2009.08.18

John Rawls

A Brief Inquiry into the Meaning of Sin & Faith (with "On My Religion")

John Rawls, A Brief Inquiry into the Meaning of Sin & Faith (with "On My Religion"), Thomas Nagel (ed.), Harvard UP, 2009, 275 pp., $27.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674033313.

Reviewed by Paul Weithman, University of Notre Dame


 

In December of 1942, shortly before a graduation advanced by war, John Rawls submitted his senior thesis to the Princeton Philosophy Department.[1] That he wrote a thesis is not itself surprising, since a thesis is expected of Princeton seniors. What is surprising is the subject on which Rawls wrote; he called his thesis A Brief Inquiry into Sin & Faith: An Interpretation Based on the Concept of Community. The present volume publishes A Brief Inquiry for the first time, along with an essay of Rawls's called "On My Religion" that was dated '1997' but that Rawls never published or circulated.

This book was edited by Thomas Nagel, who -- with Joshua Cohen -- supplied an introductory essay that tells how both writings were rediscovered and that identifies points on which A Brief Inquiry anticipates Rawls's later work. The task of editing Rawls's thesis was not inconsiderable. Nagel was, of course, a student of Rawls's and he may have taken on the task as a labor of love. But labors of love are still labors, and they can be quite time-consuming labors at that.[2] Readers of Rawls are in Nagel's debt for the work he did in shepherding this fascinating little volume through to publication.

- I -

"On My Religion" was found among Rawls's files after his death. In it, he wrote that during his last two years of college, he "became deeply concerned about theology and its doctrines". (p. 261) Rawls began his military service immediately after graduation. At the time of his entry into the Army -- hence at the time he wrote the thesis -- he was, he recalled, a "believing orthodox Episcopalian Christian". (p. 261) The Holocaust, of which Rawls first became aware in April of 1945, led him to question the efficacy of prayer and the supremacy of God's will in history. (p. 263) In the years that followed, Rawls became increasingly troubled by moral objections to many other doctrines he thought central to Christianity -- original sin, salvation by true belief, the necessity of obedience to clerical authority, and the doctrines of predestination and double predestination. (pp. 263-64) He became especially disturbed by what he thought was the self-centered concern Christianity encourages with one's own prospects for salvation. (p. 265) After studying the Inquisition, Rawls made liberty of conscience one of the "fixed points" of his moral and political opinions. (p. 265) "On My Religion" concludes with some interesting reflections on the differences between human and divine reason, and on whether the "content of reasonableness" depends upon the existence of God. (p. 268)

"On My Religion" is a short piece. The much longer A Brief Inquiry, which was recovered from Princeton's Mudd Library by Professor Eric Gregory of the Princeton Religion Department, takes up the bulk of the present volume.[3] The thesis shows the profound influence of a number of mid-century Protestant ethicists, many of whom are little read any more and few of whom will be familiar to the philosophers most likely to be interested this book. Fortunately, a magisterial essay by Robert Adams provides the necessary background.

Adams treats Rawls's thesis as worthy of serious engagement, calling attention to places where it is most satisfying, but also highlighting places where claims are undeveloped and further argument is needed. Adams's criticisms, and the contrasts he draws between Rawls's views and those of the leading figures who influenced him, greatly illuminate the thesis. Even apart from the light it sheds on Rawls's early work, Adams's essay could serve as a valuable introduction to mid-twentieth century Protestant religious ethics. Graduate students in religious studies who need to get up to speed on the subject could do much worse than to start with Adams's contribution to this volume. I doubt that there is anyone else in the academy with the breadth of philosophical and theological learning needed to write it.

Rawls's thesis is a complex and ambitious piece of work that cannot be summarized easily. Very roughly, Rawls believed that, at least since Augustine, Christian ethics was distorted by something he called "naturalism". One of Rawls's aims in the thesis is to expose those distortions by discrediting naturalism and tracing its influence.

Naturalism is not the view everything can be described and explained by natural science. What naturalism is is most easily understood by seeing what it is for someone to stand to something else in what Rawls calls a "natural relation". (p. 115) I stand in a natural relation to something when I regard and treat it as an object of my desires or aversions. It is important for Rawls that 'object' is to be contrasted with 'person'. When I stand to something in a natural relation, I regard it an object and therefore as lacking the powers of personhood. (p. 115)

It is possible and entirely acceptable, Rawls thought, to stand in natural relations to inanimate things. We do so, for example, when we desire an apple because it will satisfy our hunger or a cup of coffee because it will provide warmth. (pp. 117, 184-85) Nevertheless while it is possible to stand in natural relations to something that has the powers of personality, to do so is to relate to it in the wrong way. When we treat other persons as objects, as one might do when our desire to be with another is entirely sexual, we are guilty of what Rawls calls "egoism". (p. 188) If, as Rawls says, "egoism merely uses the other", what he calls "egotism" is worse. (p. 194) Egotism "abuses" another by trying to turn his powers of personality to one's own purposes -- specifically, by trying to turn others into one's own admirers so as to gratify self-love. (pp. 193-94)

If we reserve the term 'desire' for natural relations of appetition, then we can put Rawls's critique of Christian ethics this way: under the impact of Greek thought, Christianity since Augustine has come to see humans as fundamentally desiring beings. The practical problem of Christian ethics was then conceived of as the problem of "turning desire … to its proper object", understood as things rather than as persons. (p. 120) Traditional writers such as Augustine and Aquinas tried to solve that problem by treating God as "a satisfying object of supreme desirability". (p. 120) Because God is a person, however, this attempt at a solution places our relationship with God on the wrong footing. An ethic according to which God is an object is bound to misunderstand the right and wrong ways to relate to God. It is bound, that is, to misunderstand the Christian notions of faith and sin.

The thesis has a positive as well as a polemical aim, one which is signaled by its title. That aim is to recover the correct understanding of sin and faith by interpreting them in light of the fact that human beings are not fundamentally desiring -- in Rawls's sense of 'desiring'. Rather we are, Rawls claimed, fundamentally creatures who are made to live in community with other beings who have the powers of personality, including God. By recovering the correct understandings of sin and faith, Rawls hopes to do what he calls "proper ethics": "not the relating of a person to some objective 'good' for which he should strive, but … the relating of person to person and finally to God." (p. 114)

I shall say more about the conclusions of Rawls's "proper ethics" shortly. For now, note that the proper relationship among persons is one in which there is no egotism in Rawls's sense of the word. He thinks that we can live in such a relationship with others only when we see that what we take to be our accomplishments are really unmerited gifts, for only then can we appreciate the folly of seeking others' adulation. (pp. 238-39)

- II -

As Adams notes, Rawls's reading of Augustine "is neither persuasive nor fair". (p. 43) This difficulty with the critical part of A Brief Inquiry raises a question that would be asked about this book anyway, the question of why Rawls's senior thesis is interesting enough to publish.

Though the ambition, systematicity and achievement of the thesis are extraordinary for someone in his early twenties, A Brief Inquiry would not have been worth publishing if Rawls had not later accomplished what he did. Nor would the thesis hold the interest that it does if the subject matter were not so surprising. Rawls's doctoral dissertation was on a philosophical rather than a religious subject.[4] As far as I know, there are no plans to publish it; if the dissertation were published, it would be the object of far less fascination -- and would elicit far less comment -- than Rawls's undergraduate thesis.

Unlike Rawls's dissertation, A Brief Inquiry fascinates because it shows that someone whom many philosophers thought they knew well through his published work once had a very different intellectual and spiritual life. The thesis also extends a tantalizing invitation to engage in counterfactual history. Reading it in conjunction with "On My Religion" does not exactly convey the poignancy of a lost innocence that might have been kept, since there is very little innocence in A Brief Inquiry. Rawls was well aware of the war he was going off to fight after graduation and of the "demonic" character of the foe against whom it was being waged. (p. 197) But if innocence was not lost, deep religious conviction was. We cannot help but wonder how differently a great man's life would have gone had the events of mid-century affected him otherwise.[5]

Not all readers are tantalized by counterfactual history. Even those who are not are bound to experience some pleasure in finding familiar Rawlsian ideas -- such as the natural lottery and the rejection of merit -- in unexpected places. (p. 240) Further, those who know Rawls's work well may be interested to learn that claims they find puzzling were present in Rawls's thought from the start, rather than accepted later on the basis of arguments that can eventually be recovered from his mature writings.

The Rawls of Theory of Justice and beyond relies heavily on a claim that he expresses most clearly in his essay "Fairness to Goodness". There he says,

strong or inordinate desires for primary goods on the part of individuals and groups, particularly a desire for greater income and wealth and prerogatives of position, spring from insecurity and anxiety. (Collected Papers, p. 277)

The anxiety Rawls has in mind is status anxiety. Clearly such anxiety, if widespread, could destabilize a just society by moving people to seek more than their fair share. It might not move them to cheat on their taxes or otherwise break the law, but it might move them to try to change the law so that greater economic inequalities would be allowed, and political power would be, in effect, available for purchase.

Rawls argues in Theory of Justice that in a just society, the need for status is answered by public recognition as a free and equal citizen.[6] This public recognition is manifest in a just constitution, in the justification of laws and policies bearing on constitutional essentials, and in the respect citizens show one another in the public forum. This recognition removes the source of status anxiety. Secure in their status as free and equal, Rawls thinks citizens would not destabilize their society's just distribution of wealth or power: "No one," Rawls says rather optimistically, "is inclined to look beyond the constitutional affirmation of equality for further political ways of securing his status". (Theory of Justice, Harvard UP 1999, p. 477)

I am inclined to think that there are many causes of the "strong or inordinate desire for primary goods", and so I have doubts about the crucial step in the argument, the premise I said is expressed in "Fairness to Goodness". I have not found a sustained defense of this step in Rawls's later work and have wondered why he seems to have accepted it so uncritically. I now believe that he accepted it because he continued to hold a view that he first defended in the senior thesis, in his discussion of egotism. One of the characteristic desires of the egotist, Rawls says, is "that perverse desire for height", by which I take Rawls to mean a desire for relative height or superiority. (p. 193) "Egotism," he adds "is the great sin". (p. 194) The context of this remark suggests that at least part of what Rawls has in mind is that egotistic desires are the source of all sinful desires, or at least of desires to commit the most serious sins. If this suggestion is right, then even the Rawls of the thesis held that the desire for superiority is the source of "inordinate desires" for wealth, income and power. This is a view Rawls endorsed in the thesis without carefully surveying the alternatives, and he seems never to have looked back.[7]

A Brief Inquiry may anticipate some of Rawls's later claims and arguments. But are we really going to read Rawls's later philosophical work differently in light of his undergraduate thesis?

The answer depends in part upon who "we" are. Among scholars of religious ethics, Rawls is often read as defending a thoroughly secular liberalism. That he defends secular liberalism, and does not systematically engage religion in his published works, is thought to show that he is dismissive of it or antagonistic toward it. Furthermore, his dismissal of or antagonism toward religion is assumed to be rooted in his ignorance of it. A Brief Inquiry definitively refutes the charges of ignorance and dismissal. "On My Religion" puts to rest the charge of antagonism. Acquittal of these charges clears the way for a much more sympathetic reception of Rawls's work by religious ethicists who were previously suspicious or hostile.[8]

What publication of the thesis offers all readers of Rawls -- and not just religious ethicists -- is a helpful corrective to some common interpretive errors. The Rawls of Theory of Justice is sometimes read as having ranged widely if not self-indulgently over problems in ethics that are only loosely connected to political philosophy, especially in Theory of Justice, Part III. Moreover, some readings of Rawls's move from Theory of Justice to Political Liberalism treat that move less as a transition than as a rupture caused by a fundamental shift of concern. Together, these two readings suggest that Rawls produced a body of work that, while hardly incoherent, lacks a unity of focus and underlying motivation. Those who read Rawls's work this way may find their reading reinforced by the addition of A Brief Inquiry to Rawls's corpus, since his political philosophy seems quite far removed from the self-described religious orthodoxy and evident piety of the senior thesis.

I believe, on the contrary, that Rawls maintained a disciplined focus on a few questions he took to be central. Continuities of concern and motivation tie his mature work together, and -- as Nagel and Cohen stress in their introduction and as Adams argues in his essay -- there are marked continuities between that work and A Brief Inquiry. Moreover, once we identify claims in Rawls's later work that are continuous with views he held very early on, we will be drawn to readings of justice as fairness that give those claims an importance or centrality they might not otherwise seem to have had. In this way, at least, A Brief Inquiry promises to change how Rawls is sometimes read and to blunt criticisms that are sometimes made.

- III -

I have already said that Rawls's thesis is not easily summarized. Even so, I shall now try to sketch the positive view developed in the thesis in such a way that we can see the path Rawls might have followed from A Brief Inquiry to his mature views. Describing the constructive work of the thesis requires saying something about the central value of community. It is in his exposition of this value that Rawls expresses views that are the ancestors of the views he would develop later, even if the family resemblances between forebears and descendants are not apparent at first glance.

As we have seen, Rawls thinks "proper ethics" is "the relating of person to person and finally to God." (p. 114) These relations can be appropriate only when egotism and exclusivity are absent. (pp. 196ff.) When relations are appropriate, persons and God live in a single all-embracing community. Since human beings were made to live in such a community, the Rawls of A Brief Inquiry thinks that we live as the kind of creatures we are when we live in appropriate relations with God and others. (pp. 112, 121)

Rawls describes sin as "the repudiation and negation of community" rather than as a violation of divine commands. (p. 206) Salvation is the restoration to community. (p. 214) A person is saved from the effects of sin, then, when he is so changed that he lives in right relations with others, relations from which egotism has been banished. Rawls insists that Christ came to save us, and so to restore us to community with God and other persons. Rawls does not say that Christ restored community by paying a debt for us or by atoning for our sins. Rather, Christ came to effect the conversion that is necessary for us to overcome sin and live in community. He effects that conversion by revealing God's love for us. It is in light of this revelation that we can see that everything is gift. We then "cast away all thought of [our] own merit" and egotism is overcome. (p. 239)

Rawls acknowledges that conversion -- hence membership in a community -- is a matter of coming to have faith. He says, for example, that "[t]he spirit returns to the community in faith -- so we ended our discussion of the conversion experience." (p. 243) Coming to have faith is not, however, a matter of coming to accept a set of canonical propositions. That it is not is suggested by his remark that "God's Word was not primarily the revelation of some eternal truth"; "that," Rawls adds tartly, "was a Greek notion". (p. 247) Indeed, the Rawls of A Brief Inquiry does not even think that faith is a propositional attitude. Rather, he thinks it is "the openness out of which grows Christian love". (p. 243) To be converted to faith is not, therefore, to acquire new beliefs. It is to be transformed by the acquisition of new motives and new ends.

Momentary conversion would be one thing, of course, and a complete life of right relations quite another. How, then, does Rawls think community can be sustained?

Nothing Rawls says suggests that he thinks that maintaining right relations in the long run depends upon fear of punishment or damnation. This suggests that he thinks they are to be maintained because we are able to sustain the motives acquired in conversion. While he does not say how he thinks we sustain them, there is no indication that he thinks doing so requires participation in the life of a church or acceptance of its authority. Persons in community maintain right relations freely, in a robust sense of 'free'.

Right relations are not just supposed to be sustained over the long run. They are also supposed to be all-embracing. This raises the question of how ties of love can extend to all members of a universal community, most of whom are unknown to us. Rawls's answer depends, I believe, upon his claim that "all personal relations are … connected for the reason that we all exist before God, and by being related to Him we are all related to each other although we may never have met one another." (p. 116) Once we see that everyone is related to God, we know that to love God is to love others, just as treating someone well entails treating his children well. (cf. p. 116) If this is right, then just as blind obedience and fear of punishment are not needed to sustain right relations over time, so they are not needed to extend those relations beyond the scope of our acquaintance. We need God's help to sustain a universal community of love. But because grace is what Rawls calls "a pull from the front", we still sustain that community freely, in "full and perfect spontaneity". (See p. 177)

What is the good of living in community? Rawls says that God created the world to establish a community that reflects divine glory. "[T]he end toward which creation moves," he adds, "is just such a community." (p. 112) Nevertheless this end is not our end; it is God's. Moreover, I do not think Rawls thought "proper ethics" can identify some other goal we should adopt -- such as pleasing God or attaining heaven -- to which we are supposed to order living in community as means-to-end or effort-to-product. Rather, Rawls thought that an ethic which did that would lapse into naturalism. At least from our point of view, our end just is the activity of living in community. That, I believe, is at least part of what Cohen and Nagel meant when they said that the Rawls of A Brief Inquiry rejected the "goal-directed structure" of naturalism. (p. 11) Further, I believe it is what Rawls himself had in mind when he said that, contrary to naturalism, "We do not believe that the so-called 'good life' (detestable phrase) consists in seeking any object, but that it is rather something totally different, a matter of personal relations". (p. 161)

Parts of A Brief Inquiry -- such as Rawls's discussion of conversion and the conclusion, where Rawls discusses the gathering of the elect at the end of time (p. 246) -- exhibit intense religiosity. The religiosity of the thesis, together with Rawls's later claim that he was religiously orthodox when he graduated from Princeton (p. 261), threatens to obscure the continuities between Rawls's student work and his mature work as a professional philosopher. Nevertheless if my sketch of the positive view of A Brief Inquiry is accurate, it is doubtful that the Princeton senior who wrote it was an "orthodox Episcopalian Christian", Rawls's later recollections to the contrary notwithstanding (p. 261).

As I have indicated, the view Rawls develops in the thesis does depend upon some elements of orthodox Christianity -- the Incarnation (p. 111), the passion and death of Christ for humanity's sake (p. 241), the necessity of faith for salvation (p. 214), the communion of saints (pp. 245-46), the resurrection of the body (p. 139) and everlasting life (p. 252). But the ways in which Rawls interprets some of these elements, in particular the way he interprets the notion of faith and the way he understands the purpose of Christ's death, seem to me decidedly non-standard. As we have already seen, the Rawls of A Brief Inquiry did not seem to think that salvation depends upon any particular creedal commitments or upon Christ's death being an atonement for human sin. Nor did he seem to think salvation depends upon obedience to ecclesiastical authority or reception of the sacraments.[9] Moreover, it seems clear that the argument of the thesis does not depend upon any of the Christian doctrines that the Rawls of "On My Religion" said he came to doubt in the years after the war. Indeed, some of the elements of Christianity that Rawls criticized most pointedly in that essay -- such as predestination and double predestination as they are usually understood (pp. 263-64) and Christianity's encouragement of excessive concern with the state of one's own soul (p. 265) -- are clearly repudiated in A Brief Inquiry. (pp. 246-47)

If we take Rawls's later descriptions of his earlier self at face value, we may well mistake the views of the thesis and read him as a thinker of clean breaks rather than continuous development. A Brief Inquiry may stand at some intellectual distance from A Theory of Justice. Nevertheless once we map the views of the positive thesis, as I have tried to do in this section, we can rationally reconstruct the path that led Rawls from the questions taken up in the one to those taken up in the other.

- IV -

A Brief Inquiry is not a work of political philosophy. Indeed, it is frustratingly silent about how the community it discusses is related to political societies as we know them. It is tempting to read Rawls as taking for granted that we all live under political institutions and that our relations with other persons are mediated by laws and by the exercise of power. Since we can love under virtually any circumstances, however, we might think that the task of A Brief Inquiry is that of working out an ethic of interpersonal relations with which we can comply regardless of the institutions under which we happen to find ourselves.

This reading of the thesis would require that any assertions of continuity between the thesis and Rawls's later work be heavily qualified. Nevertheless I think that reading the thesis this way would be a mistake, for I do not think the Rawls of the thesis is uninterested in politics or in questions of political theory. Rather, he seems to think that the questions he takes up in the thesis are prior to political philosophy, and the problems of political philosophy will be more tractable when they are solved.

This conclusion is suggested by Rawls's treatment of -- or rather, his silence about – the terms on which members of his community would cooperate. The Rawls of A Brief Inquiry does not seem to think that those terms need to be specified or publicly announced. Instead Rawls says that anyone who has been converted just "knows his full communal obligations to men as well as to God". (p. 248) He knows them because the convert has a sustained, intense awareness of God's mercy and generosity, and "the example of the givenness and mercy of God" is what "should guide us in our communal life". (p. 249)

The impression conveyed by the thesis is that Rawls thinks if everyone converted -- if each became committed to treating everyone else as a person rather than an object -- then the political societies with which we are familiar would be unified and harmonious communities. Many of the political problems that seem most pressing, and that motivate political philosophy, would then disappear. Thus Rawls says

the reconciliation between the person and community, between the individual and society, can be understood by analyzing the concepts themselves … The dichotomy between the individual and society which Western thought has puzzled over is really no dichotomy at all. (p. 127)

Why, then, did Rawls later become interested in political philosophy? Isn't his turn to political philosophy an enormous shift?

I suggest that at least through the publication of A Theory of Justice, Rawls continued to hold a number of views that I have identified as central to A Brief Inquiry. He continued to think that we have a social nature, but in Theory of Justice as in A Brief Inquiry, he did not mean by this that living in society is the way we naturally attain some further goal which may itself be natural to us in some way. Rather, he meant that when we live in society characterized by right relations among persons considered as such, we conduct ourselves as the kind of beings we are. Living in such a society, he thought, we "express our nature as moral persons" (Theory of Justice p. 503). Rawls also continued to think that the unity and harmony of that society must be sustained by the free activity of its members, rather than by fear of punishment or submission to authority. So he continued to think that we can express our nature by living in a large-scale society only if that society is -- as he would later say -- "stable for the right reasons".

Figuring out what such a society would have to be like remained Rawls's driving concern, but he came to think that conversion to the type of Christianity found in his thesis is neither sufficient nor necessary to bring about a society of this kind. Further, Rawls came to see that understanding how persons can live in such a society while maintaining their individuality would not dissolve the fundamental problems of political philosophy. It would require him to confront those problems head-on.

Why wouldn't universal conversion, as Rawls understood it in A Brief Inquiry, be enough to bring about a harmonious community? The answer is found in a memorable passage in Theory of Justice, where Rawls wrote:

In an association of saints agreeing on a common ideal, if such a community could exist, disputes about justice would not occur. Each would work selflessly for one end as determined by their common religion, and reference to this end (assuming it could be clearly defined) would settle every question of right. (A Theory of Justice, p. 112 [emphasis added])

As we have seen, the common religion of A Brief Inquiry is not "clearly defined" and conversion to it is not a matter of accepting a collective belief system or a common creed. So while the Rawls of the thesis may have thought that everyone who converts "knows his full communal obligations", the Rawls of Theory of Justice thought this was far too sanguine, for it is far from clear that the duties the converted then take themselves to be under will not conflict. Indeed, he openly acknowledges the possibility of conflict, observing that "the spiritual ideals of saints and heroes can be as irreconcilably opposed as any other interests." (A Theory of Justice, p. 112)

Common terms of cooperation would therefore need to be specified even in the event of universal conversion. The question is where they would come from. While everyone who is converted may love God, love of God does not itself specify or reveal the content of our duties, let alone "settle every question of right" or dissolve the questions of political philosophy. That is precisely why Rawls remarks later in Theory of Justice that "the solution propounded by the religious ethic is only apparent". (p. 486) Moreover, as we have seen, conversion does not require acknowledgement of a religious authority who could say what serving God requires, nor is there some further point or dominant end to be served by the activity of living in community from which the terms can be derived.[10] Thus the "proper ethic" of A Brief Inquiry does not provide the resources to specify terms of cooperation, once the indeterminacy of religious ethics is apparent. Rawls eventually concluded, of course, that abiding by terms of cooperation expresses our nature only if those terms are specified by principles of justice we would give ourselves.

If conversion, faith and grace are not sufficient to bring about and sustain a community expressive of our nature, they might still be necessary. That would be so if, as the Rawls of A Brief Inquiry thought, conversion, grace and faith were necessary to maintain appropriate relations with others over time or to extend personal -- as opposed to natural -- relations beyond our circle of intimacy and care. Nevertheless the Rawls of Theory of Justice denied the necessity of conversion as well as its sufficiency. He thought that a conception of justice, when institutionalized and publicized, can stabilize itself by fostering a sense of justice and encouraging supportive attitudes.

It might not be inappropriate to describe this acquisition of a good will as a "conversion",[11] since conversion as described in A Brief Inquiry -- like the development of a sense of justice -- is a transformation of our motives and ends.[12] This transformation is not, however, the dramatic religious conversion of the senior thesis. It is the slow formation of our character by the institutions of a just society. Figuring out how we can live in communities expressive of our nature -- and how we can live socially without losing our individuality -- thus led Rawls not only to questions about the demands of political justice but also to questions of constitutional design.

- V -

Let me emphasize that despite the continuities between A Brief Inquiry and A Theory of Justice, the story of Rawls's move from one to the other is a story of significant philosophical development. I certainly do not mean that Rawls would have described his fundamental concerns in the same way in 1942 as he would have in 1971. Moreover, the story I have told is one at which I have arrived by trying rationally to reconstruct Rawls's path over three decades and more. I do not mean that he wrote A Theory of Justice to repair the arguments of his undergraduate thesis; the relationship between A Brief Inquiry and Theory of Justice is therefore very different than that between Theory of Justice and Political Liberalism. But if the story I have told is right, then Rawls held to certain core commitments and concerns over many years. The persistence of those concerns and commitments goes some way toward showing that the continuities in Rawls's thought are at least as interesting and illuminating as the ruptures, and that the size of the breaks in his work may be greatly exaggerated.

I noted earlier that publication of Rawls's senior thesis and "On My Religion" may gain Rawls a more sympathetic reading among religious ethicists because these writings dispel the impression that Rawls was hostile to or uninformed about religion. Rawls's liberalism is also criticized, in religious quarters and elsewhere, for being objectionably individualist. If what I have said here about his driving concerns is right, then the thesis puts a great deal of pressure on those who press this objection. Rawls always held that we have a social nature which can be expressed only in a community in which no one is moved by what A Brief Inquiry refers to as a "perverse desire for height". (p. 193) The common assertions that Rawls denies our natural sociality, and that Rawlsian citizens would lack a robust concern for common goods, cannot withstand a careful reading of Rawls's mature writings. Publication of Rawls's senior thesis shows that these charges also distort views he held from his earliest foray into social philosophy.


[1] I am grateful to Robert Adams, Peter de Marneffe, Eric Gregory, Thomas Nagel and David Solomon for helpful comments on an earlier draft.

[2] In his "Note on the Text", Nagel says that he tried without success to identify "the translation from which Rawls's biblical quotations come". (p. 104) Having tried to identify the translation myself, I can testify to how time-consuming a task that is. I now believe that the reason Nagel and I failed is not that Rawls relied on a translation that has somehow escaped our discovery. Like other people who had a religious education and whose families attended church regularly, Rawls would have had significant exposure to the Bible growing up, probably to the King James Version. The biblical citations in his thesis look to me like those of someone who had a very retentive mind, who knew the Bible well and who -- under the pressure of time -- tried to quote it from memory. Thus some of Rawls's quotations, like that of Ezekiel 18:4 on p. 206, match the King James Version exactly. In other places, such as p. 245 where he attempts to quote Mark 16:15, Rawls departed from the KJV only slightly. In still other places, Rawls seems to have recalled the sense of the passages he meant to quote, but he expressed the sense of those passages in language that differs quite pronouncedly from all the English, German and Latin editions of the Bible I have consulted. An especially interesting misquotation is found on p. 137. There Rawls cites Genesis 1:31, which in the King James Version begins "And God saw everything that he had made, and, behold, it was very good." Rawls rendered the end of the sentence "and very good it was" -- a case in which, I suspect, he had made the well-known text his own by rewording it to fit his own sense of poetry or the cadences of his inner speech.

[3] Gregory subsequently published a very interesting essay on the thesis: "Before the Original Position: The Neo-Orthodox Theology of the Young John Rawls", Journal of Religious Ethics 35 (2007): 179-206.

[4] Rawls's dissertation, A study in the grounds of ethical knowledge: considered with reference to judgments on the moral worth of character, was submitted to the Princeton Philosophy Department in 1950. It is a non-circulating item in Princeton's Mudd Library, call number PRIN 685.1950.54.

[5] The conclusion of Gregory, "Before the Original Position", captures this nicely; see also Luke Coppen, "Rawls at the Crossroads", http://www.amconmag.com/article/2009/apr/20/00031/.

[6] To grasp the importance of this claim, see its role in Joshua Cohen, "Taking People as They Are", Philosophy and Public Affairs 30 (2001): 363-86.

[7] Adams is especially good on this point (p. 79); I am grateful to Allen Wood for helpful correspondence on this matter.

[8] Some reviewers of A Brief Inquiry have gone further, claiming that with the undergraduate thesis in hand, we can see that Rawls relied on religious premises at crucial points in A Theory of Justice; see the reviews by William Galston at http://blogs.tnr.com/tnr/blogs/galston/archive/2009/04/06/on-rawls.aspx and Peter Berkowitz at http://www.hoover.org/publications/policyreview/46479972.html. Like Nagel and Cohen (p. 5), I believe that Rawls's mature writings grow out of concerns that can be described as religious; whether those concerns are theistic is harder to say. But I think it is a mistake to suppose that Rawls took religious claims as premises, even suppressed ones, though I cannot examine alternative interpretations here.

[9] Let me make my doubts about the orthodoxy of the young Rawls more precise. The 1928 edition of the Book of Common Prayer, which is the edition Rawls would have grown up with, includes a Catechism with "articles of faith". Rawls commits himself to a number of the articles in the course of the thesis. While he does not deny any of the articles, the views expressed in A Brief Inquiry are consistent with the falsity of at least half of them. The Catechism can be found on-line at: http://justus.anglican.org/resources/bcp/1928Standard/catechism.pdf

[10] For the notion of a dominant end, see Rawls, A Theory of Justice, pp. 480-86.

[11] John Rawls, Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy (Harvard University Press, 2000), ed. Herman, p. 155.

[12] The laws of moral development "characterize transformations of our pattern of final ends". (Theory of Justice, p. 432)