G. A. Cohen

Rescuing Justice and Equality

G. A. Cohen, Rescuing Justice and Equality, Harvard UP, 2008, 448pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674030763.

Reviewed by Jon Mandle, University at Albany (SUNY)


Over the course of the more than 400 pages of Rescuing Justice and Equality (RJE) G. A. Cohen provides a relentless, sophisticated, and insightful critique of elements of John Rawls's A Theory of Justice (TJ). It is refreshing, therefore, that early on he takes a few pages to express his great admiration for Rawls's work, stating his belief that "at most two books in the history of Western political philosophy have a claim to be regarded as greater than A Theory of Justice: Plato's Republic and Hobbes's Leviathan" (RJE 11). These remarks helpfully clarify the spirit in which his critique is presented. His criticisms are powerful ones, but they are intended to be constructive -- part of a common project to get things right. This is what serious philosophical engagement should be like. I will only be able to sketch the bare outlines of a few of the many meticulous and fine-grained arguments that he offers. Although I do not agree with the main criticisms he advances, there are many arguments with which I do agree, and even where I disagree, Cohen does a great service by clarifying what is at stake and exploring the range of options available.

The first five chapters rehearse and elaborate Cohen's critique of the Rawlsian difference principle. Much of this will be familiar to those who have followed Cohen's work, since three chapters are revised versions of previously published articles. Still, it is useful to bring them together as they complement each other and form a sustained argument that Cohen extends in significant new ways. The following three chapters -- together with an appendix replying to critics -- abstract from the content of the principles of distributive justice and address the more meta-ethical issue of the relationship between fundamental normative principles and rules of social regulation. The first of these chapters was previously published while the others are new.

Each of the book's two parts relate to Rawls's work in different ways. Cohen presents the first part of the book as an immanent critique of justice as fairness. He argues that Rawls's account of distributive justice is motivated by two competing considerations -- equality and efficiency -- and that his position is ultimately a failed attempt to reconcile them. Cohen recommends embracing the impulse to equality while holding that efficiency is a factor extraneous to justice properly understood. Sometimes efficiency may override justice, but when it does we should recognize the sacrifice for what it is. The second part of the book, in contrast, is simply a rejection of Rawls's claim that "Conceptions of justice must be justified by the conditions of our life as we know it or not at all", and of his view that stability and publicity are desiderata of principles of justice (TJ 398). Here, apparently, Rawls simply gets it wrong, and there is little to salvage. At best, Cohen holds, Rawls gives us rules appropriate for social regulation, not principles of justice.

Cohen's initial critique of Rawls's use of the difference principle is well-known. He holds that Rawls misapplies the difference principle when he restricts its application to the design of the basic structure. A more thoroughgoing egalitarian would hold that it should also apply directly to the actions of individuals and inform the ethos of a just society. Assuming that the basic liberties and fair equality of opportunity are protected, Rawls allows structural inequalities in income that serve to increase the share of primary goods of the least advantaged social position. An inequality might do this, for example, by inducing some individuals to engage in more productive work than they would without the additional incentive, thereby increasing the total social product, some of which is then used to benefit the least advantaged in absolute terms. But, Cohen points out, those individuals could choose to forego the additional incentives and engage in that same more productive work. If they did, the least advantaged could gain even more since the money that would have been used as an incentive could itself be divided equally. If justice requires citizens to aim to maximize the good of the least advantaged, they should do this not only by supporting institutions that satisfy the difference principle but directly in their own everyday conduct, such as their choice among employment options, as well.

This argument has already been discussed extensively in the literature, and I won't here add to this debate except to try to clarify the positions at issue.[1] For while Rawls focuses on developing principles for the evaluation of the basic structure -- what he calls "social justice" -- he points out that we can also evaluate the justice of other kinds of objects. However, "There is no reason to suppose ahead of time that the principles satisfactory for the basic structure hold for all cases … [such as] the various informal conventions and customs of everyday life" (TJ 7). Since Rawls does not elaborate these additional standards of "local justice" it is not at all obvious that he would say that it is perfectly just for individuals to take advantage of rare and valuable talents to gain additional income. This depends on the principles that it is appropriate to use when evaluating individual conduct, and Rawls's position is only that we should not assume that they are the same as those that are appropriate for evaluating the basic structure. Cohen gives some examples of injustice that he believes would escape an exclusive focus on the basic structure. There is room to dispute the details of his examples, but the general point is correct -- a just basic structure will not eliminate all injustice. The question, though, is whether injustice in the basic structure and other injustices have the same character and should be evaluated according to the same principles.

Cohen holds that the same principles should apply both to institutions and to individual conduct. This is because distributive justice is concerned with

the pattern of benefits and burdens in society … My concern is distributive justice, by which I uneccentrically mean justice (and its lack) in the distribution of benefits and burdens to individuals. My root belief is that there is injustice in distribution when inequality of goods reflects not such things as differences in the arduousness of different people's labors, or people's different preferences and choices with respect to income and leisure, but myriad forms of lucky and unlucky circumstances. (RJE 126; cf. 7)

Distributive justice is a matter of bringing about this correct pattern, and therefore anything that can causally effect the distribution of benefits and burdens can be assessed in terms of its contribution to this ideal: "there is no good reason why the very principles that govern the basic structure should not extend to individual choice within that structure" (RJE 359).

In addition to criticizing Rawls's restricted use of the difference principle, Cohen now holds that the difference principle is itself defective as a principle of justice. Following Brian Barry, Cohen reconstructs Rawls's argument for the difference principle in two stages. At the first stage, we arrive at an equal distribution because justice requires the elimination of "all morally arbitrary causes of inequality" and "there exist no causes of inequality that are not arbitrary in the specified sense" (RJE 89). At the second stage, we arrive at the difference principle by allowing those inequalities that work to everyone's advantage -- that is, those that are Pareto improvements over equality.[2] The problem, Cohen argues, is that the second stage introduces a consideration extraneous to justice itself. If you accept the first stage, then introducing an inequality based on morally arbitrary factors is unjust, even if it results in a Pareto improvement. Hence, Cohen holds that "distributive justice is (some kind of) equality"[3] (RJE 30 n.7). This apparently includes "leveling down" when that is the only way that equality can be achieved (RJE 317-318). However, Cohen also believes that there are often good reasons to accept Pareto improvements and the difference principle even at the cost of justice -- they "often trump justice" (RJE 30 n.7). Thus, the difference principle is not a principle of justice since it incorporates considerations extraneous to justice itself. Yet, for that very reason, it is often an appropriate rule of social regulation with which to assess institutional arrangements.

Although common, I believe this reconstruction of Rawls's position is mistaken. He does not believe that justice is a matter of eliminating the influence of luck. Despite the fact that the natural talents with which we are born are a matter of brute luck if anything is, Rawls holds that "The natural distribution [of talents] is neither just nor unjust" (TJ 87). Further, he explicitly rejects the principle of redress, which holds that "undeserved inequalities call for redress; and since inequalities of birth and natural endowment are undeserved, these inequalities are to be somehow compensated for" (TJ 86). In fact, if, as Cohen has it, the question concerns the just pattern of benefits and burdens to individuals, Rawls, perhaps eccentrically, believes that there is no general answer. Once an equal scheme of basic liberties and fair equality of opportunity have been secured, individual entitlements to particular shares of goods is a matter of pure procedural justice: "A distribution cannot be judged in isolation from the system of which it is the outcome or from what individuals have done in good faith in the light of established expectations" (TJ 76). The problem of social justice, for Rawls, concerns how a society should design the institutions within which its members interact to produce various outcomes. The institutional arrangement, not the resulting distribution, is fundamental for Rawls.

In the second part of RJE, Cohen presents a meta-ethical argument that fundamental normative principles cannot be justified (even in part) by non-normative facts. If there is a principle that we believe is only justified when certain factual conditions obtain, there must be a further principle that explains why the first principle is justified under those conditions. This further principle cannot itself be justified by those conditions. By repeatedly asking for and obtaining an explanation for why some condition is part of the justification of a principle, Cohen argues, we will eventually obtain a fact-free principle.

Cohen is not making the merely theoretical point that in some sense a full understanding of a principle requires knowledge of what (if anything) it would require in every possible world. He thinks that philosophers should be especially concerned to identify these fundamental principles, complaining that there has been "insufficient effort to identify" fact-free principles and that "the question for political philosophy is not what we should do but what we should think, even when what we should think makes no practical difference" (RJE 269, 268). It is unclear how exactly Cohen thinks we are to identify these fundamental principles. This is especially problematic since he holds that "we determine the principles that we are willing to endorse through an investigation of our individual normative judgments on particular cases" and he is skeptical that philosophy can move us far from our "pertinent prephilosophical judgment" (RJE 4, 3). These particular judgments are typically heavily fact-dependent. As Cohen acknowledges, "It is, for example, bewildering to try to say what principles we would affirm for beings who were otherwise like us as we are in our adult state but whose normal life spans occupied only twenty-four hours" (RJE 246). Indeed it is bewildering, as is the attempt to identify principles for beings "with a life plan that is internally fully provided from its inception with everything that it requires for whatever life plan it might choose" (RJE 293).[4] Although learning what justice would require for such beings might count as knowledge, one might think that we have far greater prospects for increasing our knowledge about justice for human beings in more familiar circumstances (not to mention the greater practical interest of such questions). It is significant, I think, that to the extent that Cohen does attempt to justify his egalitarian conception of justice in the first part of the book, he does so through what he presents as an immanent critique of Rawls, helping himself to an egalitarian starting point.

The case for identifying fundamental principles would be strong if they were necessary in order to understand not only what was required in possible worlds very different from ours but also fully to understand what was required in ours and why. Cohen suggests this when he writes: "Until we unearth the fact-free principle that governs our fact-loaded particular judgments about justice, we don't know why we think what we think just is just" (RJE 291, cf. 246). Both Thomas Pogge and Samuel Freeman have pointed out that Cohen's formal argument will count as fundamental a conditional principle (roughly) of the form: "If factual condition C, then principle P."[5] That conditional principle itself does not assume C, nor is it justified by C. Cohen apparently accepts this point when he claims that the following "putative principle of justice is, in my view, fact-insensitive": "against a background of equality of access to advantage, people should internalize the costs their lack of care imposes upon others" (RJE 313). This fact-insensitive principle has as factual antecedent that the appropriate background is in place. It says nothing when those facts don't obtain, yet still counts as fundamental.

Cohen might argue that we don't fully understand a concept such as justice until we know what (if anything) it requires in all possible worlds. So conditional principles, even if technically fundamental, are not enough. If all we know about justice is that it requires P when C obtains, what about when C does not? Perhaps we should also endorse: "If not-C, then principle Q." There is an obvious sense in which the conjunction of these two conditionals gives us a more complete understanding of justice than one alone. On the other hand, while learning what justice requires when C does not obtain increases the breadth of our knowledge, it does not necessarily increase its depth. Unless there is a unified, unconditional fundamental principle, we may not know any more about why principle P holds in condition C than we did before. Sometimes Cohen does seem to assume that a more fundamental principle always gives us a greater depth of understanding. Quoting Nozick approvingly, he says that "A rule of regulation is 'a device for having certain effects'" (RJE 265). A clearer understanding of the end(s) served by a rule of regulation would count as a deeper understanding of the rule. Nevertheless there may be conditional principles that are not merely rules of regulation in this sense. They assert a principle under certain factual conditions, but not as a way to bring about some further effect. In addition, although Cohen thinks of a basic structure that satisfies the difference principle as an instrument for bringing about an equal distribution, that is not how Rawls thinks of it. It is, rather, what is required for individuals to respect one another as free and equal moral persons when certain factual conditions hold.

I conclude by noting that RJE is surprisingly apolitical in two senses. First, there is very little discussion of the concept of justice beyond its distributive aspects. There is, for example, virtually no discussion of political justice. In fact, Cohen seems to endorse the Marxist idea that the state is "an alien superstructural power" and if the right principles "are practiced in everyday life … then the state can wither away" (RJE 1). This, however, would only be possible if we could look forward to the elimination of deep disagreements about comprehensive doctrines and the value of various ends. If, as Rawls holds, diversity is the "the inevitable long-run result of the powers of human reason at work within the background of enduring free institutions,"[6] then we will continue to need institutional arrangements to resolve the inevitable conflicts among reasonable citizens. Indeed, if we simply assume that a scheme of personal property will have to be administered in some way -- including the resolution of reasonable disagreements about how general rules are to be applied to particular cases -- then we will need some kind of authoritative institutional arrangements. Further, in order to see those institutions as anything but alien impositions, we will need to regulate them through a democratic political mechanism.

For Cohen, distributive justice aims to overcome inequalities resulting from the "myriad forms of lucky and unlucky circumstances" (RJE 126). The institutions and relationships that individuals find themselves in are relevant to this goal only instrumentally. For Rawls, in contrast, the basic liberties (including the political liberties) and the principles of distributive justice are both part of a unified attempt to answer the question: "what is the most acceptable political conception of justice for specifying the fair terms of social cooperation between citizens regarded as free and equal and as both reasonable and rational?"[7] The principles of social justice, which include the difference principle, apply in virtue of individuals being part of a shared political society. Different principles apply when there are different relations and there is no reason to assume that these relationships figure in an account of justice only instrumentally, as devices for achieving certain ends, such as a pattern of distribution, that can be independently identified.

Finally, there is very little discussion of Rawls's technical ideas of a "political conception of justice" and of "public reason" in RJE. Once the question is asked, however, it is clear that Cohen's account is not a political conception since he aims to apply it beyond the institutions of the basic structure. This is not, in itself, an objection. In developing a political conception of justice, Rawls does not call for an end to the investigation and defense of particular comprehensive doctrines. Nevertheless it is important to recognize the very different questions that Cohen and Rawls are asking. Once these differences are recognized, what is most striking is perhaps the high degree to which, when limited to the question of institutional design, Cohen's account and justice as fairness overlap.[8]

[1] See, for example, Kenneth Baynes, "Ethos and Institutions: On the Site of Distributive Justice," Journal of Social Philosophy, 37 (2006); Joshua Cohen, "Taking People as They Are?" Philosophy and Public Affairs, 30 (2001); Samuel Freeman, "Rawls and Luck Egalitarianism" in Justice and the Social Contract: Essays on Rawlsian Political Philosophy (Oxford, 2007); Jon Mandle, "Distributive Justice at Home and Abroad" in Contemporary Debates in Political Philosophy, Thomas Christiano and John Christman, eds. (Blackwell, 2009); Thomas Pogge, "On the Site of Distributive Justice: Reflections on Cohen and Murphy," Philosophy and Public Affairs, 29 (2000); Samuel Scheffler, "What Is Egalitarianism?" Philosophy and Public Affairs, 31 (2003); Samuel Scheffler, "Is the Basic Structure Basic?" in The Egalitarian Conscience: Essays in Honour of G.A. Cohen, Christine Sypnowich, ed. (Oxford, 2006); Paul Smith, "Incentives and Justice: G.A. Cohen's Egalitarian Critique of Rawls," Social Theory and Practice, 24 (1998); Andrew Williams, "Incentives, Inequality, and Publicity," Philosophy and Public Affairs, 27 (1998); Jonathan Wolff, "Fairness, Respect, and the Egalitarian Ethos," Philosophy and Public Affairs, 27 (1998).

[2] Cohen is insufficiently attentive to the fact that there are many distributions that are Pareto improvements over an equal distribution that the difference principle would not allow because they do not maximally benefit the least advantaged. This point holds even when the difference principle is understood as giving permission for (rather than requiring) certain inequalities.

[3] Cohen is vague on the "equality of what?" question. He apparently continues to hold some version of the "equality of opportunity for advantage" view that he first articulated in "On the Currency of Egalitarian Justice," Ethics 99 (1989). This is not discussed beyond his pointing out that equality of income is insufficient: "where work is specially arduous or stressful, higher remuneration is a counterbalancing equalizer on a sensible view of how to judge whether or not things are equal" (RJE 56). It is not clear to me whether he intends to single out arduousness and stress (and perhaps other objective factors) or whether these are meant to indicate subjective dispreference. Either option raises a host of questions that I cannot discuss here.

[4] Pogge points out that "Other worlds can be very different from ours: There may not be sufficiently separable individuals. Life-spans may be dramatically unequal. And conceptions of the good may be so radically diverse that it seems ludicrous to affirm what Cohen's egalitarianism requires: that the relational predicate 'is better off than' can meaningfully be applied to each and every pair of individuals" (Thomas Pogge, "Cohen to the Rescue!" Ratio 21 (2008), p.462 n.8.).

[5] See Pogge, "Cohen to the Rescue!"; Samuel Freeman, "Constructivism, Facts, and Moral Justification" in Contemporary Debates in Political Philosophy, Thomas Christiano and John Christman, eds. (Blackwell, 2009).

[6] John Rawls, Political Liberalism, expanded edition (Columbia, 2005), p.4.

[7] John Rawls, Justice as Fairness: A Restatement, Erin Kelly, ed. (Harvard, 2001), pp.7-8.

[8] Thanks to Chris Bertram, Sam Freeman, Lisa Fuller, Arthur Ripstein, and Andrew Williams.