2005.02.09

R. A. Wilson

Boundaries of the Mind: The Individual in the Fragile Sciences--Cognition

Wilson, R. A., Boundaries of the Mind: The Individual in the Fragile Sciences--Cognition, Cambridge University Press, 2004, 369pp, $24.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521544947.

Reviewed by L. A. Shapiro, University of Wisconsin, Madison


Rob Wilson's Boundaries of the Mind is a fascinating, useful, and thorough treatment of the role and conceptualization of the individual in psychology. There is more good news. This is just the first book in a planned three-volume set, entitled The Individual in the Fragile Sciences. The second volume will examine the individual in biological sciences and the third will cover the individual's role in social sciences. If the latter two books match the quality of the first, Wilson's trilogy will doubtless become a focal point in philosophy of science for many years to come.

First, a word about Wilson's brow-furrowing neologism. Why introduce the term fragile sciences in favor of some more established term? Wilson gives two reasons. First, he complains that for too long there has been a tendency to contrast the hard, physical, natural sciences with the soft, social, and human sciences. This is a division that embodies a bias, Wilson thinks, and his moniker 'fragile science' both pokes fun at these labels and suggests a different way of viewing these sciences. Second, Wilson explains, "[f]ragile things can be easily broken, are often delicate and admirable in their own right, and their labeling as such carries with it its own warning, which we sometimes make explicit: Handle with care!" (p. 9). Personally, I would have gone with life sciences if for no other reason than to avoid the head scratching that Wilson's new label is sure to provoke, but there are more important matters to discuss than this.

Wilson's book is divided into four parts. In the first he motivates the study of the individual in psychology, provides a framework for contrasting nativist and empiricist views and provides a history of psychology that traces its gradual independence from physiology and philosophy to a subject in its own right. The second part of the book spans topics for which Wilson is already well-known: the individualism-externalism debate, narrow and wide content, and the metaphysics of realization. Part II also introduces the idea of exploitative representations, which, in contrast to the traditional computational view of representations as information carrying symbols, locates information in the organism/environment relationship. Depending on how much the environment contributes to this relationship, cognition might be more or less "in the head." Indeed, Wilson accepts the idea that cognition might, in some cases, take place outside traditional organismic boundaries. Part III explores some consequences of this radical form of externalism from the perspective of various research programs in psychology: memory, development, and theory of mind. These sections of the book are especially welcome because they reveal that the conceptual distinctions Wilson introduces in Part II help make sense of current psychological research and also suggest new directions for study. Also in Part III is Wilson's attempt to apply his externalist framework to ongoing research and debate within the study of consciousness. Here he stakes out his own conception of consciousness, which goes by the clunky acronym TESEE: Temporally Extended, Scaffolded, and Embodied and Embedded. Part IV closes the book with a discussion of the cognitive metaphor in the biological and social sciences. Most commonly, this metaphor attributes minds to groups (e.g., groups of organisms), challenging the standard view that minds belong to individuals. Following an historical introduction to the group-mind hypothesis, Wilson examines David Sloan Wilson's recent defense of group minds, which derives from his influential work on group selection.

Because brevity prevents me from commenting on the many rich ideas in Wilson's book, I shall consider the unifying theme of the series – the idea that it is worth investigating the place of the individual in the fragile sciences. Wilson tells us that "[t]he concept of the individual is central to how we think about the mind, about living things, and about the social world" (p. 4), and that his project in Boundaries of the Mind is to examine "the role that the individual has played and continues to play in guiding our thinking about the mind within cognitive science" (p. 4). Wilson fleshes out these remarks with some examples. With regard to the concept of the individual, consider that different scientific enterprises emphasize some properties of individuals to the exclusion of others. Within cognitive science, individuals are (standardly) conceived as the "locus for computational programs and modules" (p. 5). Biology, in contrast, conceives of individuals as organisms with particular phylogenetic histories and ecological niches. Anthropology characterizes individuals as participants in cultural, religious, and more broadly social activities.

There is a point to this observation. Wilson believes that "[h]ow one conceives of individuals and the role that one ascribes to individuals structure and constrain how any 'individual-focused' science is theorized and practiced" (p. 6). To illustrate, Wilson discusses a change in the conception of individuals within the theory of evolution by natural selection. Prior to the Darwinian synthesis, individuals were the unit of selection. They were the beneficiaries of adaptations, and fitness was measured by the individual's reproductive success. Following the Darwinian synthesis, individuals became the vehicles for genes which usurped the former role of individuals. Now it is the gene rather than the individual that benefits from adaptations and varies in fitness.

This difference in the conception of individuals makes a difference to how one explains such things as the evolution of altruism. When individuals are the units of selection, the evolution of altruism, which requires actions that reduce an individual's fitness, seems impossible. However, when the individual is relegated to the role of vehicle for the gene and fitness is measured in terms of the gene's reproductive success, an explanation for altruism becomes available. Actions that reduce an individual's fitness may nevertheless increase the frequency of particular genes, and this is why there might be selection for altruistic behavior. Thus, it turns out, how one conceives individuals makes a difference to how one understands issues like altruism.

Rather than clarifying the central motivation for Wilson's study of the individual in the fragile sciences, I think this example reveals a fundamental shortcoming. One natural way to understand how the conception of individual changes from pre- to post-synthetic Darwinian theory is to suppose that the individual goes from being an organism to being a gene. Why continue to think, as Wilson appears to in this example, that the individual remains the organism? Why not assign the label 'individual' to the unit of selection? There is a good reason to do this. Plausibly, whatever individuals are, they should be something like agents. They should be the locus of activity. Individuals are whatever have adaptations, compete with each other, and evolve. This, at least on Richard Dawkins' interpretation of post-synthetic evolutionary theory, is what the gene does. Organisms are simply the gene's way of doing this.

In clinging to the idea that the organism is the individual Wilson dismisses what seems to me a more compelling view of what's going on. True, the move from pre- to post-synthetic evolutionary theory marks (for some) a change in how organisms are conceived, but perhaps it does nothing at all to change how we think of individuals. Individuals continue to be the agents in evolution. It just turns out that there are now reasons to identify individuals with genes rather than with organisms.

Wilson is not oblivious to this possibility. He remarks, "[h]uman agents are the paradigmatic individuals in these sciences, but they are neither the only entity that serves as an individual nor always the most central such entity" (p. 7) and then claims that we "can raise the same questions about the conception and role of such entities as we have about our paradigm individuals" (p. 7). Clearly Wilson simply mis-speaks when claiming that human agents are the paradigm individuals in evolutionary theory (although they might be in cognitive and social sciences), but what troubles me about this admission is the following. Despite the prominence of the individual in Boundaries of the Mind, nowhere does Wilson offer an analysis of what he takes an individual to be. He recognizes that various entities can serve as or be like individuals, but does not say what this means. Indeed, one might wonder at Wilson's claim that conceptions of the individual differ across the fragile sciences. Depending on one's metaphysics of individuals, perhaps one should take the defining features of an individual to be invariant across sciences. This would make sense of Wilson's concession that entities other than organisms can be like individuals. There is a standard conception of an individual and whatever fits this conception counts as an individual.

If I am right about this, Wilson's project should be framed differently, but not in a way that need detract from its significance. Rather than expecting to find that, for example, evolutionary biologists conceive of individuals differently than cognitive scientists, we should take Wilson to be interested in discovering what 'individual' refers to in these different sciences. Also, we should be open to the possibility that various things count as individuals within the same science. Within evolutionary biology it might make sense to see genes, organisms, and groups as individuals. Within cognitive science, individuals might be processing modules, where these modules might include brains as subcomponents or, alternatively, might themselves be subcomponents of brains.

I don't think that I am making merely a semantic point here. It makes a difference to Wilson's project whether one interprets it as examining different conceptions of individual or as trying to locate what, within the different sciences, meet a fairly uniform set of criteria for defining an individual. I wouldn't know how to begin the first project. It would require justifying the need to re-analyze the notion of an individual for the different sciences. On the face of it, there is no such need. Instead, and I think this is surely Wilson's intent, we have in hand a fairly intuitive conception of an individual and we can rely on this to motivate the kinds of questions Wilson is right to ask. What are the individuals in the fragile sciences? Are individual boundaries the same as organismic boundaries? Nevertheless, as a philosopher Wilson should not sit content with merely an intuitive conception of individuals --especially given the prominence of individuals in this book and series. He owes us more.

The dissatisfaction I have voiced above should not be overstated. Despite what I take to be an error in packaging, the contents of the package are extraordinary. Wilson's ideas are creative and set an agenda for future work in philosophy of cognitive science as well as cognitive science proper. His writing is clear and engaging. I recommend this book in the strongest terms to anyone with an interest in philosophy of mind, cognitive science, or embodied cognition.