2009.12.07

Roger Scruton

Beauty

Roger Scruton, Beauty, Oxford UP, 2009, 223pp., $19.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780199559527.

Reviewed by Donald W. Crawford, University of California, Santa Barbara


 

Although aimed at a general audience, essentially as a primer to philosophical aesthetics, Roger Scruton explores a much wider range of issues in his characteristically lucid and penetrating style. The book is shorter than its pagination indicates, since its pages measure only 4½ by 6¾ inches. The main structure focuses on judging beauty and to this end he concentrates on four kinds of beauty: "human beauty, as an object of desire; natural beauty, as an object of contemplation; everyday beauty, as an object of practical reasons; and artistic beauty, as a form of meaning and an object of taste" (p. 148). The approach to these topics is philosophical rather than historical, psychological or evolutionary.

The informative and useful first chapter begins by outlining several platitudes about beauty: beauty pleases us; one thing can be more beautiful than another; beauty is always a reason for attending to what possesses it; judgments of beauty are about beautiful objects, not the subject's state of mind; and one must experience and judge beauty oneself. These platitudes lead to the familiar paradox that although a genuine judgment of taste can be supported by reasons, these reasons can never amount to a deductive argument, as Kant observed. Scruton suggests that experiencing beauty is recognizing a form of fittingness or harmony, which applies not only to works of art but to many ordinary things such as a room arrangement or a street scene looking just right, or a musical refrain sounding just right. Also following Kant, he endorses a version of aesthetic disinterestedness: experiencing beauty involves contemplating an object for its own sake in its presented form, and the pleasure is that of focusing on the object, not due to any practical benefit it might provide. While skeptics question the objectivity of beauty, Scruton argues that it is a real and universal value anchored in our rational nature and that it plays an indispensable part in shaping the human world.

Most of the book embodies this very traditional approach, with references to Kant, Hume, Plato, Collingwood and others, but readers familiar with and looking for Scruton's sometimes contentious opinions will not be disappointed. In fact, the book is a strange mixture of an analytical treatment of many of the major problems of aesthetics along with Scruton's always stimulating but sometimes idiosyncratic views on topics such as erotic art and pornography, modernism, art and morality, the relationship between aesthetic value and the sacred, and kitsch as the desecration of beauty.

Readers may be surprised to find that Scruton does not follow the standard practice of beginning with an analysis of artistic beauty but only turns to that topic after he analyses human beauty, natural beauty, and everyday beauty. His treatment of human beauty rehearses some of the themes in his controversial Sexual Desire (New York: Free Press, 1986) and concludes that "the judgement of beauty, even in the context of sexual desire, focuses on how a thing presents itself to the contemplating mind" (pp. 56-57). In short, in experiencing the beauty of a person, we relish the physical features which attract our gaze and are integrated into the ways we relate to each other. He also notes that the idea of human beauty penetrates our judgment of people and that the word 'beautiful' is often used to describe a person's moral aspect.

The chapter on natural beauty follows Kant's Critique of Aesthetic Judgment in many respects, suggesting that the cultivation of a contemplative attitude toward natural objects and scenery transcends cultures and historical eras. At the same time he takes issue with contemporary analyses of natural beauty which insist that the appropriate aesthetic appreciation of nature must be guided by environmental sciences such as ecology and geology rather than by analogies to formal and expressive aspects of beauty embodied in the arts. Scruton counters that "the aesthetic interest in nature is an interest in appearances, and not necessarily in the science that explains them," for "appearances are the bearers of meaning and the focus of our emotional concerns" (p. 69).

In turning to what he terms "everyday beauty", he finds confirmation of his view that the key to beauty and the aesthetic appreciation or judgment of beautiful objects resides in fittingness, the right or appropriate arrangement -- a harmoniousness that is recognized in appearances. He believes this is true not only of gardens and architecture, but even with respect to handiwork and decoration. Taking the example of an ordinary object such as a door frame, he suggests that our concern is with whether it looks right, and then claims, perhaps controversially, that "this is not a question that can be answered in functional or utilitarian terms" (p. 82). Rather, the search for what looks right is a search for consensus, and thus is part of the search for a viable social order and the recognition and valuing of taste as one of its components. This link between aesthetic value and social or cultural values is a theme that permeates the book.

What follows is the longest chapter (36 pages), devoted to artistic beauty. Here Scruton's aesthetic values emerge in full force, beginning with a diatribe against modernism and pop art and directed specifically against the works of Duchamp and Warhol, which he says began as a good joke but are "downright stupid today" (p. 99). Good taste is important, and "when it comes to art, aesthetic judgement concerns what you ought and ought not to like" (p. 90). Scruton considers the 'ought' here to have moral weight (p. 99). He recalls the radical distinction introduced by Croce and taken up by Collingwood between art properly so-called and pseudo-art, which is designed merely to entertain, arouse or amuse. He correctly notes, however, that genuine art may entertain us but that it does so in literature and drama by "creating a distance sufficient to engender disinterested sympathy for the characters, rather than vicarious emotions of our own" (p. 102). He reviews various sub-topics in the aesthetics of artistic beauty: expression, style, form and content, meaning and metaphor -- illustrating these nicely with discussions of architecture and music. Here he relies on two of his previous books, The Aesthetics of Architecture (Princeton UP, 1979) and The Aesthetic Understanding (London: Methuen, 1983). Throughout his discussion of various types of artistic beauty, he reprises his theme of the artistic importance and broader significance of fittingness: "In art as in life fittingness is at the heart of aesthetic success. We want things to fit together, in ways that fit to us" (p. 126). An interesting observation is how Scruton links morality to artistic success or failure, claiming that "many of the aesthetic faults incurred by art are moral faults -- sentimentality, insincerity, self-righteousness, moralizing itself" (p. 132).

In fact, the remainder of the book -- three entire chapters -- explores various links between art and morality and reveals Scruton's conservative political and moral values, but in a reasoned way that encourages the reader's critical engagement. In "Taste and Order", he claims that aesthetic taste is "intimately bound up with our personal life and moral identity" since it is part of our rational nature to strive for shared values and a community of judgment (p. 133). He even believes, surprisingly to me, that fashion is integral to our nature as social beings, and decorum and propriety are integral to the sense of beauty -- concepts that range equally across the aesthetic and moral spheres. Although Scruton appears to believe that conformity to social conventions and norms is part of personal morality, it is difficulty to comprehend how, even if this were the case, one could extend this to one's taste in artistic or natural beauty. Scruton attempts this, however, in a rather indirect but clever way that is still questionable. He returns to the paradox that arises out of what he called the platitudes of beauty, that although we attempt to seek consensus about our judgments of taste, we cannot strictly prove that they are true. Nothing guarantees that a judgment of taste is correct, and the search for objectivity must lead elsewhere, toward the establishment of shared experience.

Scruton then turns to Hume's celebrated essay, "On the Standard of Taste", focusing on what characteristics a critic must possess in order to be taken seriously as reliable. Unfortunately he does not provide enough detailed discussion to make his point convincingly. He only says that the characteristics are "delicacy and discernment" (p. 146). He concludes that the judgment of taste reflects the character of the one who makes it: "The characteristics of the good critic, as Hume envisaged them, point to virtues which, in Hume's thinking, are vital to the good conduct of life, and not just to the discrimination of aesthetic qualities" (p. 147). But in his essay Hume's also attempts to detail what is necessary in order to achieve proper delicacy and discernment: practice in a particular art and the frequent survey or contemplation of different types of beauty; multiple experiences of the work of art; experience in comparing different works; and freedom from prejudice. It's not obvious that Scruton's argument can be bolstered by the further application of Hume's details. Scruton ends this chapter with the comment that his final two chapters will attempt to justify his belief that these virtues point to an objectivity that links beauty and morality.

Unfortunately, this promise is never fulfilled. The prevailing character of the final two chapters, "Art and Eros" and "The Flight from Beauty", seems to be focused on diatribes against pornography and several forms of post-modern art.

The argument against pornography in "Art and Eros" is simple -- perhaps too simple. Pornography lies outside the realm of art because it is incapable of beauty. It is incapable of beauty because its purpose is to arouse vicarious desire, whereas the purpose of art that deals with sexual desire is to portray sexual desire without arousing it. Scruton fills in the missing premise to avoid begging the question, which is that if art portrays sexual desire and also arouses it, then that is an aesthetic defect (pp. 159-60). But is this a defect that would be sufficient to conclude that it is not art? Nor does it seem plausible to distinguish pornography from art simply on the basis of its purpose or the intent of its creator. Scruton's underlying rationale is to be found instead in one of his primary moral principles, taken from Kant, that treating someone as an object and not as an end in itself is immoral. However, it seems possible that one can accept this principle without concluding that the representation or portrayal of a subject having been turned into an object and thereby having their humanity destroyed is ipso facto tantamount to denying the status of art to that portrayal. The issue is far more complex than this. Scruton is sensitive to the nuances of these issues, however, and his extended discussion of the distinction between the erotic and the pornographic is enlightening.

In the final chapter, "The Flight from Beauty", Scruton makes an important distinction between two types of 20th century artists. The first he calls "modernists", represented by Eliot, Matisse and Schoenberg, who were concerned that contemporary art was detaching itself from true artistic intentions and the quest for beauty but devolving into mechanical, repetitive exercises with no spiritual aim. The second type has Rothko, de Kooning and Pollock as exemplars, whose aims or at least whose products, according to Scruton, constitute a flight from beauty or as he puts it more bluntly, a "desire to spoil beauty, in acts of iconoclasm" (p. 174). Scruton considers this the desecration of beauty, and these pages contain sections on the sacred and profane, idolatry, profanation, and the addiction to pleasure without any ideational content. So we have the good guys and the bad guys, who at their worst only produce kitsch. In his mind, the relentless pursuit of artistic innovation leads to a cult of nihilism, and the path out of this desecration must lead us back to beauty, not only in art but in life and viable social communities.

Despite its occasional contentiousness and idiosyncratic views, Scruton's Beauty is a thoughtful and challenging exploration not only of some central issues in aesthetics but also the place of the experience of beauty in our lives.