C. Stephen Evans

Kierkegaard: An Introduction

C. Stephen Evans, Kierkegaard: An Introduction, Cambridge UP, 2009, 206pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521700412.

Reviewed by Rick Anthony Furtak, Colorado College


C. Stephen Evans has been established for decades as one of the most highly respected scholars of Kierkegaard's writings, and his newest book offers a concise introduction to Kierkegaard's thought, with particular attention to its significance for philosophy. Early on, he concedes that "there are many themes in Kierkegaard as well as whole works that this book barely touches on or omits entirely" (xi). This is inevitable for any one-volume work, of course. The task of a reviewer, accordingly, must be to comment on what Evans does an especially good job of illuminating, and also to say a few things about what else might be highlighted for the philosophical reader of Kierkegaard, beyond the themes and texts that are emphasized by Evans.

To begin with, he is entirely right to point out that Kierkegaard's interpretation of human existence, although it involves decidedly religious categories, is not relevant only for readers who are already inclined toward religion (16). As George Pattison has noted in another recent book on Kierkegaard as philosopher, judicious readers ought neither to accept nor to reject his ideas solely by virtue of their affiliation with Christianity. We should first try to decide independently whether or not Kierkegaard's writings offer "a persuasive or adequate depiction of the human condition."[1] One reason for doing this is that we cannot appreciate Kierkegaard's distinctive understanding of religiousness if we view his works through the lens of a prior acceptance or rejection of Christianity, as we already understood it before encountering Kierkegaard's writings. This would not be an appropriate way of coming to terms with an idiosyncratic author who shares the Socratic conviction "that individuals must discover the truth for themselves", as Evans observes, and who calls for a return to the "conception of philosophy that inspired the Greeks" -- that is, as the critical search for a general understanding of reality that could inform a life of wisdom (29, 4). This affinity for the spirit of Greek thought, which is evident in many of Kierkegaard's pseudonymous and signed writings, is being increasingly recognized as a key to understanding his work. Indeed, it may be that our attitude toward the classical notion of philosophy as a way of life will serve as a better indication of how much we could learn from Kierkegaard's writings than our feelings about religion -- although this last suggestion might be taking the analogy between Kierkegaard and the ancients more seriously than Evans believes we ought to do.

Evans characterizes Kierkegaard's portrait of human life as "open-ended" and "unfinished", containing a tension between the limiting conditions of our facticity and our boundless sense of possibility (20; 48, 168). On the one hand, we are contingent beings, born into a certain historical situation, made of certain genetic material; on the other hand, we each have the capacity to imagine endless ways in which our life could unfold from any point forward. This is the "basic incongruity" that lies "at the heart of human existence": we must somehow work out a relation to "the infinite and the finite" or "the possible and the necessary" (132). A brief way to describe the "religious life" is that it is one in which we have come to terms with our finite dependency, and affirmed our highest ideals, in relation to God as the source of our being (130). But Kierkegaard spends a lot of time providing a diagnosis of other, less satisfactory, modes of existence. Evans aptly conceptualizes the "aesthetic" life, in which a person resists forming earnest commitments or developing any "enduring passions", basking in "imaginative recreation" without becoming engaged in the human world in a wholehearted and coherent way (72-79, 91). Without unifying concerns, such a life deteriorates into a series of burdensome, fragmentary moments. Since "the human self is essentially relational", this life is nothing less than a failure to attain full selfhood or humanness (47). As Evans points out, Kierkegaard's portrayal of the human condition implies that "an understanding of human existence must include an understanding of what today would be termed our emotional lives", and that we "must have emotional intelligence in order to be wise" (21, 35). It is our passions -- that is, our "enduring, sustained kinds of carings" -- that give "direction and continuity" to our life among others (34). Now, all of this may sound as if it pertains primarily to moral philosophy, yet, as Evans perceptively notes, the affective dimension of human life has an epistemic significance for Kierkegaard, no less than an ethical one. Rather than seeking a "view from nowhere" in order to find our way to the truth, we must "stand somewhere and trust that our perspective, including our emotional 'take' on the world," can provide us with an accurate view of things (64). Furthermore, any beliefs we may hold about explicitly religious matters are not insulated from the rest of our rational convictions; rather, they can be located on a continuum with countless other beliefs that we reasonably hold about issues that involve some degree of uncertainty (160).

Each of the themes I have just outlined receives its due weight, and is given an articulate explanation, in Kierkegaard: An Introduction. I now want to consider aspects of Evans's book that I find less convincing. A couple of minor issues are never worked out with clarity: first of all, Evans repeatedly states that true religiousness will be at odds with the prevailing culture, suggesting that a religious individual will not be at home in his or her society (8-9, 192); he also claims, however, that Kierkegaard "shares the Hegelian view that a self gains its identity through relations with others" (74). As far as I can see, Evans does not account for how both of these claims can be true. Similarly, he seems to have conflicting opinions as to whether or not Kierkegaard ought to be classified as an "existential" philosopher: although Kierkegaard "does not fit well into" this category, he is "justly famous" as the father of existentialism and is the source of some of the most central ideas in the work of Heidegger and Sartre (x; 18, 52). In this case there is ambiguity in the title "existentialist", for which Evans is hardly to blame, and yet a more sustained discussion of how Kierkegaard's work compares to that of other more-or-less existential thinkers, including how it differs, would be helpful. The initial claim, that Kierkegaard is simply not an existential philosopher, is likely to give a misleading impression.

My biggest difference of opinion with Evans, however, has to do with his angle of interpretation in relation to the two books ascribed to "Johannes Climacus" -- namely, the Philosophical Fragments (or Crumbs) and the Concluding Unscientific Postscript. Other than Either/Or (the main source for his reading of the "aesthetic" mode of life), these two texts are the most often quoted of Kierkegaard's writings, by a wide margin. Religiously significant works such as The Sickness unto Death and Works of Love receive only five and seven mentions, respectively; by contrast, the Postscript is cited on 42 pages and the Fragments on 19, according to Evans's index (204). It is primarily from the Fragments and the Postscript that Evans draws his account of Kierkegaardian religiousness: most of all, from a discussion that occupies one-tenth of the Postscript and receives little mention elsewhere in Kierkegaard's pseudonymous, signed, or unpublished writings. This is the source of the distinction between "Religiousness A" and "Religiousness B", which Evans regards as an authoritative principle of interpretation for Kierkegaard's work in general. This framework determines the structure of several chapters of Evans's book, and it is what he has in mind when he claims, for example, that "Christianity does not accept the Socratic assumption that the truth resides within each individual, but instead holds that human beings have forfeited the truth because of sin" (45). In brief, "Religiousness A" involves the immanent "recollection" of the divine, in much the same manner as Platonic recollection; on this view, the human being has an inherent and yet obscured relation to the eternal. For those who take the "A" and "B" categories to be definitive, any account of religiousness that is not specifically Christian gets lumped into the "A" category, even if it does not view the divine as "recollected" within oneself in any sense, and even if it makes no reference to the notion of "eternal happiness" that is said in the Postscript to be a defining feature of "Religiousness A". Meanwhile, on the reading that Evans favors, "Religiousness B" is equated with Kierkegaardian Christianity, in spite of controversy among scholars as to whether "Religiousness B" as described in the Postscript might be too otherworldly and isolating to be consistent with the religiousness of Works of Love.[2] By not pausing to acknowledge this controversy, Evans presents his reading as the only correct or plausible reading, and he justifies it not by demonstrating that it is consistent with the rest of Kierkegaard's religious works, but by appealing to the intentions of the author. He accepts the assumption "that Climacus' descriptions of Christianity are ones that Kierkegaard himself endorses", and the sort of evidence he cites in favor of this is that the books ascribed to Climacus also have Kierkegaard's own name on the title page as "editor" (140, see also 32; 27). Thus, if we wish to read "Kierkegaard's authorship as a whole in light of his declared intentions", then it is safe to assume that Climacus is speaking for Kierkegaard at every step (15). What about the intention, declared unequivocally in his own voice, that we should not identify Kierkegaard himself with his pseudonyms? To his credit, Evans makes note of this request, but nonetheless he often collapses the distinction between Kierkegaard and one of his pseudonymous voices, insisting that there is no important division between them (25).

If this is a shortcoming of Evans's approach, it is not one that comprehensively undercuts the argument of his largely reliable book, and it does not outweigh the book's many virtues. My reason for lingering on this theme is that it represents a major point of contention among readers of Kierkegaard. Evans alludes to this when he distinguishes his more straightforward reading from the "radical postmodern view" of those who take a superficial interest in Kierkegaard's literary strategies (which can provide a field day for Derridean or Lacanian analysts of language and its indeterminacies) without submitting themselves to the risk of "being challenged" about "issues of ultimate importance" (12-13). Now, Evans is certainly right that Kierkegaard's texts make a personal and direct appeal to their reader, provoking him or her to think about urgent questions, and to deny this would be to miss the point altogether. But he is wrong to make it sound as if one must either take a fairly dogmatic view of "what Kierkegaard hoped we would learn from his texts" or else be a mere dilettante with no sincere interest in learning from his work (16). In other words, we don't have to choose between holding that a pseudonymous author such as Johannes Climacus is always enunciating views that Kierkegaard himself would endorse and dismissing the Concluding Unscientific Postscript as a rhetorical parody devoid of serious content. Like many other pseudonymous works, this text does include many claims with which Kierkegaard would agree -- as evidenced by the fact that he does, in his own voice, make a number of remarks that are echoed or anticipated on the pages ascribed to Johannes Climacus. Yet when Climacus says things that are not repeated elsewhere in Kierkegaard's writings, or that are sharply at odds with statements made by Kierkegaard himself, then we need to figure out how to make sense of this. Furthermore, this kind of difficulty is not confined to our interpretation of the pseudonyms. As is the case with many other philosophical authors, Kierkegaard (in his own voice) often makes claims that are in conflict with other claims he has made before, either because he has not worked out a consistent position or because his position has changed over time. It is true that Kierkegaard considered himself a religious author until the end of his life, as Evans points out, but this does not settle the question of whether the religious writings from the last two years of Kierkegaard's life are consistent with his earlier works (10-11). A look at those late writings may reveal that in many respects they are not consistent, regardless of what the author may have said about them.

Kierkegaard is a literary philosopher just as surely as he is a religious philosopher, and paying attention to the literary devices employed by his texts should not disqualify a person from being open to their transformative potential. Indeed, it may be a condition of taking these texts, and the way in which they challenge us as human beings, seriously. If we rely too much on a "top-down" appeal to the intentions of the creator, as if these could dictate a single authoritative interpretation, then we may reduce a work to something less than it is. Evans does not wish to do this to Kierkegaard's rich and complex writings, but he might have reminded us more often that he is telling only one side of the story, or that there are more stories to be told about these texts than the one that he is offering. To give just one more example, one can agree with Evans that Works of Love advocates a "divine command" theory of ethics, while wishing that he had said more about other readings that he cites as providing a complement to his own (182-183). Works of Love is a promising resource for the philosopher interested in moral perception, and it contains a number of highly suggestive remarks that hint at a fundamental ontology of human being as grounded, not in Sorge, but in agapê. To return to a point that I made in my opening paragraph, many of my more qualified remarks on Kierkegaard: An Introduction are nothing more than attempts to stress some of what else might have been said in what is admittedly a selective monograph. Evans has succeeded at telling us much of the truth about Kierkegaard's thought, but no volume on this topic could honestly swear to tell the "whole truth". That is due to the "dazzling" variety of Kierkegaard's writings, as well as the fact that he often uses familiar terms in unconventional ways (2). All of these features conspire to resist a single interpretation. So, rather than allowing this to sound like faint praise of Evans's book, I would prefer to view it as a tribute to Kierkegaard's work.

[1] George Pattison, The Philosophy of Kierkegaard (Montreal: McGill-Queen's UP, 2005), 165.

[2] This is hardly a "fringe" position, either: one needs to look no further than Merold Westphal's discussion of Søren Kierkegaard in the online Encyclopedia Britannica [http://www.britannica.com/EBchecked/topic/317503/Soren-Kierkegaard/271899/Three-dimensions-of-the-religious-life] in order to find a defense of the idea that a "Religiousness C" is endorsed in some of Kierkegaard's religious writings, including The Sickness unto Death, and that it differs significantly from either "A" or "B" as outlined in the Postscript. See also Westphal, Becoming a Self: A Reading of Kierkegaard's Concluding Unscientific Postscript (West Lafayette, IN: Purdue UP, 1996), 197ff.