Narrative conceptions of agency have attracted considerable philosophical interest in recent years, and both of these books make significant contributions to the growing literature on this theme. Each treats a wide range of related concepts, including not just narrative agency itself but also personal and practical identity, temporality and the self, practical reasoning, and autonomy.
Kim Atkins' Narrative Identity and Moral Identity is a book about the nature of human selfhood. Atkins uses the terms "selfhood" and "identity" interchangeably, and approaches her subject in part through a discussion of theories of personal identity. Her central interest, however, is in practical rather than metaphysical identity. A person, in the sense of interest to Atkins, is a practical unity of first-, second-, and third-personal perspectives (more on this below), and questions about personal identity, in her sense, are questions about the continuity of this practical unity over time.
Atkins adopts Christine Korsgaard's conception of practical identity as "a description under which you value yourself, a description under which you find your life to be worth living and your actions to be worth undertaking" (1). Like Korsgaard, Atkins takes practical identities to give rise to reasons. As she puts it, "who I think I am provides the reasons for what I do and how I think, including how I think about myself" (66). Her central thesis, however, is that practical identities are narrative identities: "the description under which we value ourselves and our lives takes a narrative form" (1). Here Atkins goes beyond Korsgaard in specifying that the kind of unity required for human agency is specifically narrative unity. On this picture, our reasons flow from the narratives we construct in response to the self-directed questions "Who am I?" and "How should I live?".
The book has seven chapters in addition to Atkins' introduction. The first chapter explores the roots of contemporary debates about personal identity in Locke, Hume, and Kant, and culminates in a discussion of Kant's distinction between transcendental and empirical apperception. Selfhood, for Kant, is bi-perspectival in the sense that it involves both awareness of the 'I' as a principle of the unity of consciousness and awareness of the 'I' as appearance. In the second chapter, Atkins draws on Marcel and Merleau-Ponty to argue that the bi-perspectival nature of human selfhood is explained by the fact of human embodiment. The human subject is both a body that sees and perceives and a body that is capable of being seen and perceived, including, significantly, by itself. In Atkins' terminology, this is to say that human selfhood is a unity of (at least) two perspectives, namely, the first- and the third-personal. Further, these perspectives imply one another: if I were not an object in the world, I would not be capable of having a first-personal perspective on the world, and if I did not have a first-personal perspective on the world, I would have no point of view from which to perceive myself, third-personally, as an object in the world. In Chapter 3 Atkins argues that the first- and third-personal perspectives that are unified in human selfhood also imply a second-personal perspective. Developmentally speaking, human selfhood is a product of shared embodiment: it is acquired through bodily and social engagement with others who care for us, teach us, and, ultimately, subject us to interpersonal standards of evaluation and justification. Being held to such standards presupposes second-personal competence to answer to specific others in relation to whom we articulate our identities.
The upshot of the first three chapters is that an adequate account of personal identity (in Atkins' practical sense) will have to explain how these three perspectives are integrated in temporally extended, human selfhood. Chapter 4 is the core of the book, since it is here that Atkins defends the thesis that only a narrative conception of practical identity can successfully do this. Using Marya Schectman's account of narrative self-constitution as a springboard, Atkins argues that my continuing to be who I am cannot be fully explained by impersonal causal relations that hold between person-stages, but requires the continuity of a first-personal perspective from which I am able to own or attribute actions to myself "from the inside". She agrees with Schectman that the continuity of the first-personal perspective must be understood in narrative terms, and argues, further, that only a narrative model can make sense of selfhood as a unity of all three of the perspectives she distinguishes in earlier chapters.
Atkins argues that continuity of selfhood depends on the activity of "secondary reflection" -- a form of reflection that responds to, and seeks to resolve, disturbances to my sense of self. Secondary reflection is a kind of inner dialogue in which I attempt to answer questions about who I am and what I should do by "appropriat[ing] my third-personal attributes as my own from my first-personal perspective to myself in the second person" (65). Atkins also refers to this as a process of "self-constancy", through which I undertake to continue as the person I think I am. When one engages in this process, one looks both forward and backward, attempting to integrate one's past, present, and anticipated future into a coherent, chronologically ordered whole that is intelligible from one's own point of view. This is where narrative comes in: the accounts we give of ourselves, when we engage in secondary reflection, achieve such integration between past, present, and future insofar as they take a narrative form. Borrowing from Ricoeur, Atkins argues that the coherence of our experience depends on its being ordered in a rule-governed succession, and that narrative interpretation brings such an ordering to our experience by allowing us to experience events not just as falling into chronological sequences but as bearing causal relations to one another and as following trajectories from beginning, to middle, to end. This narrative view integrates all three perspectives involved in human selfhood in something like the following way: accounts of oneself are given from a first-personal perspective, addressed to an actual or implied other, and serve to link third-personally describable elements of a life (actors, objects, motives, circumstances, and so forth) into a "temporally extended, causally related coherent whole, with a beginning, a middle, and an end" (76).
In Chapter 5, Atkins goes on to argue that narrative selfhood has an ethical aim: "the aim of living a good life with and for others in just institutions" (80). Here Atkins argues that continuity in identity is agential continuity, that agents are "subjects of imputation" (that is, they can be held to account for their actions), and that in this sense agents "always already" operate within a moral community. Practical identity is articulated within a moral sphere -- or, more accurately, within a plurality of moral spheres. (Atkins regards family, ethnicity, religion, and so forth as demarcating distinct moral spheres.) Against the backdrop of these multiple spheres of interpretation, moral identity is rendered coherent by the overall narrative unity of a life. Substantively speaking, good lives may differ widely from one another depending on cultural and other affiliations. But formally speaking, a good life just is a narratively unified, well-integrated one. The achievement of such unity requires protection from various sources of fragmentation and violation, which in turn requires both solicitude ("spontaneous receptivity and responsiveness to each other" (93)) and a framework of just institutions.
In Chapter 6, Atkins considers how we handle situations of tragic conflict and other threats to our agential unity or integrity, and argues that Jan Bransen's account of how we choose "alternatives" of ourselves aptly captures the kind of practical wisdom we need to exercise in such situations. Finally, in Chapter 7 Atkins places her account of narrative agency within the literature on relational autonomy, drawing in particular on Diana Meyers' view that autonomy consists in "a set of socially acquired practical competencies in self-discovery, self-definition, and self-direction" (125). Atkins argues that the practical competencies or skills we need for autonomous or self-governed agency are, precisely, narrative competencies -- the very skills we exercise in giving narratively structured self-accounts that unify our agency over time.
Atkins' book is ambitious and wide-ranging, and contains much of interest not only to narrative theorists but also to anyone interested in theories of agency and moral psychology more generally. I cannot possibly do justice to all of her arguments here. But I would like to press a line of questioning about her central thesis: Why must our practical identities be narrative identities? Otherwise put, why must the answers we give to questions asked in secondary reflection be narrative in form, if they are to secure the continuity of our agency over time?
In a pivotal passage in Chapter 4, Atkins gives roughly the following argument for her thesis:
1. Selfhood is a unity of first-, second-, and third-personal perspectives on one's attributes.
2. These three perspectives mutually imply and explain one another.
3. Attributes that make up the agent's identity must cohere with this multi-perspectival structure.
4. So, the attributes that make up the agent's identity must also mutually imply and explain one another.
5. Only narrative accounts can capture these relations of mutual implication and explanation.
Premises 1 and 2 are defended in Chapters 2 and 3, as outlined above. Premise 3 does not seem problematic. But how exactly does 4 follow?
Let's consider what it would be for an attribute (say, my being a devoted parent) to cohere with the multi-perspectival structure of selfhood that Atkins lays out. As I understand the view, the attribute would have to be capable of figuring in an account that I could give in response to questions about who I am and what I should do, as these arise in the process of secondary reflection. This account would have to be intelligible both from my own point of view, as I look forward and back, and to the (implied or actual) audience I address. Finally, it would have to be consistent with basic facts accessible from a third-personal perspective. My self-accounts are thus constrained in various ways -- by my own history and aspirations, my embodied nature, my social context and relations, and by what Atkins calls, simply, reality.
It is not clear why the attributes internal to my temporally extended practical identity would themselves have to stand in relations of mutual explanation and implication in order to meet these various constraints. Consider Atkins' example of Susan, a woman who is fixated on the (mistaken) idea that she has royal ancestry. Atkins points out that this purported attribute is not implied or explained by any of Susan's other attributes. But Susan's self-account also fails to meet the constraints imposed by the tri-perspectival structure of selfhood in more straightforward ways. For example, it manifestly fails the reality test (as Atkins herself points out), and it just as clearly cannot satisfy interpersonal standards of justification.
It is plausible that, even apart from such social and factual requirements, consistency with one's other attributes is necessary in order for an agent to successfully appropriate an attribute as her own. But a set of attributes might be internally consistent without its members actually standing in relations of mutual implication or explanation with one another. My being a devoted parent is neither explained nor implied by my being a professional philosopher, nor is the latter explained or implied by the former. Yet these aspects of my practical identity are (I hope) at least consistent with one another, and may form part of an identity that is intelligible overall. Certainly, in some circumstances practical conflicts will arise between the demands imposed on me by these two aspects of my identity, and in such cases I will have tough decisions to make. But these are conflicts that arise for me as a unified agent confronted with reasons to act in different ways -- not the kind of conflict that undermines the unity of my agency in the first place. Being a parent and being a philosopher may both be sources of genuine reasons for me, even if they do not explain or imply one another.
Of course, Atkins need not claim that each of my attributes must stand in relations of mutual explanation or implication with every other. Her view seems rather to be that each attribute that is internal to my identity must be explained or implied by some other attribute of mine. But it is not clear why even this must be so, given that (as I understand it) it does not seem to be demanded by the tri-perspectival structure of selfhood itself.
Even setting aside such questions about 4, certain questions remain about 5. Atkins sees narrative as uniquely suited to integrate one's attributes into a unified identity because of the way (on the model of narrative she favors) it articulates causal links between aspects of the agent's experience and organizes them teleologically. But even if self-accounts that take a narrative form are in fact capable of constituting or preserving agential unity, it is not yet clear that only narrative accounts can do this. Consider a young, recently married man who is out late with friends and hasn't thought to call his wife to let her know where he is. One of his friends asks him why he hasn't called her -- "You're married now," he says. "You have to call!" Our young man may well be brought up short by this disruption to his sense of self, and (pausing to engage in secondary reflection) realize that he does indeed have reason to act differently. But in this kind of case, his self-account might simply cite, and re-affirm, his identity as husband: "That's right, I'm married. And calling in this kind of situation is part of what being married requires of me." This snippet of secondary reflection is not narrative in form (he does not, for example, refer to the history of his relationship with his wife, nor does he connect the requirement to call to a projected future of marital harmony), but it does seem to meet the intelligibility-constraints imposed by the tri-perspectival structure of the self: the account he offers makes sense to himself, his audience, and from an impersonal point of view. So why should it be ruled out?
The diachronic nature of human agency has attracted considerable philosophical attention of late, and has inspired several alternative models of agential unity. To mention a few examples, Michael Bratman's planning theory of agency, Agnieszka Jaworska's care-based conception of minimal autonomy, and John Christman's historical account of autonomy all attempt to do justice to the temporal extension of agency without invoking narrative -- or, at least, without invoking it in any very substantial way. (As I note below, Christman does invoke narrative in his historical account, but only in a much thinner sense.) The challenge for Atkins is to show not only that narrative can make sense of ourselves and our lives, but that without it we cannot achieve the agential unity required to lead coherent or good lives. While I would not go so far as to claim that Atkins is wrong about the role of narrative in self-constitution, I do think that a substantial burden of proof remains on her shoulders.
Atkins and Mackenzie's edited volume, Practical Identity and Narrative Agency, is organized around many of the same themes that are central to Atkins' own book. Its papers treat topics including the relationship between metaphysical and practical identity, the relationship between practical reasoning and practical identity, the reflective capacities required for practical reasoning and autonomy, and, of course, the role of narrative in all of the above. For the most part I will limit myself to brief summaries of the main claims defended in each paper, and will reserve my more extended remarks for those that most centrally involve the concept of narrative.
The first part of the book is devoted to three papers on personal identity and continuity. Marya Schectman's paper "Staying Alive: Personal Continuation and a Life Worth Having" probes the relationship between personal identity and practical concerns. In response to Eric Olson, Schectman develops a non-animalist account of the kind of personal unity that underlies the very possibility of raising questions about a person's autonomy and responsibility for past actions. Her account of this underlying unity is neither purely biological nor purely psychological but, rather, based on her notion of a "person-life" -- a cluster concept that incorporates a range of biological, psychological, and higher order reflective capacities that typically make up a person's life. Caroline West's paper "Personal Identity: Practical or Metaphysical?" is also a critical response to Olson's animalism. West argues that the metaphysical facts of personal identity cannot be severed from practical questions about (for example) the conditions of obligation, entitlement, responsibility and regret. She argues that "person" is a social kind, with persistence conditions that are partly determined by individual and community practices. Kim Atkins' contribution, "Narrative Identity and Embodied Continuity," is of a piece with the more extended arguments in her book. Here she argues that the complex structure of first-, second-, and third-personal perspectives that constitutes a unified self cuts across the psychological/bodily divide, and that continuity of one's embodied identity is a matter of continuity in one's self-narrated life story.
The papers in the second part of the book all focus in one way or another on the deliberative, reflective, and imaginative capacities involved in constituting the identities of temporally extended agents. In "Personal Identity Management," Jan Bransen is concerned with deliberative situations in which I am faced not with the question "What should I do?" but "Who should I be?" and, more particularly, with the question "How can I determine the best alternative of myself?". Bransen argues that to determine the best way of continuing "as the person one is" (102), one must try to develop and empathically access a range of different motivational profiles and, in a sort of imaginative "dry run", assess which will result in the optimal balance of agent satisfaction over agent regret -- or, otherwise put, which will give one peace of mind. Catriona Mackenzie's paper, "Imagination, Identity, and Self-Transformation," also concerns the role of imaginative projection in self-transformative decisions. Drawing on Bransen's view that conflicts within the self require us to select among possible alternatives of oneself, Mackenzie argues that agents resolve such conflicts by generating a series of different self-narratives and attempting to determine which makes the most sense. But such narratives help rather than mislead the deliberating agent only when they can stand up to assessment from an external perspective that is constrained by the agent's embodied subjectivity, autobiographical memory, cultural context and social interactions, and practical identity. In his paper "Why Search for Lost Time? Memory, Autonomy, and Practical Reason," John Christman shifts the focus from imaginative projection to autobiographical memory. Drawing on cases of anterograde amnesia, Christman argues that autobiographical memory appears to be necessary to the construction of a temporally extended self-concept. Without autobiographical memory one cannot interpret past events and actions as forming part of a coherent self-narrative, and cannot identify prior plans or normative commitments as one's own in the affective and experiential sense required for non-alienated, autonomous decision-making and action.
Part three of the book collects four papers under the heading "Selfhood and Normative Agency". In "The Way of the Wanton," J. David Velleman offers an alternative reading of Harry Frankfurt's analysis of identification, on which the phenomenology of agency, rather than the problem of agential authority, takes center stage. On Velleman's interpretation, reflective consciousness itself has the effect of distancing us from our motives, and the role of second-order volitions is to bridge this reflective gap and put us back in touch with the mechanisms that guide our behavior. Velleman suggests, further, that we can eliminate the gap entirely (rather than merely bridging it) by losing ourselves in skilled activities. This sort of "higher wantonness", as Velleman calls it, is similar both to the sort of spontaneous activity recommended in the Daoist Zhuangzi and to the "flow" experiences described by psychologist Mihaly Csikszentmihalyi. In her paper "Losing One's Self," Cheshire Calhoun explores other experiences that might be described as involving a loss of self, but in a very different sense. Calhoun considers cases of depression, demoralization, and other volitionally disabling conditions under which persons might be "unmoved by their own reasons for action or have ceased to be able to see any point in deliberating about what to do" (193). She argues that our having motivating reasons for action depends on certain background "frames of agency" being in place, including a lack of estrangement from one's normative perspective, a belief in the effectiveness of instrumental reasoning, and confidence in one's security against tragic misfortune or indecent harm. In their paper "Normative Agency," Jeanette Kennett and Steve Matthews argue that agents unify themselves over time by adopting normative reasons for action, and that narratives that constitute or approximate the best continuation of an agent's life story are an important source of such reasons. Moreover, they argue, moral competence is inseparable from the more general normative competence required for temporally extended agency. They argue that these theses are confirmed by cases of Dissociative Identity Disorder (DID) and psychopathy, whose sufferers display disunified agency (and, in the latter case, severe moral deficits) along with broad failures of practical reason and normative understanding. Individuals with such deficits are unable to secure the special goods that are available to narratively unified agents, including, centrally, the good of "living a valuable life understood as a coherent biography" (213). Christopher Cordner's paper "Remorse and Moral Identity" argues that one's moral identity is derived from obligations to others that are revealed in the experience of remorse. As Cordner understands it, remorse is a negative, affective experience in which one is shocked by the recognition of another to whom one is "tied" or obligated, and whose claims one has violated. The experience of remorse is "transsocial" in the sense that the bonds it reveals are no less than the bonds of common humanity, and the capacity for this experience is required for "any serious understanding of the moral equality of all human beings" (247).
The two papers in the final part of the book both draw directly on narrative concepts to illustrate complex relationships between different temporal perspectives within (or on) a life. In "Shaping a Life: Narrative, Time, and Necessity," Genevieve Lloyd connects Spinoza's "vision of freedom as the joyful acceptance and appropriation of necessity" (257) back to the ideals of the ancient Stoics and forward to Sartre's reflections on "posthumous living" in his autobiography Words. Lloyd suggests that we can get a grip on Spinoza's idea through the concept of narrative necessity, particularly as it operates in autobiographical writing. The autobiographer writes as though from a future perspective on his or her own life as a completed whole, in which the contingency of the present is transformed into the fixity of the past and the end is prefigured in the beginning. The sort of "backward living" exemplified in the form of autobiographical narrative is, Lloyd suggests, familiar to us as narrators of our own lives: we exercise freedom in "impos[ing] a pattern of necessity on the fragments" (264) that make up our lives, treating them as having a sort of fixity that in fact eludes us as long as we continue to live. Finally, in "How to Change the Past" Karen Jones investigates the role of narrative interpretation in shaping our emotions, with a particular focus on love. Jones argues that being in love is an interpretation-sensitive, trajectory-dependent property. It is trajectory-dependent because it has temporally-extended truth-makers: whether one counts as being in love at a particular time (as opposed, for example, to simply having a stomach ache) depends, in part, on what happens "elsewhen" -- and, in particular, on the eventual place of one's thoughts, feelings, and actions in a narratively structured whole. It is interpretation-sensitive because conceptualizing one's experience as being in love makes it more likely that the relevant truth-making trajectory will actually unfold, by providing one with a set of culturally available scripts to follow.
Along with Mackenzie's introduction, which helpfully contextualizes and thematizes the volume, these papers treat a rich array of interrelated topics. They are not only individually worth reading, but also resonate with one another and work well together as a collection. As Mackenzie points out, a significant number of contributors treat narrative, and especially narrative self-interpretation, as central to "the intelligibility and value of our lives as persons" (24). I will use the remainder of this review to consider some of the themes and issues that arise in these papers in more detail.
One recurring theme is the way in which the construction of self-narratives can help to guide us through deliberative predicaments by providing us reasons for proceeding in one way rather than another -- including predicaments that destabilize our practical identities and lead to self-transformation. Kim Atkins, Jan Bransen, Catriona Mackenzie, and Jeanette Kennett and Steve Matthews all develop variations on this theme. Atkins, as already noted, commits herself to the view that agential continuity over time depends on the continuity of a self-narrated life story. But it is not clear that we need to go this far in order to make the point that our self-narrations can be a source of reasons -- indeed, as Kennett and Matthews put it, an important source of reasons (213) -- and so contribute to a fuller picture of human agency and practical reasoning. Each of the papers on this theme brings to light, in its own way, the agential significance of our capacity to imaginatively project ourselves into the future, along with the constraints of coherence and intelligibility to which such projections are subject.
Christman's paper stands apart from those just mentioned insofar as it focuses instead on our relationship to our pasts -- on autobiographical memory rather than on imaginative projection into the future. In it Christman develops a new twist on a historical conception of autonomy that he has defended elsewhere, suggesting that narrative self-understanding in the form of autobiographical memory is required for us to meet the authenticity condition on autonomous choice and action. It is worth noting that the concept of narrative itself is not, by Christman's own lights, doing much of the heavy lifting here. In a related paper, to which he refers in the work under discussion, Christman argues that on the most common substantive accounts of narrative connectivity (including, in particular, causal, teleological, and thematic accounts), "the condition of narrativity for the unity of selves, persons, and personalities is either implausible or otiose". He argues there that narrative unity is a plausible condition for selfhood or unity of consciousness only when interpreted so broadly that any agent who engages in reflective self-interpretation on a sequence of events within her life, and is able "to make sense of these according to socially mediated semantic rules," will meet it. It is this thin, highly flexible notion of narrative that Christman employs in his paper in this volume.
This is not the place to engage in detailed discussion of Christman's critique of narrativity. I mention it, however, because I think it poses a useful challenge to all who want to make use of the concept: we must be specific about the notion(s) of narrativity we are employing, and be mindful of apparent limitations of its (their) canonical forms. The authors in this volume are not unaware of these issues. Atkins is among the most explicit about the notion of narrative connectivity she embraces, which incorporates both causal and teleological elements. Aspects of both are, I think, present in Kennett and Matthews as well. Kennett and Matthews also take up the question of how much narrative unity a life requires, and defend the idea that normatively speaking, unity of a whole life (as opposed to local unity within a plurality of narrative strands) is important. Other authors (including Mackenzie, in her introduction) seem attracted to a more flexible notion of narrativity. Mackenzie acknowledges critiques by Christman and by Galen Strawson, but thinks these critiques target an overly narrow conception of narrativity. She argues that narrative theorists of agency are not committed to the view that we "live our lives as stories" (15), and that to read them in this spirit is to miss the important points they have to make about the nature of practical reason and self-constitution. As Mackenzie depicts it, narrative is a very general sort of unifying structure that allows us to identify and forge "patterns of coherence and psychological intelligibility within our lives, connecting our first-personal perspectives to our history, actions, emotions, desires, beliefs, character traits, and so on" (12). It may well be that such a broad and flexible notion of narrative is most useful in discussions of practical identity and unified agency. But if so, it does begin to seem that the term "narrative" is serving, as Christman suggests, as shorthand for whatever emerges from the process of making sense of our lives -- and that if we are not careful, we may be misled by the traditional, literary connotations of the term.
The final two papers in the volume, however, do make interesting use of the term's specifically literary connotations: Lloyd draws on the literary genre of autobiography, which organizes different temporal perspectives on oneself in specific ways, while Jones focuses on trajectories or "scripts" that are characterized by the sense-oriented structure of story-telling. (In the kind of structure that Jones has in mind, the meaning of earlier events or episodes is derived from their place within a temporally extended whole.) It is striking that these two papers also mark a shift in emphasis in the volume, from a preoccupation with questions of practical identity and agential authority to a concern with the potentially liberating experience of a certain kind of necessitation. This theme is most explicit in Lloyd's paper, which, as discussed above, attempts to make sense of a Spinozistic vision of freedom as the joyful embrace of necessity. Lloyd seeks to shed light on an alternative to the dominant, Cartesian account of freedom as a matter of control by the will, and, in the process, writes quite movingly about the human confrontation with the unavoidable. But Jones, too, implicitly draws on a form of narrative necessitation insofar as she argues that understanding one's experiences under a certain description triggers the organizational and guiding force of associated stories or scripts. Necessitating as they are, these scripts are ones that we often willingly embrace, and whose structuring force in our lives we also want others to recognize and acknowledge.
The connection between freedom and necessitation that emerges in the last part of the book resonates in interesting ways with themes developed in the later work of Harry Frankfurt, including, in particular, Frankfurt's concept of volitional necessity. It is perhaps surprising that Frankfurt's work remains so much off-stage in this volume. After all, many of the papers presented in this volume are deeply informed and influenced by the work of Korsgaard and Velleman, work that is itself shaped in significant ways by engagement with Frankfurtian themes. (Velleman's own paper in this volume, though not about narrative, is a case in point.) Frankfurt's earlier work did much to reorient moral psychology around questions of identification, alienation, and agential authority, the enduring import of which is evident in many of the contributions to the first three parts of the book. The papers in the last part of the book point, I think, in a somewhat different direction, more in accord with the preoccupations of the later Frankfurt. They suggest that narrativity may be of particular use in fleshing out the still less-widely discussed theme of freedom in necessitation, a theme which, as Lloyd reminds us, has long been at the core of an alternative philosophical narrative about the nature of human agency.