2009.07.25

Alain Badiou

Conditions

Alain Badiou, Conditions, Steven Corcoran (trans.), Continuum, 2008, 314pp., $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780826498274.

Reviewed by Nina Power, Roehampton University


 

Conditions, originally published in France in 1992, is a collection of companion essays to what remains Alain Badiou's magnum opus and the most exhaustive exposition of his philosophical system, Being and Event (which first appeared in 1988). It is possible to treat the book as a series of engaging explorations of an extraordinarily diverse range of topics -- from Mallarmé to set-theory, sophistry to psychoanalysis, Beckett to academia -- without immersing oneself in the system proper. Nevertheless it probably helps to do so. Indeed, in his preface, François Wahl, longtime associate of Badiou, explicitly stresses that Conditions should not be read without first tackling the formidable system as a whole. Even bearing this caveat in mind, however, some of the essays -- the one on Beckett and the essay entitled "Philosophy and Politics", in particular -- are as good an introduction to Badiou's main concerns as you'll find anywhere else in his not insubstantial oeuvre. Badiou has become an increasingly central name in European thought in recent years, and it is important to note that many of these pieces have already been published elsewhere. Corcoran lists these at the beginning of the book, although he neglects to mention that the essay on Beckett, "The Writing of the Generic", was also already published in a collection from 2003 entitled On Beckett, published by Clinamen. (I mention this not merely because I co-edited the collection, but because if you've already read that book as well as Manifesto for Philosophy, Infinite Thought, Theoretical Writings and other translations in Umbr(a) and Cosmos and History, you'll have already encountered many of the texts contained here.)

The essays in Conditions are based on lectures and papers of varying lengths written and presented in the years following the publication of Being and Event. Sometimes it is very clear that the texts are written with a definite audience in mind; for example, in "Philosophy and Psychoanalysis", Badiou tells the reader "I intervene among you as someone, like the Eleatic Stranger from the Sophist, neither an analyst, nor an analysand". Useful notes at the back, however, make it clear in each case who the intended recipients of the essays or talks were, so one need not get too caught up in the shifts in tone and style. The core idea that links all the essays together, however disparate their topics, is conveyed by the title of the collection. Conditions for Badiou are the four types of "truth procedure" that provide the material for philosophy, which itself produces no truths. Badiou argues, or rather, states that there are four conditions: science (in particular, mathematics), art (in particular, the poem), politics (in particular, a politics of emancipation) and love (or more precisely, "the procedure that makes the truth of the disjunction of sexuated positions" [p. 23]). This four-fold claim is laid out in a very short piece near the beginning of Conditions entitled simply "Definition of Philosophy". It is here too that Badiou makes it clear that philosophy's task is to "compossibilize" or assemble truths "on the basis of the void" (p. 24). This means that philosophy as such can generate no truths of its own, and certainly is not capable of designating a particular conception of "Truth" as the unified meaning of history or thought. (If Badiou is to be understood as a "systematic" thinker, his system lacks the drive to totalize that often accompanies such a project.) Indeed, whatever truths are generated by the four conditions (a revolution in mathematics, a political uprising in the name of equality, a poem that reconfigures the field or a love that changes the way the couple see the world), they have very little to do with meaning, and in one fell swoop Badiou waves aside all hermeneutical and phenomenological approaches to the question of truth: "I propose to call 'religion' everything that presupposes that there is a continuity between truths and the circulation of meaning" (p. 24).

Alongside those who would remain wedded to theories of meaning, Badiou also sets up another major enemy for his philosophical project, a much older figure, that of the sophist. The sophist is, however, a necessary interlocutor. There is a clear proximity of the philosopher to the sophist: "the sophist is externally (or discursively) indiscernible from the philosopher" (p. 25). The sophist and the philosopher both combine "fictions of knowledge and fictions of art", yet the philosopher is also convinced that there are truths (p.25). The periodic attempt by philosophy to rid itself of the sophist can, however, only lead to terror since this would imply that philosophy has a monopoly on "the Truth", as opposed to a kind of gathering of different truths generated by the various conditions. (Badiou also outlines a parallel figure, that of the "anti-philosopher", who maintains the category of truth but refuses rational access to it, opting instead for varieties of more or less mystical intuition -- instances include the early Wittgenstein and the late Nietzsche.) Although Badiou's system contains many classical elements, such as the figure of the sophist and the commitment to a concept of truth, his actual definition of philosophy as an empty discipline, capable only of marshalling the truths generated by other forms of activity, owes much to the revolutions in twentieth-century mathematics. It is the ability of mathematics to best account for some of the terms that have historically "belonged" to philosophy -- the void, infinity, being -- that lends Badiou his contemporary status. As he puts it: "the only way to situate ourselves within a radical desecration is to return infinity to a neutral banality, to inscribe eternity uniquely in the matheme, and to abandon conjointly historicism and finitude" (p. 99).

To abandon both "historicism" and "finitude" is perhaps Badiou's most significant contribution to an intra-disciplinary debate about philosophy's own status and concern. Not only does Badiou shun any philosophical approach or method that takes "meaning" as one of its central concerns, but he also seeks to displace the central status of human beings understood as primarily mortal creatures. (Elsewhere, in his Ethics, for example, he has written critically about how contemporary debates concerning human rights take as their starting point an image of the human being as a victim, as inherently fragile.) Historicism, too, the idea that "philosophy today is paralyzed by its relation to its own history", means for Badiou that philosophy is in danger of becoming "a museum of itself", endlessly recounting its own last days. It is in these two critiques that Conditions starts to show its slightly dated nature: the philosophy of human rights and discourses surrounding the "death" of philosophy were important strands in late twentieth-century thought. However, and perhaps partly due to Badiou's own rising influence, these tendencies have been replaced by what is, in many ways, a much more militant conception of philosophy and politics (various geopolitical events playing a significantly more important role, of course). Nevertheless, Badiou's stark and crystalline expression of the break philosophy must make with its own self-mourning is a clear and still relevant definition of what it means to think in the twenty-first century.

Indeed, much of Conditions, when not filling out Badiou's own system, is a disquisition on placement, on how to define and limit the pretensions of philosophy's reach. In this collection, the most critical essay in this regard is the first chapter, "The (Re)Turn of Philosophy Itself". It is here that Badiou proposes a "violent forgetting of the history of philosophy" (a forgetting he carries over to his readings of Mallarmé, Rimbaud and Beckett, where he gleefully disregards decades of careful scholarship in favor of his own, quite idiosyncratic, interpretations). With reference to Heidegger, although in a direct inversion, Badiou proposes to "forget the forgetting of the forgetting" and furthermore, "to state the end of the End" (p. 10). But why? Primarily because by beginning instead with decisions and axioms about what philosophy is, in the mold of Spinoza or Descartes, philosophy (according to Badiou) no longer runs the risk of becoming confused with its own history, or of suffering the fallout of being tied to the historical allegiances (think of Fichte's nationalism, or Heidegger's Nazism) that threaten to taint philosophy's relation to truths altogether. To a critical theorist, classical Marxist or anyone else who believes that social and historical conditions play a role in the construction of thought, this idea sounds not only profoundly neo-classical, but also rather dangerous. Badiou, however, is far from seeking to reassign philosophy the role of Queen of the Sciences. If anything, philosophy becomes a rather restricted discipline, incapable of producing any truths of its own and vulnerable, not only to the attacks of the ever-necessary sophists, but also to revolutionary developments in spheres beyond its control.

Truths, however, are fragile things. Philosophy may well be capable of seizing them and of relating them, but philosophy is essentially "subtractive"; it takes away (and here Badiou's debt to Lacan is clear): "At [philosophy's] core is a lack, a hole; is the fact that the category of Truth and its escort in time, that is, eternity, do not refer to anything in presentation" (p. 13). In other words, truths are not things we can point to directly; they are neither entities nor substantive forms. Whenever philosophy claims that it has laid its hands upon the truth, or is itself the truth, we encounter disaster, as Badiou calls it. The difficulty is remaining faithful to the truths generated by the conditions that lie beyond philosophy's echo-chamber. Whilst Badiou has sometimes been criticized for the "heroic" or "grandiose" nature of his system, it is the difficulties of staying true to the truth that are best expressed in this collection. As Badiou puts it in his discussion of Beckett: "under rare conditions, we can say again with Beckett: 'Stony ground but not entirely'" (p. 284).