Brian Leiter is one of the leading proponents of the use and application of so-called "naturalistic developments" in contemporary philosophy to central questions in analytic jurisprudence. He is also arguably the leading philosophical interpreter of legal realism. In Naturalizing Jurisprudence, he collects many of his most important essays on these topics, organized by theme, and presents previously unpublished responses to critics. The result is a work that goes well beyond the individual essays to present a trenchant, multi-faceted and mutually-reinforcing set of challenges to core views and methodologies that are prevalent in the field. In an important sense, the book is also agenda-setting: it clarifies the impact that naturalistic developments in philosophy can have on core questions in analytic jurisprudence, while gesturing towards a larger and partly empirical project aimed at working out the full scope of these consequences for legal epistemology, the nature of law, and the objectivity of legal judgment.
This is thus an important book by one of the most influential legal philosophers of our time. In what follows, I will critically examine the three parts of this book, which address, more specifically: (1) the philosophical legacy of American legal realism, with specific reference to the nature of justification in adjudication; (2) the appropriate philosophical methodology to determine the nature of law (including what conclusions to draw from this methodology); and (3) the bearing that issues in meta-ethics might have on legal objectivity. Although Leiter devotes portions of his book to arguing for various of his naturalistic commitments as well, these are large topics, which have commanded an enormous literature of their own. The commitments themselves are controversial but have a distinguished pedigree and have garnered widespread approval in one form or another. It is therefore clearly important to know what naturalism might mean for jurisprudence if true. Leiter's more distinctive contributions are, in any event, on this narrower topic, and I will therefore focus on those aspects of his work here.
One initial issue concerns the meaning of the word "naturalism". Although this term does not have a single definition in philosophy, most people associate the term with several core commitments, which can be stated in broad brush fashion. The first is a metaphysical view, which states that properties, or events, must be capable of explaining some aspect of our experience, or making the right kind of causal difference in our experience, if they are to be considered real. Naturalists often differ, at this stage, over the precise types of explanations that will count. The second is an epistemological view, which holds that the modern sciences have proven to be our best method of ascertaining what is true about the world, and which thus holds scientific inquiry up as the paradigm of knowledge formation. The term can also refer more specifically to a special way of answering epistemological questions, which owes itself to Quine's famous work on naturalized epistemology. There is also a more minimalist and yet still fully naturalistic constraint that one might place on epistemology, which is simply to rule out any claims to knowledge about a particular subject matter that either presuppose the existence of any non-natural properties, in the metaphysical sense noted above, or would require us to have scientifically implausible psychological capacities to obtain the relevant knowledge.
Finally, most so-called "naturalist" philosophers either reject, or are at least highly skeptical of, the possibility of acquiring a priori knowledge through conceptual analysis. On a methodological level, many naturalists favor a view of philosophy as the most general and reflective branch of the sciences instead. Leiter uses the term "naturalism" to refer to each of these ideas at different places in his book, and he gives them further refinements as appropriate. In what follows, I will therefore indicate what sense or senses are most pertinent to the discussion at hand.
In Part I of Naturalizing Jurisprudence, Leiter draws on Quine's work on naturalized epistemology to present a philosophical reconstruction of American Legal Realism. The term "American Legal Realism" (hereafter legal realism) refers to an important set of developments in U.S. legal academia, which date back to the 1920s and 30s, and are typically associated with two primary views: first, that the law is indeterminate, and, second, that "the law just is what judges decide it is". Within the legal academy, most non-philosophers take legal realism to express an undeniable part of the truth (as reflected in the familiar motto that "we are all legal realists now"), whereas most philosophers consider Hart's work in The Concept of Law to have exposed legal realism's central tenets to be philosophical non-starters. This state of affairs is unfortunate, in my view, because it prevents both sides from appreciating important insights into the law that are reflected, perhaps only imperfectly, in their opponents' claims. One of the most important, though as yet underappreciated, aspects of Leiter's work may thus lie in its ability to help ease the reception of legal philosophy within the larger legal academy by producing a deeper reconciliation between these common views. Leiter is, of course, more than clear that he has the converse aim: to bring legal realist insights back into central debates in analytic jurisprudence.
Consider three ways that one might try to understand the basic legal realist claims under discussion. First, one might interpret them as expressing a deeply skeptical philosophical claim, to the effect that we cannot make sense of objective tests for legal validity. As Leiter notes, this view, which is now more commonly associated with the critical legal studies movement, was the genuine target of Hart's criticisms, and these criticisms were largely successful. Leiter is thus careful to distinguish his own philosophical reconstruction from these skeptical views. Second, one might interpret the legal realists as making no philosophical claims at all, and as instead making only a series of empirical claims about what explains actual judicial decisions. On this view, the legal realists would be claiming that legal reasons (even as applied to the relevant facts) do not explain actual judicial decisions (in at least an important class of cases), whereas other factors do. Empirical claims of this kind are perfectly consistent with Hart's work because they say nothing about the possibility of objective tests for legal validity. Still, to reconcile legal realism with Hart's work in this way would produce a decidedly minimal reconciliation, because it would caste the legal realists' insights as wholly irrelevant to the philosophy of law. (In what follows, I will thus call this a "merely empirical" project.) Third, and finally, one might try to identify something non-skeptical but of philosophical significance in the legal realists' insights, something that might speak to a specifically philosophical problem, such as the nature of justification in adjudication. This would be a more ambitious project, and one with the potential for a much more robust and consequential reconciliation. Leiter's project falls squarely into this third category, and his work is unique in this regard.
Leiter begins this project by specifying in more detail the discrete set of legal realist claims that will serve as the basis for his philosophical reconstruction. Leiter reads the legal realists as making, first, a specific (and somewhat narrow) underdetermination claim: namely, that -- in those hard cases that typically reach the stages of appellate litigation -- the class of legal reasons (as applied to the relevant facts) underdetermine judicial decisions. Second, Leiter reads the legal realists as jointly committed to a "Core View", according to which judges respond primarily to the stimulus of the facts (rather than the law) in these cases. Although many associate legal realism with the further view that judges have unfettered discretion in these cases, and are motivated primarily by personal idiosyncracies, Leiter reminds us that there was another, distinct strain of legal realism, according to which judges instead give predictable responses to recurring and identifiable fact-scenarios. These particular legal realists therefore recommended an empirical research program aimed at uncovering the general principles that explain judicial behavior in this class of cases. Notice that a research program of this kind would be naturalistic, in the sense that it would be methodologically continuous with the sciences and would replace a priori inquiries (here, into the nature of justification in adjudication) with a purely psychological set of questions. The program would also be pragmatic, in the sense that it would aim to uncover empirical generalizations that lawyers might use to predict how judges will actually decide cases. One of Leiter's explicit aims in Part I is, in fact, to bring naturalistic and pragmatic developments in contemporary philosophy more squarely into jurisprudential debates, and his initial means of doing this is by this interpretation of legal realism.
There is a real question whether this particular constellation of views accurately describes any one or more of the historical legal realists' claims, but this question is, in my view, ultimately the wrong one to ask in the present context. The constellation is either close enough to many of the historical legal realists' views, or can be derived from sufficiently articulated strains of legal realism, to merit attention as a recognizable form of legal realism. Leiter is, moreover, seeking to glean insights from the legal realists' work that might have genuine philosophical significance, and, for these purposes, his reconstruction will almost certainly have to be more philosophically sophisticated than anything the historical realists might have articulated on their own. Leiter argues that this constellation of views also meets the minimal requirement of being reconcilable with Hart's criticisms because -- unlike the deeply skeptical views of legal validity that Hart meant to target with his criticisms in The Concept of Law -- this version presupposes an objective test for legal validity when distinguishing between legal and non-legal reasons in its initial underdetermination claim. This version of legal realism also asserts only local rather than global, or philosophical, indeterminacy. The more important question is thus whether this project can be distinguished from a merely empirical one in a way that might establish its philosophical significance.
Leiter's basic strategy for establishing this significance is the following. He asks us to consider, by analogy, what Quine sought to do by "naturalizing" questions of epistemology. Because this analogy is so critical to Leiter's work, I want to spell out the main steps of Quine's argument, as I understand them, for later reference. Quine was interested in the nature of justification in the production of scientific knowledge, and, when examining this problem, he famously argued that:
(1) Our scientific theories are, logically speaking, underdetermined by the empirical evidence, in part because, for any recalcitrant piece of data, we can choose either to abandon the theoretical hypothesis that we are testing or preserve it while abandoning some of the auxiliary hypotheses that informed the original test. (Here, Quine was following the earlier work of Pierre Duhem, though he was also extending it to the meanings that go into scientific theories.)
(2) We cannot, moreover, know any propositions to be true a priori (or prior to any experience) and analytically (or solely by virtue of the meanings of their terms), because there is no purely analytic domain of conceptual knowledge.
(3) Because of (2), we cannot rely purely on a priori, conceptual reasoning to determine what the right epistemic norms are to guide our processes of belief-revision when determining how to adjust our theories in response to recalcitrant empirical data.
(4) We must therefore acknowledge the bankruptcy of traditional philosophical inquiries (which purport to rely on pure conceptual analysis) into the nature of justification in the production of scientific knowledge.
(5) Yet importantly, the natural sciences have proven incredibly successful in producing knowledge (or true justified beliefs) about the world, and we have discovered no better means of producing such knowledge.
(6) Hence, we should replace traditional philosophical inquiries into the nature of justification in epistemology with a purely descriptive and psychological program that aims to discover the epistemic norms that actually govern our processes of belief-revision in the modern sciences.
Like Leiter's version of legal realism, Quine's program for epistemology is thus naturalistic, in the sense that it is methodologically continuous with the sciences and seeks to replace a priori inquiries (here, into the nature of justification in the production of scientific knowledge) with a purely psychological set of questions. Quine's recommended program is also pragmatic, in the sense that it seeks to identify those epistemic norms that actually work to produce knowledge in our most successful scientific practices. To understand the philosophical significance of the particular constellation of views that Leiter draws from the legal realists, Leiter thus asks us to view the American Legal Realists as "prescient philosophical naturalists" who recommended a similar naturalistic research program aimed at discovering how justification works in adjudication. This project should replace the misguided effort to produce a philosophical account of adjudication based solely on a priori reasoning with concepts.
In my view, Leiter's work has set the stage for an extraordinarily important and promising line of jurisprudential inquiry, though it is one that has not yet been taken up with sufficient zeal in the larger legal academy. What this program might reveal is a set of nonobvious factors and/or epistemic norms in virtue of which legal judgments are justified in practice, where by "nonobvious" I mean to refer to factors that go beyond both the content of the relevant legal sources, as interpreted using the relevant canons of interpretation, and the rules of logic combined. Factors like these would be analogous to the epistemic norms that govern theory construction in the sciences, but, while I expect there to be some overlap, there should also be important differences and distinctive contributions from convention (at least). Leiter has described this program quite nicely, but it has yet to be carried out with sufficient rigor to settle on an authoritative list of factors that might qualify for this role. This is a curious state of affairs, but my sense is that it persists because Leiter has not yet met the burden of distinguishing his project from a merely empirical one in a way that enough others have found sufficiently satisfying. Leiter does suggest, in this regard, that general worries about foundationalism in epistemology should apply to theories of adjudication (thereby suggesting the bankruptcy of foundationalist approaches to this topic as well), and he does observe that the naturalistic questions he would have us pursue as an alternative at least have the merit of being meaningful and useful. Apart from these points, however, Leiter depends almost exclusively on the analogy to Quine, and, in my view, this analogy needs to be further developed in three important ways if this project is to reach its full promise and widest possible audience.
First, one should remember that Quine himself refers to the successful practices of the modern sciences in what I have called step (5) of his argument. This success is critical to his larger argument that we should study these practices to identify epistemic norms that will have appropriate normative force. When turning to adjudication, however, it is less clear that our practices have been as successful, or even what the relevant criterion of success might be. Leiter might be read as touching on this issue when he distinguishes between what he calls the "sociological" and the "idiosyncrasy" wings of legal realism: the sociological wing studies consistent patterns of adjudications that cannot be derived from the mere application of legal sources to the relevant facts, but that one might nevertheless fairly characterize as producing "uniquely correct" decisions (at least on one plausible view), whereas the idiosyncrasy wing focuses on cases where psychological peculiarities about judges explain why they sometimes reach different outcomes in factually indistinguishable cases. Still, absent some further account of what success in adjudication amounts to, and how precisely to identify it, a naturalized project of this kind threatens to collapse into a merely empirical project.
Second, one must consider how best to frame an appropriate legal analogue of step (1) in Quine's argument. This step asserts the existence of indeterminacies in the evidence-theory relationship, where the logical relations between evidence about the world and various candidate scientific theories are relatively well understood. This understanding cannot be uncritically imported into the legal context, however, because there are important differences between knowledge about the world and knowledge about what the law requires in a given set of circumstances. Perhaps the most important such difference, for present purposes, arises from the role that conventions appear to play in producing legal knowledge. This role raises a number of special questions that a naturalized legal epistemology should address. For example: What is the precise role that conventions play in the production of legal knowledge? How should we account for these conventions in purely naturalistic terms, and in a way that would allow us to have epistemic access to their requirements? Is the role that conventions play in this special context (i.e., of producing legal knowledge) sufficient to substitute for the now discredited role that meanings were once thought to play in the production of a priori knowledge about the world? Or does the relationship between conventions and legal truth point in the opposite direction, by suggesting that legal truth -- unlike truth about the world -- may not even be complete? To say that truth about a given subject matter is "incomplete" is to say the following: it is not the case that for any proposition about that subject matter, either that proposition or its negation is true. Finally, are there any other important differences between legal knowledge and knowledge about the world that might affect the existence or scope of the relevant legal indeterminacies, or the shape of the relevant epistemic norms that constrain legal knowledge? Once again, answers to questions like these would help to clarify the appropriate contours of a naturalized approach to adjudication, and would provide useful guidance to researchers hoping to shed light on how legal knowledge is produced.
Third, one might clarify the jurisprudential stakes of this project by identifying concrete places where other theorists are relying on a priori conceptual analysis to drive parts of their own views on adjudication. Consider, for example, the phenomenon of hard cases. These are cases in which legal sources, as interpreted using the relevant canons of legal interpretation and as applied to the relevant facts of a case, fail to determine a uniquely correct resolution. Dworkin famously holds the view that cases like these nevertheless always admit of uniquely correct resolutions, which judges must identify by relying on substantive moral insight, whereas Hart famously held the view that these cases are always legally indeterminate and must be decided as an exercise of legal discretion. It seems plausible to me that one or both of these views might be derived from forms of conceptual reasoning that would be ruled out by the naturalistic commitments articulated at step (3) in Quine's argument, but one would need to say much more to establish that this is the case. Clarifying places in the literature where others theorists have relied on conceptual analysis in developing their alternative views on adjudication would therefore help not only to crystallize the jurisprudential stakes of the present project but also to highlight its distinctive contributions.
Part I of Leiter's book thus develops an important and distinctive approach to legal epistemology, which, in my view, invites a larger and more refined research program aimed at clarifying the nature of justification in adjudication.
In the second Part of the book, entitled "Ways of Naturalizing Jurisprudence", Leiter considers both the methodological and substantive impact that a naturalistic turn might have on the central question of analytic jurisprudence: namely, the "what is law" question. (This question is distinct from the "what does law require" question -- which was addressed more centrally in the last section.) On one widespread view, which is most commonly associated with Joseph Raz, the point of this inquiry is to acquire knowledge about what law is, where the philosophical search for knowledge is distinguished from the merely sociological search in the following way: sociologists of law aim to uncover empirical generalizations about law that may be only contingently true, whereas philosophers of law aim to identify propositions about law that are both necessarily true and adequately explain the nature of law. (The term "nature of law" refers here to those essential properties that a given set of phenomena must exhibit in order to be law.) Leiter accepts this basic characterization of the goal of analytic jurisprudence, and one can see why those attracted to this view, but who have not yet absorbed Quine's criticisms of analyticity, might think that conceptual analysis would be an appropriate method to generate this knowledge.
It is, in fact, striking just how much analytic jurisprudence engages in conceptual analysis and intuition pumping to determine what law is -- and how much proceeds without regard for how deeply these methods have been problematized as credible sources of knowledge. Leiter deserves rich praise for raising this issue, and for prompting a more reflective look into the appropriate role that conceptual analysis should play in this field. These are important questions of methodology, and a good portion of Part II is, in fact, dedicated to canvassing three distinct grounds for caution on this score. The first derives from Quine's famous criticisms of the analytic-synthetic distinction, which suggest that we may not even be able to make sense of a purely analytic domain of concepts that could give rise to a priori knowledge about the world. The second arises from a growing body of empirical work that has discovered parochialism in many of the linguistic intuitions that philosophers sometimes draw upon and assume to be universal. The third derives from the less than sterling history of conceptual analysis itself, which is replete with conceptual claims that were once thought to be necessarily true but that we have subsequently had to revise or abandon in light of further experience.
For those interested in developing a purely descriptive account of law, it would thus seem to follow that the traditional methods of conceptual analysis should be abandoned. Taking a cue from Quine, Leiter urges that analytic jurisprudence should instead become the most general and reflective branch of the sciences that study what law is. He then specifies this idea in the following way: we should answer the "what is law" question by asking which concept of law would make our best ongoing scientific inquiries into law true and explanatory. Application of this methodology then allows Leiter to make two major contributions to the "what is law" debate.
First, Leiter develops a response to an important set of recent challenges to legal positivism, and, in particular, to its stated goal of developing a purely descriptive and general account of law. These challenges arise from a group of natural law theorists (principally Stephen Perry, John Finnis, Ronald Dworkin, Gerald Postema, Nikos Stravopolous and Liam Murphy) who have each argued, in one way or another, that one cannot settle upon a satisfying account of the concept of law without engaging in substantive moral and/or normative argumentation. Although the details of these arguments vary, they share a common structure: they begin with the observation that more than one concept of law is logically consistent with the relevant empirical data about law (sometimes because there is more than one way to delimit the "relevant data"), and then argue that we must therefore engage in substantive moral and/or normative argumentation to settle on the right concept. As Leiter observes, however, this conceptual underdetermination parallels the more general undeterdetermination of theories by the evidence. If the aim is to produce a purely descriptive account of law, then -- Leiter urges -- there is no reason why the basic epistemic norms that constrain theory construction in the sciences cannot be applied to resolve this indeterminacy as well. Indeed, one might push the point further on Leiter's behalf, by noting that there is no pragmatic justification for the use of non-epistemic norms (such as moral norms) for the production of purely descriptive knowledge. Hence, reference to moral insight is not only unnecessary for this particular purpose but also unjustified and likely to conflict with that goal.
In my view, this aspect of Leiter's work is best understood as articulating a general method for answering worries about the brute possibility of settling on unique concepts of natural phenomena in the absence of moral and/or normative argumentation. Leiter's argument does not distinguish (nor does it purport to distinguish) between the moral value of different empirical inquiries, and so there should still be room to argue for the relative value of different empirical projects based on moral and/or normative grounds. Different forms of empirical inquiry might also yield somewhat different concepts of law, which pick out slightly different natural phenomena. None of this, however, should make it impossible to produce a purely descriptive account of those natural phenomena, and none of this should lead us to regard the truth values of these descriptions as turning on moral facts.
Second, Leiter enters into the more internecine debates between inclusive and exclusive legal positivists over whether the relevant tests for legality can incorporate moral criteria. Leiter argues, with some plausibility, that proponents on both sides of this debate have tended to rely on traditional forms of conceptual analysis and intuition pumping to support their respective views. Leiter observes that these arguments have nevertheless failed to settle the incorporability issue. Still, none of this should be surprising if -- as Leiter qua naturalistic philosopher has argued -- conceptual analysis alone is insufficient to produce knowledge about what anything is, let alone law. As noted above, Leiter has suggested that we can -- on the other hand -- provide a straightforward answer to this question if we ask instead which concept of law would render our best ongoing scientific inquiries into law true and explanatory. The relevant empirical research programs are said to be those generated by the legal realists, and these programs have produced the following claim: while legal sources (as interpreted using the relevant canons of legal interpretation) sometimes logically determine unique outcomes to legal disputes, these sources can also sometimes leave legal questions indeterminate. In order for this claim to be true and explanatory, we must presumably posit a concept of law that is completely source-based; only in terms of such a concept can we explain the special class of judicial behavior that is dubbed "determinate" in this claim, and thereby render the claim true. This concept is, moreover, none other than the exclusive legal positivist concept of law, which does not allow for the incorporation of moral criteria. If considerations like these are valid, they give rise to an important and distinctive set of considerations favoring exclusive legal positivism over both its inclusive legal positivist and non-positivist rivals.
From a naturalistic perspective, the central virtue to Leiter's method of answering the "what is law" question is that it guarantees that the resulting concept will pick out something real in the natural world. There are, however, at least two remaining questions that will arise for this view, even granting Leiter's naturalistic commitments.
First, one should remember that a naturalistic criterion for reality is not itself a guarantee of philosophical significance. There are, after all, numerous entities in the natural world, and not all of them call for a special branch of philosophy. When trying to determine which natural phenomena, and which natural facts, are relevant to the production of illumination in jurisprudence, I am therefore inclined to join several other philosophers (most notably Jules Coleman and Joseph Raz) who worry that we may not be able to do this on purely theoretical grounds. At root, what is at issue here is the right way to picture the relationship between knowledge about the world and true philosophical insight. In my view, naturalistically inclined philosophers owe some further account of this relationship if they hope to establish the validity of their proffered account of law.
Second, and relatedly, I do not believe that a naturalistically inclined philosopher can just accept Raz's view that the goal of analytic jurisprudence is to produce knowledge about the nature of law. We certainly talk about the law, and our ordinary law talk appears to be conceptually bound up with a number of other puzzling concepts like those of rules, obligations, reasons, authority, and the like. For a naturalistically inclined philosopher, it should, however, always be an empirical question whether any of these concepts (including "law") refers to something real. As Leiter clearly recognizes, the naturalistically inclined philosopher must be careful not to assert anything that presupposes the existence of any non-natural or scientifically-implausible entities. Still, one might meet this criterion not only by identifying a real natural phenomenon to call "law" but also by identifying places where our law talk fails to refer and providing a purely descriptive account of what we are doing when we engage in this talk. There are, moreover, times when philosophical illumination would appear to require such a tack, and so this tack must be considered more carefully within a larger project aimed at naturalizing jurisprudence.
In my view, Part II thus offers a first, but not necessarily the last, word on how naturalistic developments might shed light on various puzzles associated with the "what is law" question. There is, moreover, a way to find broader importance in these reflections. They should prompt a deeper and more reflective look at the relationship between three important items: namely, (1) the right criteria to guarantee that our concepts refer to something real in the natural world; (2) the appropriate philosophical goal, or point, of asking the "what is law" question; and (3) the remaining role, if any, that conceptual analysis might play in helping to attain this goal from within a purely naturalistic framework.
In Part III, Leiter enters into substantive debates in meta-ethics, and discusses the bearing of naturalism on the objectivity of moral and legal judgment. Because my focus here is on the relevance of naturalism to jurisprudence, rather than on the validity of any particular meta-ethical view, my discussion will be relatively short.
It is worth remembering that Hart himself consistently recommended trying to account for law without presupposing any controversial meta-ethical views. This recommendation may have been sound when Hart was writing, given the relatively undeveloped state of meta-ethics at the time and the narrow problems he was addressing. In recent decades, however, debates in meta-ethics have grown increasingly sophisticated, and there are now important views within jurisprudence that depend critically on how these debates are resolved. The most important such view, for present purposes, is one that directly conflicts with Leiter's naturalized account of adjudication. This is Dworkin's view that all legal questions admit of uniquely correct answers, which are to be determined by employing substantive moral insight. This view clearly presupposes that moral judgments themselves admit of uniquely correct answers, and, hence, questions of meta-ethics cannot fairly be sidestepped when assessing this view. What is a naturalist to say about this issue?
Together, the essays in Part III can be read as offering a four step argument that seeks to address this question. First, Leiter notes that some contemporary "naturalistic" moral realists have sought to understand moral properties as a distinctive class of natural properties, and have articulated the criteria needed to test for the reality of such properties. (These criteria are a refined form of the metaphysical test for reality mentioned at the beginning of this essay.) If such properties were to exist, one might vindicate the objectivity of moral judgment from within a purely naturalistic framework, but the existence of such properties is in part an empirical question. Second, Leiter canvasses the dominant accounts of such properties in the literature, which are found in the work of Peter Railton and Nicholas Sturgeon, and argues that these accounts are empirically implausible. Third, Leiter discusses several alternative, "non-natural" accounts of moral objectivity, owing primarily to Dworkin and McDowell, and criticizes their cogency. Finally, Leiter concludes that objective legal judgment cannot depend on moral judgment, and begins to develop a naturalistic account of legal objectivity that meets this constraint.
In my view, one of the most helpful aspects of Part III is that it thereby clarifies the logical relations between various issues in meta-ethics and the possibility of objective legal judgment. Leiter's discussion of naturalistic moral realism, in what I have called step one of his argument, is solid and helpful: it lays out the right tests that one must meet to justify a naturalistic form of moral realism. His arguments at step three against non-naturalistic accounts of moral objectivity depend, on the other hand, on the cogency of his underlying naturalistic commitments. These are large issues, which go beyond the scope of this review, and -- for reasons already discussed -- I have therefore chosen to assume arguendo that naturalism in some form is true. For those interested in understanding the relevance of naturalism for jurisprudence, there are nevertheless two recent developments that are worth mentioning because they bear on other parts of Leiter's argument and may affect the larger conclusions that should be drawn.
First, there is the recent development of so-called "quasi-realist" accounts of our moral language, by Allan Gibbard and Simon Blackburn most prominently. These accounts are fully consistent with Leiter's naturalistic commitments because they account for our moral language in terms of psychological attitudes that we express, but without positing any natural moral properties that purportedly explain aspects of our experience. These philosophers have nevertheless gone to great lengths to account for various other objectivist features of our moral language, including the following facts: (1) we can morally disagree in ways that are not attributable to differing beliefs about the world, and we consider these disagreements to require revision of one or another of our competing beliefs as a matter of logic; (2) we sometimes embed ethical judgments in conditionals and other more complex syntactic structures, and reason with them using the ordinary rules of logic; and (3) we take our ethical views to be responsive to at least some reasons that are poorly understood as reasons to change our descriptive beliefs about the world. Modern quasi-realists have also accepted a deflationary account of truth, and now believe that there is no further property of truth that our descriptive judgments may have that our moral judgments must lack. If this is so, then quasi-realism may offer an account of moral objectivity that is purely naturalistic but also sufficiently robust to allow for objective legal judgments to depend upon moral judgments.
Second, and now returning to naturalistic forms of moral realism proper, Leiter rightly observes that one must assess the cogency of any such views on a case by case basis. In particular, one must determine whether a given account has identified a natural property that is sufficiently related to something of moral value to count as a moral property, and whether that natural property is needed to explain various aspects of our experience in the right way. Railton and Sturgeon have sought to do this by explaining things like moral progress in terms of natural properties that arguably have the appropriate normative significance. Leiter is nevertheless concerned -- and I think rightfully so -- that these explanations may not be sufficiently compelling on their own. This is an issue that is close to my heart, because -- in The Deep Structure of Law and Morality -- I have developed a purely naturalistic account of our sense of obligation, which, I argue, is needed to explain a number of distinctive features of our social lives. Although I cannot repeat those arguments here, and although the arguments are themselves speculative, I can note that the explanation makes reference to a natural property that will have appropriate normative significance if contractualism is true. The account also explains a much more robust set of phenomena than is found in Railton's and Sturgeon's work, and does so in a coherent fashion. The account thus represents the type of work that might alter the second step of Leiter's argument in Part III, along with the appropriate conclusions to be drawn.
Regardless of the merits of this particular view, naturalistic forms of moral realism are thus still in their relative infancy: we are still developing the type of theoretical work needed to know what facts must obtain for naturalistic moral realism to be true, and we are still engaging in many of the empirical inquiries needed to answer that question. It is thus too early, in my view, to dismiss naturalistic forms of moral realism from broader debates over how to naturalize jurisprudence.In sum, Part III helps clarify some of the important relationships between current debates in meta-ethics and certain core questions in the philosophy of law. Given the rapidly developing state of the debates in meta-ethics, I am, however, less inclined to think that we can come to firm conclusions about the relationship between legal and moral objectivity. Part III is better read as developing one promising view on this topic, which should invite a more robust discussion of the full set of alternatives. Part III does, however, make one thing very clear: we can no longer heed Hart's advice to avoid questions in meta-ethics when developing serious views in jurisprudence.