Hermann Weyl

Mind and Nature: Selected Writings on Philosophy, Mathematics, and Physics

Hermann Weyl, Mind and Nature: Selected Writings on Philosophy, Mathematics, and Physics, Peter Pesic (ed.), Princeton UP, 2009, 261pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691135458.

Reviewed by Brandon Fogel, University of Chicago


It is commonplace for scholars of Hermann Weyl (1885-1955) to lament his lack of standing among philosophers of science of the 20th century. He is remembered foremost as a mathematician, indeed as one of the greatest of the period, and secondarily as a physicist, one who laid the groundwork for the theories that have come to dominate high-energy physics over the past 50 years. Yet Weyl also wrote on the philosophical implications of his technical work, with a sophistication unrivalled by other working scientists, then or since. For various reasons, these writings have not received a great deal of attention from Anglophone philosophers, at least not until very recently. Peter Pesic's collection is the latest, and to date most significant, salvo in the effort to bring long overdue attention to Weyl's philosophical ideas, particularly those regarding science and its integration with mathematics.

Pesic's volume presents nine works by Weyl covering nearly 35 years, from 1921 to 1955 (also included is a brief note on relativity by Einstein, published together with a longer note from Weyl in 1922). Two of these works have never before been published and are the result of research by Pesic at the Weyl archive in Zurich. Another two have not previously appeared in English and are given new translations by Pesic. Of the remaining five works, only two can be found in the seemingly exhaustive, four-volume Collected Works of Hermann Weyl (1968).

This new collection thus serves two immediate purposes: to make easily available some of Weyl's shorter and lesser known works on philosophical topics, and to consolidate those works into a unified whole, one that can be examined for central themes and also compared to Weyl's treatise Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science (1949, hereafter PMNS). The comparison is complex and important, due to the fact that PMNS is really two books in one, the first a translation of the original, written in German in 1926 and only lightly modified for the English edition, and the second a lengthy set of appendices newly written for the 1949 publication, extensive enough to serve as a monograph on their own. Pesic's volume covers the period between the German and English editions (and beyond), thus facilitating a detailed examination of the evolution of Weyl's ideas.

Pesic also includes a valuable 19-page introduction that describes Weyl's life, gives synopses of his philosophical views, and contextualizes the works in the collection. The portrait he paints is of a man who approached his work and life with great openness, for whom rationality and passion were indissolubly intertwined. For Weyl, the scientific and the aesthetic were merely different modes of access to a fundamental truth: the world of experience, represented symbolically, points beyond itself into an open field of possibility. This was not merely an academic notion for him; for example, as Pesic notes, Weyl was "sensitive to the erotic aspects of scientific creativity", going so far as to credit the success of Schrödinger, his good friend, in formulating quantum wave mechanics to an intense love affair, a "late erotic outburst" (pp. 3-5). Weyl's scientific achievements thus should not be viewed independently of his philosophical or even artistic interests. His frequent quoting of philosophers, poets, and literary figures from all eras gives evidence of the inspiration he drew from them. Pesic -- a polymath himself, as accomplished in the history and philosophy of science and mathematics as in music and music theory -- puts it well: "Weyl gained perspective, insight, and altitude by thinking back along the ever-unfolding past and studying its great thinkers, whom he used to help him soar, like a bird feeling the air under its wings" (p. 13).

The main virtue of Pesic's volume is that the dominant themes of Weyl's epistemology are made prominent through repetition in the various works and clarified through presentation from different angles or with different, illuminating analogies. While Weyl's ideas did evolve over the 35 years covered by the nine selections, there is a core that remains consistent and that undergirds the specific applications to physics and mathematics. This core is focused around what Weyl refers to as the "twofold nature of the ego", the capacity for self-reflection and introspection on the one hand, and the ability to engage in causal interactions with external entities on the other. For Weyl, neither aspect of the ego is primary; rather, the two are inseparable, in a way that has consequences for every aspect of human cognition. Of the many uses that Weyl makes of this distinction, three are emphasized often enough in Pesic's volume that they come to feel like mantras. These are: (1) the constructive relation between consciousness and reality, (2) the mutual importance of reflection and creativity, and (3) the mapping of the distinction between subject and object onto the distinction between the absolute and the relative. I will elaborate each in turn.

(1) Weyl repeatedly stresses that the world is not given but rather constructed through acts of theoretical cognition. He was thus a kind of neo-Kantian; our physical theories should be taken to reflect the structure of our minds as much as the structure of the world. In a 1934 lecture series, Mind and Nature (from which Pesic has borrowed the title for the whole collection), he writes: "Science concedes to idealism that this its objective world is not given, but only propounded (like a problem to be solved) and that it can be constructed only by symbols" (p. 109). The world-in-itself is not accessible directly, but only transcendentally, through cognitive acts grounded in intuition, ultimately represented purely symbolically. However, unlike Fichtean metaphysical idealism and Husserlian phenomenology (both of which deeply influenced him), Weyl did not claim that consciousness is autonomous or that it precedes experience. This is apparent in a 1930-1 lecture series, The Open World:

It was an error of idealism to assume that the phenomena of consciousness guarantee the reality of the ego in an essentially different and somehow more certain manner than the reality of the external world; in the transition from consciousness to reality, the ego, the thou and the world rise into existence indissolubly connected and, as it were, at one stroke. (p. 49-50)

The twofold nature of the ego operates in two ways here. First, it enables the distinction between self and world; it is not that an individual surveys his or her consciousness and then projects outward (a la Descartes), but rather that the phenomena of consciousness and experience arise together, that neither can be recognized as such without the other. Second, I -- as a thinking subject -- can project the phenomena of my own consciousness onto an object of my experience, thus recognizing another distinct ego, or "thou". This enables the multiplicity of perspective that is crucial to the scientific pursuit of the objective.

(2) At several points in Pesic's volume, Weyl distinguishes two kinds of intellectual activity: creation and reflection. Creation activities are those involved with production or engagement with the world; these include the creation of art, scientific production, and even politics. Reflection activities are inherently philosophical and contemplative. Focus on one to the exclusion of the other is misguided and leads to error:

The danger of constructive activity unguided by reflection is that it departs from meaning, goes astray, stagnates in mere routine; the danger of passive reflection is that it may lead to incomprehensible "talking about things" which paralyzes the creative power of man. (p. 81)

Sixteen years later, in an address at Princeton's bicentennial celebration, he strikes a similar note: "Creative construction unguarded by reflection is in danger of losing its way, while unbridled reflection is in danger of losing its substance" (p. 163). The role of the twofold nature of the ego is clear here; reflection is directed inward, creation is directed outward. That both are necessary for significant intellectual achievement indicates their interdependent nature. Note that inherent in this distinction are the resources for an argument about the indispensibility of the empirical: a priori methods are purely reflective and need to be checked by engagement with the world of experience.

(3) Finally, Weyl argues that the dichotomies subjective/objective and relative/absolute are intimately related, but somewhat counterintuitively. The subjective is what is immediately experienced by a perceiving subject; because it is immediate and unqualified, the experience is also absolute: "No matter how cloudy it may be, in this cloudiness it is something given thus and not otherwise" (p. 134). The objective, on the other hand, can only be defined relative to arbitrarily imposed reference systems. Thus, the subjective is absolute, and the objective is relative. For Weyl, the connection was extremely important: "This pair of opposites, subjective-absolute and objective-relative, seems to me one of the most fundamental epistemological insights one can gather from science" (p. 31). His treatment of the observer in relativity theory exemplifies this. There, he identifies the space of intuition of an observer with the tangent plane of the observer's worldline; the observer is thus a "point-eye" traveling along a worldline through spacetime. The subject experiences the tensorial objects on the manifold via their components in a given basis; these components are absolute because they are fixed relative to the coordinate system. The tensorial object itself is inaccessible to the observer without a basis and is in that sense relative. The description of the subjective experience -- the numbers themselves -- can be achieved without reference to the basis; description of the object itself, understood as something beyond experience, cannot. The twofold nature of the ego is directly connected to this mapping of dichotomies; the ego's self-reflections are absolute, and its engagement with the world cannot escape the problem of relativity.

Weyl argues that the solution to the problems created by the twofold nature of the ego is transcendental. After characterizing the ways in which changes in perspective alter the manifestations of some object of experience, one should move to a description in which the notion of perspective has been eliminated entirely. The result will be a set of axioms, an arrangement of uninterpreted symbols. The task then is to work back from this purely symbolic construction to the world of experience, and that is to re-enter the realm of the ego, in which its twofold nature must once again be taken into account. This ascent from immediate experience to systematic, axiomatic theories and then back to experience is described in "Man and the Foundations of Science", one of the previously unpublished works that Pesic discovered in the Weyl archive. It is a particular gem of this volume, providing a concise encapsulation of Weyl's mature philosophy of science.

There is much more to Weyl's philosophy, of course, and much more to what can be found in Pesic's volume. I have isolated what I take to be a central feature, one that is brought into particularly stark relief by this collection. Weyl's philosophical views, particularly those concerning science, are pervaded by the belief that the cognizing subject, or ego, has a twofold nature; it is both a self-conscious entity and one capable of causal interaction with the world. Other features are worth mentioning; for example, Weyl believed strongly in the unity of science, and also that theories can only be confirmed or disconfirmed as wholes. Pesic's volume also includes some discussion of the nature of mathematics, which Weyl refers to as "the science of the infinite" (p. 38). "The Open World" in particular is worth looking at in this respect; there Weyl refers to "God as the completed infinite" (p. 82). Like the objective reality that is the target of science, the infinite, understood as an integral whole existing in and of itself, can only be represented in symbols, never grasped intuitively (and this belies Weyl's constructivist approach to mathematics; he had earlier been an intuitionist with Brouwer).

In summary, Pesic's volume is an excellent resource for the scholar interested in learning more about the sophisticated philosophy of science of a great mathematician and physicist. These relatively short works should be reasonably accessible to those without extensive background physics, and they can thus serve as an introduction to Weyl, a sort of sneak preview to PMNS. Those interested in a more comprehensive look at his philosophy of science would still be advised to work through PMNS; Pesic's volume is a valuable supplement to that "magisterial treatise" (as Pesic puts it), not a replacement for it. And for scholars of Weyl, Pesic's volume is simply a necessity.


Weyl, Hermann, Philosophy of Mathematics and Natural Science, O. Helmer (tr.), Princeton, Princeton UP, 1949. (2nd edition, 1966)

------, Gesammelte Abhandlungen, K. Chandrasekharan (ed.), Berlin, Springer, 1968.