no two properties are necessarily co-extensive, Shoemaker's actual account of physical realization does not support the claim that mental properties are identical with the disjunctions of their physical realizers. This will become apparent in Section 3.

3. Realization

Like terms such as 'supervenience' and 'haecceities', and unlike terms such as 'causation', 'realization' is a philosophical term of art. Those who use the term incur the obligation to say what they mean by it. Shoemaker readily acknowledges that and discharges the obligation in question (p.2, p.29). His definition should be understood as stipulative and should be judged by its theoretical fruits. As is no doubt clear, Shoemaker thinks the fruits of his definition are many and varied, and in some cases low hanging. There are, however, various tensions in what he says about realization and how he actually defines it. Moreover, his notion of realization will not do all of the work that he intends it to do.

Shoemaker tells us: "realized properties as well as their realizers will have causal profiles, and realization consists in there being a certain kind of relation between the causal profile of the realized property and the causal profile of the realizer" (p.12). He stipulates:

As a first approximation, property P has property Q as a realizer just in case (1) the forward-looking causal features of property P are a subset of the forward-looking causal features of property Q, and (2) the backward-looking causal features of P have as a subset the backward-looking features of Q. In a particular case an instantiation of P is realized by an instantiation of property Q just in case P and Q are instantiated in the same thing and Q is a realizer of P. Call this the "subset account." (p.12)

Here he writes of P and Q being instantiated in the same thing (at the same time). He later calls this "realization1" (p.29). He says: "We can use this to define a different kind of property-realization, call it realization2, in which the instantiation of a property in one thing can realize the instantiation of another property in a numerically different thing" (p.29). He tells us: "There is need for the relation of realization2 if, and probably only if, there can be coincident entities, and properties in one of a pair of coincident entities can be said to realize properties of the other" (p.29). Since what I say below about realization will hold both for realization1 and realization2, I will speak simply of realization. Shoemaker calls the above characterization "a first approximation". Before discussing why, I want to note some points about the above account of realization that are unaffected by the refinement he adds later.

Shoemaker tells us: "the realizer of a property instantiation should be metaphysically sufficient for the occurrence of that property instantiation"; and he says that: "on … the subset account … the instantiation of a realizer is sufficient for the instantiation of the property realized" (pp.6, 14; see also p.15, p.21, p.32, and p.35). Given Shoemaker's definition of realization, however, it is patently not the case that if Q realizes P, then an instance of Q will be metaphysically sufficient for an instance of P. Indeed it may fail even to be in fact the case that whenever Q is instantiated, P is. P is instantiated only if there is something that has a property with the backward-looking causal features of P. If P is realized by Q, it does not follow that whenever Q is instantiated, a property with the backward-looking causal features of P will be. The reason is that realization requires only that the backward-looking causal features of Q be a subset of the backward-looking causal features of P. The backward-looking causal features of Q may be a proper subset of the backward-looking causal features of P; indeed Shoemaker thinks that when Q is only one among other realizers of P, then the backward-looking causal features of Q will be such a proper subset of the backward-looking causal features of P. Then, however, the fact that something has Q will not metaphysically necessitate that it (or that something it constitutes if we allow for realization2) has a property with all of the backward-looking causal features of P. Thus, it is not the case that if Q realizes P, then an instance of Q metaphysically suffices for an instance of P; indeed the definition leaves open whether instances of Q are accompanied by instances of P. (Notice, then, that the disjunction of realizers of P will not be identical with P, for a disjunct could be instantiated, and so the disjunction thereby instantiated, and yet P not be.)

As I noted, although Shoemaker does not assume CTP in the book, he assumes that "each property is individuated by a causal profile in the sense that it and it alone has that profile in the actual world and worlds nomologically like it" (p.42). Suppose, then, that he makes a stronger assumption, yet one that still does not imply CTP. Suppose he assumes that in the actual world and worlds nomologically like it, each property P is such that something has it if and only if it has some property with P's forward-looking causal features. On this assumption, if Q realizes P, then instantiations of Q will nomologically necessitate instantiations of P. Unfortunately, however, unless CTP is true, it still won't be the case that instantiations of Q metaphysically necessitate instantiations of P, for if CTP is false, then there will be possible worlds in which Q is instantiated unaccompanied by an instantiation of P.

In the introduction to the book (the issue isn't discussed elsewhere), Shoemaker acknowledges that if CTP is false, there may be such a world. Nevertheless he tells us there:

we can get around this by including in the realizer the obtaining of a set of causal laws -- normally the laws that obtain in the actual world. When the instantiation of property P is said to realize the instantiation of property Q, the full realizer is the occurrence of P together with the obtaining of the laws that give P the profile it has in the world in question. On a causal theory of properties this addition is unnecessary, for on that view the laws are internal to the property. (p.6)

Suppose CTP is false. Then, we can hold, says Shoemaker, that included in the total realizer of a property P are the obtaining of the causal laws that determine P's causal profile. Label the conjunction of the laws in question, L. Although Q can realize P without instances of Q metaphysically necessitating instances of P, the total realizer of P will be being Q and such that L. Further, the instantiation of the property of Q and being such that L will metaphysically necessitate an instance of P. (Although Shoemaker does not say in the book what he takes laws of nature to be, he may take them to be singular relations among properties.) The total realizer is thus a conjunctive property that includes certain causal laws as conjuncts. This proposal faces a problem. Presumably, a total realizer is a realizer. To be a realizer, however, a property has to have a causal profile. How could being Q and such that L have a causal profile? Causal laws themselves (even if they are singular relations among properties) are never causes or effects. If, however, the conjunctive property in question does not have a causal profile, then it fails to realize any property given Shoemaker's definition of property realization. I won't pursue this since I take it that this is an uncharitable reading of Shoemaker. Presumably, what Shoemaker has in mind in his discussion of total realizers is not conjunctive properties that include causal laws as conjuncts, but rather just this: it is metaphysically necessary that given the laws that determine P's causal profile, if Q realizes P, then whatever has Q has (or constitutes something that has)[7] P.

If, however, that is what he has in mind, then the thesis that all properties are physical properties or realized by physical properties is too weak to count as physicalism. On this reading, that thesis is compatible with what is perhaps the currently leading non-physicalist view. The view in question is that although every object is or is wholly constituted by physical objects, qualia are epiphenomena that are related to instances of physical properties as effects by fundamental causal laws. (Analytical functionalists would maintain that it is a priori that qualia are not epiphenomena. Shoemaker, however, is not an analytical functionalist. He seems to maintain only on empirical grounds that qualia are causes.) On this view, every quale is such that it has the null set of forward-looking causal features; different qualia, however, will have different sets of backward-looking causal features. Suppose, then, that for every quale Qu, there is at least one physical property P* such that it is a fundamental (yet metaphysically contingent) causal law that whatever has P* has Qu.[8] Then, P* will realize (perhaps realize2) Qu. The set of forward-looking causal features of Qu will be a subset of the forward-looking causal features of P* since the null set is a subset of every set; and the backward-looking causal features of P* will be a subset of the backward-looking causal features of Qu since P* causally suffices for Qu. Moreover, it will be metaphysically necessary that given the laws that determine Qu's causal profile, whatever has P* has Qu since one of the laws that determines Qu's causal profile is the causal law that whatever has P* has Qu. Thus, the "total" realizer metaphysically suffices for an instantiation of Qu. If the view in question is correct, however, then physicalism is false. Thus, on the reading in question, the thesis that all properties are physical properties or realized by physical properties is too weak to count as physicalism.

The problem isn't that on the non-physicalist view in question qualia are epiphenomena. Suppose the view is modified as follows: the claim that qualia are epiphenomena is dropped, and it is maintained instead that they are overdetermining causes of the effects that folk psychology attributes to them -- overdetermining causes since all of those effects also have sufficient physical causes. This revised view is still a non-physicalist view. It is, however, compatible with every quale being realized by a physical property in Shoemaker's sense. Thus, on the reading at issue, even allowing that qualia have forward-looking causal features, the thesis that all properties are physical properties or realized by physical properties would still be too weak to count as physicalism. Nor is the problem that we are assuming that CTP is false. Suppose that CTP is true, and so that all properties have their causal profiles essentially. In the scenario above, the causal law that whatever has P* has Qu would then be metaphysically necessary. It would be, however, a fundamental psychophysical causal law. Physicalism is incompatible with there being fundamental psychophysical causal laws.

Now it is quite clear that Shoemaker would deny that the realization relation is a causal relation. In the introduction to the book, he tells us: "In general, x realizes y just in case the existence of x is constitutively sufficient for the existence of y -- just in case y's existence is 'nothing over and above' x's existence" (p.4). He also says there: "the relation between a realizer and what it realizes is a constitutive relation -- the having of the realized property consists in the having of whatever properties realized it on that occasion" (p.2). That sounds like a notion of realization that may well be useful for formulating physicalism. The problem, however, is that given Shoemaker's actual definition of realization, the claim that property Q realizes property P is compatible with instances of Q being causes of instances of P, rather than constituting instances of P. Here again, then, there is a tension between his actual definition of realization and what he says about realization. I should mention that as Shoemaker no doubt recognizes, it would not do to for him to define property realization as property constitution. First of all, rather than doing that he could simply appeal to property constitution, and drop talk of property realization. Secondly, many philosophers who claim to understand object constitution claim not to understand property constitution. The notion of property constitution cries out for explication. Property constitution seems to be something Shoemaker intends to explicate with his notion of property realization, rather than something to which he wants to appeal in his definition of property realization. Shoemaker seems to assume that his subset account of property realization yields an account of property constitution. But as it stands, it doesn't. One reason is that it is compatible with his definition that Q realizes P and instances of Q cause instances of P.

Of course, for all that I have said, there may be a notion of property constitution such that the thesis that every property is a physical property or is constituted by a physical property counts as physicalism. I am neutral here on that issue. The relevant question here is whether Shoemaker has provided us with the conceptual resources to define such a notion of property constitution.[9] I, for one, cannot see that he has, but needless to say, I don't see a lot of things.

Now Shoemaker, you will recall, calls the definition of realization cited earlier "a first approximation." He says:

The reason why this is only a first approximation is that as worded it makes any conjunctive property a realizer of each of its conjuncts -- for the forward looking causal features of each conjunct will be a subset of the forward looking causal features of the conjunction, and the backward looking causal features of each conjunct will have as a subset the backward-looking causal features of the conjunction. Obviously this must be avoided. (p.13)

Similarly, he says elsewhere: "Clearly, if we are to define realization in terms of the subset relation, we need to impose some restriction that rules out some conjunctive properties as realizers of their conjuncts" (p.24).

Notice that in the above quote, he says: "we need to impose some restriction that rules out some conjunctive properties as realizers of their conjuncts" (my italics). Although Shoemaker thinks that conjunctive properties always realize their conjuncts on the "first approximation" definition of realization, and he wants to avoid that result, he does not revise the definition by stipulating that Q not be a conjunctive property that contains P as a conjunct. The reason is that he wants to allow certain cases of a conjunctive property realizing one of its conjunct. He says:

I think … that a conjunctive property counts as a realizer of one of its conjuncts only when there is … an asymmetrical relation between the conjuncts, one of them being such that its instantiation narrows the way determinable powers bestowed by the other (the one that is realized) can be exercised. This of course rules out that both conjuncts of a conjunctive property could be realized by the conjunctive property (p.28).

Although Shoemaker never explicitly revises the definition of realization to allow realization in such cases, presumably the first approximation is to be revised by adding the following condition: (3) if Q is a conjunctive property that contains P as a conjunct, then the other conjunct (perhaps itself a conjunction) narrows the way determinable powers bestowed by P can be exercised.

Shoemaker appeals to only one example to motivate the addition of condition (3). The example is highly controversial, and it is presented in the midst of a discussion of a different issue, namely whether it can ever be the case that a determinable property is a conjunction of one of its determinates and another property. (That is something typically denied in the literature on determinables and determinates and something that Shoemaker notes he too used to deny (p.26)). He says:

Consider again the properties of being red and scarlet. Red might be the property that something has just in case it is such that it absorbs all light except in the range 400nm-500nm, and reflects some light in that range, and scarlet might be the property that something has just in case it absorbs all light except in the range 400nm-500nm, and reflects some light in that range, and also absorbs all light in the range 440nm-500nm. In that case scarlet would be the conjunction of red and some other property, namely the property such that it absorbs all light in the range 440-nm-500nm (p.26).

He wants to allow that some conjunctive properties realize one of their conjuncts since he wants it to be the case, for instance, that scarlet, a determinate of red, realizes red; he thinks that scarlet and red might well be the light-affecting properties in question. There is, I believe, sufficient reason to deny that red and scarlet are the light-effecting properties in question. Nevertheless I will pass by that issue and instead focus on an internal tension in Shoemaker's discussion. It will no doubt already have occurred to the alert reader that allowing that a conjunctive property can realize one of its conjuncts conflicts with what Shoemaker says about realization and constitution. Suppose that conjunctive properties realize one of their conjuncts when one of them is "such that its instantiation narrows the way determinable powers bestowed by the other (the one that is realized) can be exercised" (p.28). Then, property realization is not property constitution; for even in such cases, the having of the conjunctive property does not constitute the having of either of its conjunct properties. Of course, it seems right to say that something's being red can consist in its being scarlet. But suppose that red and scarlet were the light-effecting properties that Shoemaker describes. Then, something's being red would never consist in its being scarlet. The reason is that something's being such that it absorbs all light except in the range 400nm-500nm and reflects some light in that range never consists in its being such that it absorbs all light except in the range 400nm-500nm and reflects some light in that range, and also absorbs all light in the range 440nm-500nm.

Shoemaker gives no reason for thinking that the forward-looking causal features of a conjunctive property include as subsets the forward-looking causal features of their conjuncts. He seems to take that as too obvious to require defense. If, however, total realizers are conjunctive properties that include causal laws are conjuncts, then a conjunctive property can fail to have a causal profile even when one of its conjuncts does. I won't rely on that point, however, since, as I said earlier, that seems an uncharitable reading of Shoemaker's remarks about total realizers. In any case, such matters aside, it is not in general true that the forward-looking causal features of a conjunctive property include as subsets the forward-looking causal features of their conjuncts. Shoemaker tells us, you will recall, that the forward-looking causal features of a property have "to do with how the instantiation of the property contributes to producing various sorts of effects" (p.12). The forward-looking causal features of a property are the ways in which the instantiation of the property contributes to producing various sorts of effects. In Shoemaker's framework each is a matter of what the instantiation of the property in (appropriate) combination with the instantiation of other properties will cause. Consider, then, a property R and a conjunctive property R&S. It can happen that there is a way in which R contributes to producing a certain kind of effect that is not a way in which R&S contributes to producing that effect. That will happen whenever something's having R will contribute to causing a certain type of effect E in a certain way W only if the something in question lacks S. The property of being a match that is being struck is a conjunct of the conjunctive property being a match that is being struck and that is wet. There are of course ways in which match strikings will result in match lightings that require that the match be dry, and so not wet. Thus, the property of being a match that is being struck has some forward-looking causal features that the conjunctive property being a match that is being struck and that is wet lacks. So, the forward-looking causal features of being a match that is being struck are not a subset of those of being a match that is being struck and that is wet. It follows that the conjunctive property in question fails to realize the conjunct in question on the "first approximation" definition of realization. The "first approximation" definition thus does not have the consequence that all conjunctive properties realize their conjuncts.

Consider, again, the idea of revising the "first approximation" by adding (3) -- if Q is a conjunctive property that contains P as a conjunct, then the other conjunct (perhaps itself a conjunction) narrows the way determinable powers bestowed by P can be exercised. If the definition is revised to include this condition, then there will be a serious problem indeed. The problem is this: when (3) is satisfied, (2) will fail to be. The reason is that when (3) is satisfied, it will not be the case that the forward-looking causal features of P are a subset of the conjunctive property in question that includes P as a conjunct; hence (2) will fail to be satisfied. To see this, suppose the conjunctive property is P&R, and that (3) is satisfied since the possession of R narrows the way determinable powers bestowed by P can be exercised. Then, it follows that there are determinate powers that P bestows on some of its possessors that it does not bestow on those of its possessors that have R. As concerns powers, Shoemaker tells us: "corresponding to every forward-looking causal feature of a property is a conditional power that the property bestows on its possessors" (p.24). A thing has a conditional power if it is the case that were it to have certain properties in addition to the property with the forward-looking causal feature in question, namely properties the instantiation of which in combination with the instantiation of that property will produce some type of effect E, then the thing will have the power simplicitier to produce E (p.24). Powers simplicitier, he tells us, are a special case of conditional powers (p.24). Corresponding to the determinate powers that P does not bestow on those of its bearers that have R will be forward-looking causal features of P. Those forward-looking causal features of P are not forward-looking features of P&R. Thus, the forward-looking causal features of P&R are not a subset of the forward-looking causal features of P. It follows that (2) fails to be satisfied. Thus, if (3) is satisfied, (2) will fail to be satisfied.

Given that Shoemaker aims to characterize a notion of property realization that yields property constitution, he should not allow that a conjunctive property can be a realizer of one of its conjuncts. He could rule that out by simply stipulating that Q not be a conjunctive property that contains P as a conjunct. That stipulation would not suffice to yield a notion of property realization that guarantees property constitution, but it would be a step in the right direction.

I will close the discussion of realization by noting yet one more conflict between what Shoemaker says about realization and his actual definition of realization. The conflict is independent of the issue of whether any conjunctive property ever realizes one of its conjuncts. Drawing out the tension will require me to quote him several times at length.

Shoemaker tells us (oversimplifying quite a bit):

the forward-looking causal features of the property believes that it is raining include, among countless others, one that can be roughly characterized as being such that if it is instantiated together with the desire to keep dry and the belief that umbrellas keep off rain, this results in the subject's taking an umbrella when she goes out. (p.20)

He then asks us to

Suppose that on a particular occasion the belief that it is raining, call it Br, is realized in the physical property P1. P1 is such that in combination with mental states other than Br, certain desires and other beliefs, it causes certain behaviors. (p.20)

He goes on to say:

But of course those other mental states will themselves be physically realized. Suppose that in the case just envisioned the relevant desires and other beliefs are realized in properties P2, P3, and P4. P1 will "combine" with the mental properties in question to produce the behaviour by combining with the realizers of those properties, namely P2, P3, and P4. So in the first instance the forward-looking causal feature of P1 is being such that if it is instantiated together with P2, P3, and P4 this results in the subject's taking an umbrella when she goes out. But given that P2, P3, and P4 are realizers of the mental states in question, having this causal feature will amount to having the causal feature that belongs to the belief property, Br, that P1 realizes. (p.20)

As should be clear, I don't think that Shoemaker's notion of realization, as he defines it, supports the last claim in this passage. I want now, however, to point out a different tension in what Shoemaker says about realization and his actual definition. To bring out the tension, I will quote him yet one more time at length:

Assuming that Br is multiply realizable, it will have possible realizers other than P1. Each of these will share the forward-looking mental features of P1 and Br. But they will not necessarily share the physical causal features in which these are realized. [[10]] A creature in which Br cannot be realized by P1, because P1 is not in its repertoire of possible properties, will most likely be such that P2-P4 [certain physical properties that are realizers of the other relevant beliefs and desires] are also not in its repertoire of possible properties. Its having the causal features that interest us will not consist in its being such that in combination with P2-P4 it produces certain results. For it will not be capable of combining with those properties. Its mental properties will be realized in quite different physical features, including its being such that in combination with some quite different physical properties -- call them Px, Py, and Pz -- it causes certain behaviors.

It should be clear that when mental properties M1 … Mn combine to produce certain effects, and these properties are physically realizable, it will not be the case that just any set of physical properties P1 … Pn that are, respectively, realizers of M1 … Mn will combine to produce those effects. This will happen only if P1 … Pn are jointly instantiable (p.20).

What Shoemaker says in the above passage makes sense given various notions of realization that can be found in the literature. Given how he defines realization, however, matters could not be as he says there are.

Let's see why. What Shoemaker says about the situation he depicts implies that Br could be realized by a physical property that fails to be jointly instantiable with P2-P4. In the situation as he depicts it, however, Br has the following forward-looking causal feature (among many others): Br is such that instantiations of it that occur together with instantiations of P2, P3, and P4 result in an action (behavior) of type A. No property that fails to be jointly instantiable with P2, P3, and P4 has that forward-looking causal feature. Thus, no such property will be such that the forward-looking causal features of Br are a subset of its forward-looking causal features. It follows that no such property can realize Br. Thus, given Shoemaker's definition of realization, Br cannot be realized by a physical property that fails to be jointly instantiable with P2-P4. Consider also the following. Suppose, as Shoemaker tells us, that it is the case that a creature that can be in P1 cannot also be in Px, Py, or Pz, but that Br is realizable in certain creatures by some other physical property, Pw, such that instantiations of it that occur jointly with instantiations of Px, Py, and Pz have effect A. In that situation, as Shoemaker depicts it, Br has the following forward-looking causal feature: Br is such that instantiations of it that occur jointly with instantiations of Px, Py, and Pz result in A. That, however, is a forward-looking causal feature that, by hypothesis, P1 lacks. Thus, Br has a forward-looking causal feature that P1 lacks. Given Shoemaker's definition of realization, it follows that P1 fails to realize Br. Shoemaker's notion of realization thus fails to accommodate the sort of a situation that he depicts in the passages above. Nevertheless the sort of situation in question is, as he himself notes, regarded as commonplace in the literature on realization (p.20). Suffice it to note that some revision of his notion of realization is called for to accommodate such a situation.

In conclusion, it remains to be seen whether Shoemaker's subset view of realization can be revised in such a way that it can do all of the metaphysical work that he intends realization to do.


[1] He explicitly notes that this view of properties is not intended to cover causal features themselves, which are "properties of properties", or "properties of numbers and sets" (p.12). It concerns only properties whose instantiations are causes or effects.

[2] On the Plurality of Worlds (Oxford: Blackwell, 1986, p.202).

[3] Four Dimensionalism (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2001).

[4] I owe thanks here to Dean Zimmerman for discussion.

[5] One issue I will not discuss here is whether Shoemaker has succeeded in making the case that Commander Data (of Star Trek fame) has qualia (chapter six). Shoemaker argues that Ned Block (in his "The Harder Problem of Consciousness", The Journal of Philosophy, XCIX(8):391-425) is mistaken in claiming that we have no conception of how we could ever be in a position to come reasonably to a belief on the matter one way or the other. Further, he argues that I (in my "A Naturalist-Phenomenalist Response to Block's Harder Problem", in E. Sosa and E. Villaneuva (eds.) Philosophical Issues, 13, Philosophy of Mind, 163-204) am mistaken in claiming that we could come to be in a position in which it is reasonable to deny that Data has qualia. Shoemaker maintains that Data lacks any qualia that we could possibly have, but that Data nevertheless has qualia -- "alien qualia". I think he fails to make the case that Data has qualia. Since this concerns my own work, however, I will leave discussion for another occasion.

Another problem that Shoemaker tries to tackle (pp.45-52), but which I believe he leaves unresolved, is Jaegwon Kim's exclusion problem, one of the main problems of mental causation. I won't discuss that here, however, simply for lack of space in an already very long review. Let me simply note that Shoemaker's salvo example (p.53) is irrelevant to the issue of whether he is positing an unobjectionable kind of overdetermination in the mental-physical case.

[6] Shoemaker notes that this problem is raised in E. Olson's The Human Animal -- Personal Identity Without Psychology (Oxford: Oxford University Press, 1997).

[7] I will hereafter leave out this parenthetical qualification.

[8] Let's take the causation in question to be simultaneous causation; simultaneous causation cannot be ruled out a priori.

[9] Appeals to constitution figure even more prominently in Shoemaker's discussion of what it is for a micro-physical state of affairs to realize a property instance (see chapter three). Even granting that we understand the notion of micro-entities constituting a macro-object, the notion of property constitution cries out for explication.

[10] Shoemaker writes here of causal features (certain properties of properties) being realized, and that makes no sense on his account of realization. He acknowledges this in a footnote, saying "since causal features do not themselves have causal features, this cannot be realization in accordance with the subset conception. The idea here is just that a property can have a causal feature in virtue of its realizer having a certain causal feature" (p.20). So, let's understand his talk of causal feature realization in that way. It should be noted that these remarks raise the question: when does a property have a causal feature in virtue of its realizer having that feature? Is that always the case or only sometimes the case? If only sometimes, when? Unfortunately, these question are not answered the book or even raised.