Jonathan Cohen

The Red and The Real: An Essay on Color Ontology

Jonathan Cohen, The Red and The Real: An Essay on Color Ontology, Oxford UP, 2009, 260pp., $75.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199556168.

Reviewed by Adam Pautz, University of Texas at Austin


In his admirable and engaging book, Jonathan Cohen defends relationalism about color. Roughly, relationalism is the traditional view that colors are constituted in terms of relations between objects and subjects. On Cohen's version, necessarily, something is red, for instance, just in case it (non-deviantly) causes reddish experiences in the relevant individuals in the relevant circumstances. This theory contrasts with non-relationalism. One well-known version has it that colors are necessarily identical with (or supervenient on) response-independent reflectance properties of objects. Cohen has defended relationalism in numerous articles but his book contains much new material, develops a coherent package, and provides important and thorough discussions of nearly every theory of color. The book is also fun to read. Cohen is a real color enthusiast, and this comes through on the printed page.

Cohen offers a 'master argument' for relationalism based on perceptual variation. The argument is an old one but Cohen provides the most thorough and sophisticated defense to date. Let us focus throughout on one of Cohen's examples (p.30). Due to innate individual differences between John and Jane's visual systems, the same color chip looks unitary green (a green not tinged with any other hue) to John and green-blue to Jane. John judges it to be unitary green and Jane judges it to be green-blue. There is no apparent reason to say John is right and Jane is wrong and there is no apparent reason to say the opposite. Following Cohen, let us use 'variants' for the different color representations in cases of apparently normal variation. There are three options: the eliminativist view that all variants are strictly speaking wrong, the inegalitarian view that one variant is right and all others are wrong, and the pluralist view that all are right. Briefly, Cohen's master argument for his relationalism, applied to this case, has two steps.

First step: We should be pluralists, not inegalitarians. Cohen relies on the principle 'avoid ad hoc stipulation where possible' together with the claim that inegalitarianism requires ad hoc stipulation (25, 52). He also says it is hard to imagine what could make inegalitarianism true (22, 25, 46 n.2). Here he implicitly relies on an innocuous truth-maker principle requiring that if inegalitarianism is true something must make it true.

Second step: Cohen's relationalism is the best form of pluralism. Cohen advocates a contextualist-relationalist account of color attributions: an utterance of 'a is C' is true in context K iff a causes C-experiences in the K-relevant individuals in the K-relevant circumstances. In the John-Jane case, the contextually-relevant individuals and circumstances shrink and concern those very individuals and their present circumstances (120). So John's utterance counts as true just in case the chip causes a unitary green experience in an individual with an instance of John's precise perceptual system type in an instance of the precise type of perceptual circumstance that John is in. Jane's utterance counts as true just in case the chip causes a green-blue experience in an individual with an instance of Jane's precise perceptual system type in an instance of the precise type of perceptual circumstance that Jane is in. Frank Jackson, Robert Pargetter and Brian McLaughlin have defended similar accounts on the basis of similar considerations.[1]

I will now describe in greater detail Cohen's argument and his relationalism, raising some potential problems along the way.

Cohen's argument. Cohen's first step is to argue for pluralism over inegalitarianism and eliminativism. I begin with worries about Cohen's principle-based arguments against inegalitarianism, and then turn to eliminativism.

Cohen invokes the principle 'avoid ad hoc stipulation' together with the claim that inegalitarianism requires ad hoc stipulation. Stipulation is a human activity. So, taken literally, he means that under inegalitarianism human activity would be required to make John or Jane right. But of course the inegalitarian will cite (perhaps unknowable) chromatic facts independent of human activity. So Cohen's meaning is unclear.

Maybe 'inegalitarianism requires ad hoc stipulation' is shorthand for Cohen's point that there is 'no independent and well-motivated' way of identifying the uniquely veridical variant (24). But inegalitarians can admit this. Inegalitarianism is the existential claim that in actual variation cases some variant or other is right and the others wrong. Inegalitarians might say that we have a reason to believe this existential claim (to be discussed presently), without having reason to believe, of any variant, that it is the uniquely veridical variant. They can explain our irremediable ignorance. Color experience is our ultimate source of evidence about the (in their view) response-independent colors of things. There is no "independent test" for color. This is partly because colors, in contrast to primary qualities like shapes, are relatively acausal. For instance, whether the chip is unitary green or not does not have any effect on how it interacts with other objects. So in cases of normal variation there is no way to break the impasse. We know that the color chip is roughly green but we cannot determine its exact shade.

Cohen eventually addresses this "quietist inegalitarianism". Again he repeats that it requires ad hoc stipulation (52). Here we definitely cannot interpret Cohen to mean 'there is no independent and well-motivated way of identifying the uniquely veridical variant', for quietists admit that. Maybe Cohen means that, not only is there no reason to accept any particular witness to the existential claim that defines inegalitarianism, there is also no reason to accept the existential claim itself (50).

But Cohen neglects the argument motivating inegalitarians. The first premise is realism: in cases of actual variation, at least one variant is correct. The second premise is the conflict intuition: variants conflict, so that at most one variant is correct. For instance, intuitively, when John says 'the chip is unitary green' and Jane says 'the chip is green-blue', they cannot both be right, contrary to Cohen's pluralism. The conclusion is that some variant or other is veridical and all the others are not, even if we cannot identify it.[2]

Cohen's second principle-based argument against inegalitarianism relies on a truth-maker principle. But the inegalitarian has a simple reply. Let us first consider the reply in connection with the reductive inegalitarianism of Byrne, Hilbert, and Tye, among others. Reductive inegalitarianism is inegalitarianism combined with the claim that colors are identical with some physical properties or other, such as reflectance-types. According to the simple reply, what makes it the case that John is right and Jane is wrong (as it might be) is simply that John represents the chip as having a color (on this view, a reflectance-type) that it does have while Jane represents it as having a color (reflectance-type) that it does not have. This representational difference is not mysterious: it supervenes on a difference in John and Jane's color processing. Call this the supervenience answer to Cohen's truth-maker question 'What makes it the case that one variant is veridical and the other is not?'[3]

Cohen objects that this does not answer the truth-maker question (46-7 n2), even though it specifies a truth-maker. Apparently, Cohen is not merely insisting on a truth-maker, but on a truth-maker specifiable in interestingly different terms: a reductive answer to the truth-maker question.

Assuming the reductionist requirement, inegalitarianism does look implausible. Say that someone stands in the sensory representation relation to a property just in case he has an experience that represents something as having that property. For reductive inegalitarians, who identify colors with reflectance-types, a reductive theory of the sensory representation relation (a "psychosemantics") in terms of tracking under optimal conditions is very natural, since our visual systems obviously track reflectance-types. But such a theory is inconsistent with inegalitarianism. The brain states realizing John and Jane's color experiences each track a range of reflectances (a reflectance-type) under a range of optimal conditions. Since the present conditions are within the optimal range, these ranges of reflectances include the actual reflectance of the chip, and so overlap. But, if John and Jane represent different colors, as Cohen argues (90-94), then, on a tracking theory, the relevant ranges must be slightly distinct. So, under a tracking theory, we get the result that the fine-grained colors that John and Jane represent are identical with highly overlapping but distinct ranges of reflectances, both of which the chip instantiates. In short, the tracking theory goes with (non-relational) pluralism, not inegalitarianism. The point is robust with respect to theories of sensory representation: indicator theories, output-oriented consumer theories, and so on. There is reason to believe that in principle there can be no true reductive account of sensory representation supporting the reductive inegalitarian's claim that John represents a reflectance-type that the chip has while Jane does not, rather than vice versa.[4]

This is not an argument Cohen develops. On the contrary, when he discusses reductionism about sensory representation, he says that it cannot be used to support a view on the inegalitarianism-pluralism debate (61-62). This is strange, because, as we have seen, in his response to the supervenience answer to his truth-maker objection to inegalitarianism, Cohen seems to be implicitly suggesting this very argument: a reductive answer (framed in interestingly different terms) to the truth-maker question is required, but such an answer cannot be provided even in principle.

In any case, any argument against inegalitarianism from the reductionist requirement is difficult to defend. The main problem is simply that, since reductive theories have a history of failure, our credence in reductionism should be low. For instance, suppose John says some action is wrong and Jane says it is not wrong. Maybe moral realism is right, and one of the two is correct about the moral status of the action and the other is incorrect, but there is no reductive theory of moral properties and their representation which specifies what makes this the case in non-moral and non-intentional terms. Maybe the best answer is the supervenience answer. Many (for instance, Barry Stroud and John Campbell) advocate a similar view of color -- they are called 'primitivists'. And many (e. g. Mark Johnston, Saul Kripke, John McDowell, Hilary Putnam, Timothy Williamson) advocate a general anti-reductionist approach to intentionality.

However, in the case of reductive inegalitarianism, Cohen might recast the argument in such a way that it does not require reductionism. He can simply point out that reductive inegalitarians like Byrne, Hilbert and Tye arguably have an inconsistent position. They accept reductionism about color, identifying colors with reflectance-types. Whatever reasons they have to be reductionists about color (causal considerations, avoiding danglers), they are presumably general, so that they are equally reasons to be reductionists about the sensory representation relation that we bear to reflectance-types. But then they accept an approach to variation cases, namely inegalitarianism, that we have reason to believe to be inconsistent with their commitment to reductionism about sensory representation! In short, reductive inegalitarians are committed to what seems not to exist: an interesting reductive (not a mere supervenience) answer to the truth-maker question of the kind Cohen seems to require.

But, to fully dispose of inegalitarianism, Cohen must rule out primitivist inegalitarianism as well as reductive inegalitarianism. Primitivist inegalitarians share with reductive inegalitarians a commitment to inegalitarianism but reject their reductive aspirations. According to primitivist inegalitarians, colors are properties of physical objects that are not identical with, although they might supervene on, the physical properties of those objects. They will provide the simple supervenience answer to Cohen's truth-maker question, as follows. The color chip is unitary green, not green-blue. John's experience represents the chip as unitary green, and Jane represents it as green-blue. So John is right and Jane is wrong. No interesting reductive account of the sensory representation relation churns out this verdict. As we have seen, tracking accounts do not. But the verdict is not mysterious, because it is fixed by the physical facts (e. g. John's undergoing 'unitary' processing). Likewise, a primitivist inegalitarian who is a 'disjunctivist' might say that John but not Jane is conscious of the chip's being unitary green (this state of the world is 'laid bare' to him) because his internal processing both tracks and suitably 'matches' this state of the world while Jane's processing is 'off'.

Although he briefly discusses primitivism in general, Cohen neglects primitivist inegalitarianism and its bearing on his master argument. How might he rule it out? Reductive inegalitarianism might fail simply because reductionism and inegalitarianism are inconsistent, but evidently the same charge cannot be brought against primitivist inegalitarianism, which has no commitment to reductionism. Since primitivist inegalitarianism provides a supervenience answer to the truth-maker question, Cohen will presumably say it does not go deep enough -- a response which implicitly relies on some form of reductionism, as noted above. I have two points. First, as already noted, since at the present stage of inquiry our credence in reductionism should be low, many will say that this argument is not particularly strong. It requires far more than an innocuous truth-maker principle. Second, although Cohen styles his master argument as based on the uncontestable empirical fact of actual variation, this argument against primitivist inegalitarianism has nothing to do with actual variation -- it relies on general metaphysical commitments.

Let us now turn to a quite different rival to Cohen's pluralism: the eliminativist view that in cases of actual variation all the variants are ("strictly speaking") mistaken. Cohen offers a Moorean argument against eliminativism. He says that, since realism is common sense (as Cohen puts it 'part of the manifest image'), we should accept realism and reject eliminativism, unless a sufficiently strong argument can be presented for rejecting realism and accepting eliminativism. And he says that there is no such argument (65ff). I think there are potential problems with Cohen's Moorean argument. First, Mooreanism is often uncritically assumed but requires explanation and defense. Do philosophers really think that the mere fact that a belief is "part of common sense" in itself provide a reason to accept it?[5] (Strangely, Cohen later (107) himself says he is open to error theories -- namely his second and third 'strategies' at pp. 104-5.) Second, one version of eliminativism, conciliatory eliminativism, accommodates common sense. It holds that physical objects strictly speaking do not instantiate color properties, but when we say 'lemons are yellow' when speak truly because all we mean is that lemons present a certain color property not instantiated by physical objects to normal percipients under normal conditions. This version of eliminativism is very much like Cohen's relationalism in its semantics.[6] Third, Cohen's Moorean argument requires that there is no "sufficiently strong" argument for eliminativism. But the following two-step argument may escape his criticisms. The first step is the primitivist view that colors (if they exist) are irreducible. The justification for this step is a piecemeal argument from elimination, or better, an inference to the best explanation: primitivism provides a better overall explanation of the facts about color and color experience than the various forms of reductionism, including Cohen's reductive relationalism. The second step says that, once we accept primitivism, we ought to accept eliminative primitivism rather than realist primitivism: revising common sense is better than inflating our ontology. Cohen raises two criticisms of the first step. First, he says that piecemeal argumentation is problematic, since 'refutations [of rival views -- in this case reductionist views] in philosophy are almost never decisive' (65). Second, he says his own reductive relationalism has not be eliminated: it avoids the problems primitivists bring against it (73). Cohen's first criticism is strange because, as should be clear by now, Cohen himself is effectively providing a piecemeal argument from elimination (or more charitably, inference to the best explanation) for his own relationalism (more on this below). The criticism also seems too strong. To be justified in accepting a theory (even a revisionary one), one need not have decisive refutations of rivals: one must show only that it is overall better than rivals. And Cohen's second criticism requires much more defense. Granted, Cohen describes solutions to some problems facing his reductive relationalism, but the primitivist might say that they are not plausible. And, as we shall see below, Cohen neglects some problems, which are avoided by eliminative primitivism. Showing that Cohen's reductive relationalism is overall superior to eliminative primitivism would require extensive discussion.

So, it is possible to question the first step of Cohen's master argument, which says that pluralism beats inegalitarianism and eliminativism. But let us now turn to the second step, which says that Cohen's relationalism is the best version of pluralism.

Why is it necessary to show that relationalism is the best version of pluralism? Isn't relationalism the only version? This is not the case: non-relational pluralism is a possibility. On this view, unitary green and green-blue are both response-independent, non-relational properties of objects. John and Jane are both right, because the chip has both properties. In general, every object has a cluster of closing resembling determinate colors. But not every color: if one said the chip is orange, one would be wrong. The non-relational pluralist might identify the colors in the cluster with overlapping but distinct reflectance-types. Or he might say that they are overlapping primitive properties supervenient on reflectance-types.

Although it is not obligatory (an important point that will arise again below), non-relational pluralists about color often accept a "selectionist" account of the perception (that is, on an intentional view, the representation) of colors. Selection is a metaphor that is never adequately explained. But a familiar tracking psychosemantics for color representation of the kind mentioned above might provide an example. As we saw above, John and Jane's visual systems might optimally track (and hence "select") overlapping but distinct reflectance-types (or perhaps primitive properties supervenient on such reflectance-types) belonging to the chip. So, on a tracking theory, the colors they sensorily represent are identical with these distinct but overlapping non-relational properties of the chip. In general, standard psychosemantics for sensory representation not only help to explain "selection", but also provide a potential argument for this type of non-relational pluralism (for more on this see the third problem for relationalism discussed below). On a natural account of interspecies variation (e. g. between a human and a UV-sensitive pigeon), different species track and thereby perceive overlapping but distinct chromatic properties of the same objects. On the present account, something similar applies to intraspecies cases like that of John and Jane, only it is more subtle.[7]

Cohen did not address non-relational pluralism in previous work, apparently assuming that a non-relational view is automatically an inegalitarian view. Cohen cannot use actual cases of normal variation to support his relational pluralism over non-relational pluralism, because both seem to be able to provide the kind of pluralist account of such cases that Cohen favors. To show his relational pluralism to be superior, he turns to a hypothetical case (81-8). Maxwell is an actual person and Twin Maxwell is a hypothetical individual who occupies a possible world in which the evolution of color vision proceeded somewhat differently than in the actual world. Alternatively, Maxwell and Twin Maxwell might be supposed to belong to distinct but similar species in the same world. They are exactly alike at the receptoral level. Indeed, by stipulation, when they view the same object, x, they stand in the optimal tracking relation to the very same non-relational chromatic property of x: there is not just overlap but complete identity in what they optimally track. But, the case continues, they differ radically in postreceptoral "opponent" processing and color-related sorting and discriminatory behavior. In fact, we might suppose they differ in these respects more radically than John and Jane do. This is a theory-neutral description of the case.

Cohen argues that Maxwell and Twin Maxwell would represent x as having different colors, for instance unitary blue and orange. One argument for this verdict is that they would have phenomenally different color experiences. And, as Cohen argues (91), if two individuals have different color experiences, and the difference is not due to a difference in illumination, then nothing could be more natural than to say things look different in color to them. (Indeed, although Cohen himself remains neutral on whether there would be an experiential difference in the Maxwell-Twin Maxwell case, it seems to me that there would be a representational difference only if there would be an experiential difference.) This verdict is bolstered by consideration of other cases. In general, if two individuals track the same external properties (chemical properties, bodily disturbances, shapes), but undergo radically different internal processing (across-fiber patterns, somatosensory firing rates, shape processing), and exhibit radically different affective and sorting behavior, then arguably things experientially seem different to them. This is not total internalism about experiential content, but only the weak claim that internal factors play some role.

But in the Maxwell-Twin Maxwell case, in contrast to the John-Jane case, selectionism cannot accommodate the verdict of different color contents, at least if selection is explained in terms of tracking. In the John-Jane case, the selectionist can speculate that, since John and Jane represent different colors, and since (on a natural version of his view) representing is tracking, they must optimally track subtly distinct (albeit overlapping) reflectance-types. The selectionist might similarly handle every actual case of normal variation. By contrast, in the Maxwell-Twin Maxwell case, it is stipulated that on viewing x they bear the optimal tracking relation to the very same non-relational reflectance-type possessed by x. Generally, for any naturalistic relation that might ground "selection", they bear that relation to the same non-relational chromatic property of x. So even if x has multiple non-relational chromatic properties, a "selectionist" account of how Maxwell and Twin Maxwell ostensibly perceive different such properties seems impossible. By contrast, Cohen says that one can easily say that Maxwell and Twin Maxwell represent x as having the different color properties, if we adopt his relational pluralism and construe them as relational properties along the lines of causing a unitary blue experience in Maxwell and causing an orange experience in Twin Maxwell (88).

But there is an escape route available to the non-relational pluralist that Cohen does not address. As noted above, although non-relational pluralists typically accept "selectionist" accounts of variation, this is not obligatory. So, in response to the Maxwell-Twin Maxwell case, non-relationalist pluralists about color might simply reject selectionism about color perception - at least if selection is explained in terms of tracking as Cohen suggests. For instance, if he is a standard intentionalist, he might say the following. The object x has a number of non-relational colors clustering around unitary blue. Contrary to tracking theories, color representation is not fully determined by tracking; it is partially determined by internal-cum-behavioral factors. Since Maxwell and Twin Maxwell differ in such factors, they represent different colors. Maxwell accurately represents x as unitary blue. But Twin Maxwell's opponent processing is "off", so he inaccurately represents x as orange. On this view, colors themselves are not constituted by relations to subjects, but which of them we represent partially depends on facts about subjects. Analogy: arguably, what shapes we are conscious of depends on shape-processing, but shapes are not constituted by relations to subjects. Alternatively, if he is a disjunctivist, the non-relationalist pluralist might say that Maxwell is conscious of x's being unitary blue (this state of the world is 'laid bare' to him) because his internal processing both tracks and suitably matches this state of the world. By contrast, Twin Maxwell's processing is 'off', so he does not perceive any of the multiple bluish colors of x. Instead, he has an illusory experience of x as orange. In short, the suggestion is that, although the non-relational pluralist provides a pluralist account of moderate cases of variation like that of John and Jane, he might provide a inegalitarian account of the more extreme cases typified by Maxwell and Twin Maxwell. Call this the internal-dependence gambit.

Of course, since for the non-relational pluralist the internal-dependence gambit requires an inegalitarian account of the Maxwell-Twin Maxwell case, Cohen will raise his usual objection to inegalitarianism: the non-relational pluralist can only provide a (by his lights, inadequate) non-reductive, supervenience answer to the question 'what makes it the case that Maxwell is right and Twin Maxwell is wrong?'. By contrast, Cohen's account of the case might be fully reductive. For instance, he might say Maxwell and Twin Maxwell's different color experiences just are their different internal neural states, and then provide some reductive account of how they (accurately) represent different relational color properties of x (but see below). But, as already noted, the reductionist requirement is controversial. Perhaps, however, Cohen could raise an epistemic objection to the internal-dependence gambit. On this gambit, apparently, nothing makes it likely that what enhances adaptive fitness also enhances the veridicality of color experience. (Contrast shape experience.) In fact, given the internal-dependence gambit, one can easily imagine cases in which veridicality is improbable: if the non-relational colors possessed by fruits and foliage prior to the evolution of color vision were in fact similar shades of dull brown, creatures would still likely have evolved to see them as having bright, contrasting colors. So, on this view, if (like Maxwell and unlike Twin Maxwell) we evolved internal wiring that occasionally makes us conscious of colors that fall within the narrow color clusters objects had prior to the evolution of color vision, then this is complete luck. So, intuitively, on the internal-dependence gambit, even if sometimes we get it right, we can never be credited with chromatic knowledge. Cohen's relationalism escapes the worry: since the colors of things are fixed by the colors they appear to have under normal conditions, veridicality under normal conditions is virtually guaranteed however we evolved.

This concludes my discussion of Cohen's master argument. Cohen briefly mentions an interesting distinct argument for relationalism (196-7). It is based on color structure claims like 'purple is a perceptual mixture of blue and red', and 'blue is more like purple than green'. I think Cohen might have made an additional point in favor of his relationalism and against non-relationalism. Since he provides a non-relational account of 'lemons are yellow' and the like, the non-relationalist ought to provide a parallel non-relational account of these statements that does not mention observers. But, at least if he is a reductive non-relationalist who identifies colors with reflectance-types, the only way to do this is to maintain that the truth-conditions of such statements somehow involve grossly complicated, recherché non-linear functions of various kinds, because the structure of reflectance-types does not match the ostensible structure of colors.[8] It would seem very difficult to devise a theory of representation that explains how this might be so. By contrast, Cohen's relationalism might avoid this complexity. He identifies colors with relations to color experiences. He might identify color experiences with neural states, so that colors have the relevant structural features just in the case the relevant neural states do. And, if something like the opponent process theory (discussed by Cohen at p. 83. n.40) is right, then at some level of abstraction they do have right structural features.

Let me conclude with a general point. Although Cohen's book and philosophical tradition treat actual variation in color appearance as of prime importance in the philosophy of color, in the end it is unclear how much of a role it might play in an argument for relationalism or any other theory of color. Granted, it might rule out one view: reductive inegalitarianism. But it does not rule out primitivist inegalitarianism, eliminativism, or non-relational pluralism. Cohen can only eliminate these rivals in a piecemeal fashion, appealing to considerations far-removed from actual variation: the reductionist requirement, Mooreanism, hypothetical cases like that involving Maxwell, epistemic considerations, considerations about color structure, and so on. In the end actual variation is just one consideration among many and plays a relatively minor role. This is not a criticism but it suggests Cohen's argument should perhaps not be described as a master argument based on actual variation.

Problems with Relationalism. Cohen's discussion of problems is thorough and interesting. Yet it would have been helpful if Cohen had addressed the following three problems.

(1) Suppose John says (i) 'The chip is unitary green'. Later, when John is absent, Jane says (ii) 'the chip is green-blue' and then adds (iii) 'the chip is not unitary green'. As noted at the outset, Cohen achieves his pluralistic aim of making utterances (i) and (ii) true by adopting a contextualist theory and holding that in these cases the relevant individuals and circumstances shrink and concern those very individuals and their present circumstances (120). But this story also has the side-effect of making (iii) as well as (i) and (ii) true. For it is not the case that the chip causes a unitary green experience in a perceiver with an instance of Jane's precise perceptual system type in an instance of the precise type of perceptual circumstance under which she views the chip; rather, it causes a green-blue experience in this context. But we not only have the conflict intuition that (i) and (ii) are incompatible, discussed previously as a motivation for inegalitarianism; we have an even more robust disagreement intuition that (i) and (iii) contradict. (Perhaps if a brown leaf is painted green, then in one context 'the leaf is green' counts as true and in another 'the leaf is not green' counts as true; but when the contextually-relevant part of an object o is fixed, as in the John-Jane case, we strongly intuit that 'o is C' and 'o is not C' contradict.) Even if he is right that his contextualism can sometimes accommodate the disagreement intuition (127-8), it cannot do so in this case. Indeed there are many (though perhaps less serious) problems with contextualism that Cohen does not address: for instance, we report color beliefs disquotationally, which would seem to be an error on contextualism.

Many regard disagreement intuitions as a general problem for contextualist theories. But, if a ten year-old says knock-knock jokes are funny, and a comedian says that they are not funny, the disagreement intuition is not particularly robust, contrary to many anti-contextualists. By contrast, in the color case, the disagreement intuition seems to me more robust, and so more problematic for contextualism. Further, while in many cases there are contextualist-friendly ways of explaining away disagreement intuitions (for instance, saying that there is only disagreement in the sense of an activity among conversational partners), they do not apply in the John-Jane example above.[9]

Cohen might reply that nevertheless a contextualist theory of the kind he favors which forsakes the disagreement intuition is overall best, because accepting the disagreement intuition leads to an intolerable inegalitarianism. But this is not obvious. For instance, an eliminativist invariantist (non-contextualist/relationalist) theory honors the disagreement intuition but avoids inegalitarianism by making all positive color utterances strictly speaking false. And non-relational pluralism honors the disagreement intuition while avoiding inegalitarianism: on this view, while (i) and (ii) are not incompatible, at least (i) and (iii) are. Finally, contemporary "relativism" honors the disagreement intuition but avoids inegalitarianism (and so, contrary to Cohen (106, n7), seems germane to his concerns). It is even more radical than the previous options: in one version, it entails that John can truly say that what he said is accurate and what Jane said is inaccurate, and Jane can truly say that what she said is accurate and what John said is inaccurate.

(2) Suppose you look at a tomato and have phenomenal property R. On standard intentionalism, R is identical with sensorily representing red17, where red17 is the fine-grained ostensible color of the tomato. On his relationalism, red17 is identical with the property of causing the occurrence of phenomenal property R in individual I and circumstance C. The combination of his relationalism and standard intentionalism yields, via substitution, the absurd result that red17 is identical with the property of causing the occurrence of the property of sensorily representing red17 in individual I and circumstance C. (Cohen (170) resists arguments of this kind by saying that substitution fails because the relevant contexts are intensional, but my version avoids this worry because here the relevant context is an extensional causal context.) So Cohen cannot combine his relationalism about color with standard intentionalism or any other theory that explains color experience in terms of a relation to color properties. He needs an account of R that does not itself appeal to ordinary color properties. Cohen mentions some examples: the sense datum theory, Chalmers' perfect colors intentionalism, and biological type-type identity (170). While Cohen does not take a stand on color experience (even though he said the aim of the book was to develop a coherent package of views), his physicalism means that among these options Cohen must choose the biological theory. But the claim of the biological theory that R is necessarily identical with some internal neural property N goes against much recent work on perceptual experience. It goes against the 'transparency observation'. Further, R is essentially intentional: it is essentially as of a red and round thing at a certain viewer-relative place. But any neural property N, like a sentence of English, has its intentional properties only contingently owing to its relations to the environment and action: it is not essentially 'as of' a red and round and round thing at a certain place. So how could R be necessarily identical with a mere neural property N?

(3) Cohen's relationalism consists of two major claims (116 and elsewhere). First, the sensory representation claim: if individual I has a visual experience E in fine-grained circumstance C, then E represents the fine-grained relational property causing E in I under C. (This has the mildly strange consequence that no two people ever sensorily represent the same color property. It also entails that, when a white wall under red light causes one to have a pink experience, the pink experience is fully veridical: it veridically represents the wall as causing a pink experience in one.) Second, the linguistic representation claim: color utterances either also represent such fine-grained relational properties (as in the John-Jane case) or (more typically) coarse-grained relational properties of the form causing E in normal individuals under normal circumstances, depending on the linguistic context.

There is a "psychosemantic" argument against both claims. To illustrate, consider John and Jane. On Cohen's view, John's unitary green experience G (realized by internal state S1) represents causing G in John under circumstance C1, and Jane's blue-green experience B (realized by internal state S2) represents causing B in Jane under circumstance C2. Cohen and many others claim that experiences represent such relational properties involving those very experiences (often called 'appearance properties'), but they have not provided a theory of sensory representation (a "psychosemantics") to explain how this might be so.[10] The worry is that Cohen's version of the idea is incompatible with any reasonable psychosemantics, for two reasons. First, on any psychosemantics for sensory representation, an inner state-type like S1 (John's present state) has the same content when it occurs in different individuals. (That is because S1's content is determined by its functional-causal role among the general population: as it might be, what it tracks under optimal conditions, or what it has the function of indicating.) It seems very unlikely indeed that S1's population-wide content is something is causing G in John under C1. Second, on standard psychosemantics for sensory representation, S1 represents what it caused by under optimal conditions, or what it has the function of indicating. Intuitively, however, S1 is not caused by, nor does it have the function of indicating, the property causing G (realized by S1) in John under circumstance C1. If anything, it is caused by, and has the function of indicating, something like the enduring, biologically important reflectance property of the chip. (If it could be made plausible that S1 is caused by, and has the function of indicating, the property of causing G (realized by S1) in John under circumstance C1, then a promiscuity problem would arise: by parity, S1 is caused by, and has the function of indicating, a number of such relational properties (e. g. causing B in Jane under circumstance C2). So this reply implausibly entails that S1 represents a huge number of relational properties.) For these two reasons, it seems to me that any psychosemantic theory will entail that John and Jane's sensory states S1 and S2 represent properties O and O* other than Cohen's fine-grained relational properties. As we saw previously, on a tracking or teleological theory, in accordance with non-relational pluralism, O and O* will be overlapping, non-relational reflectance-types. Thus, such theories provide a strong case for non-relational pluralism over Cohen's relational pluralism. Others will say the right theory of sensory representation has it that O and O* are primitive properties of some kind.

Now let us turn to Cohen's linguistic claim. Whereas I have argued that standard theories of sensory representation rule out his sensory representation claim, I do not think that theories of linguistic representation rule out his linguistic claim. After all, some linguistic items (e. g. 'is funny') presumably do express relational properties (e. g. being funny to ten-year-olds). But the failure of Cohen's linguistic representation claim might follow directly from the failure of his sensory representation claim, given a plausible harmony principle: the properties represented by our color utterances and beliefs are of roughly the same kind as the properties represented by our color experiences. What does 'roughly the same kind' mean? Presumably, the properties represented by color predicates are generally determinables of the highly determinate properties represented by our color experiences. Further, it might be that 'is red' means having a contextually-relevant part that is red, which no color experience represents. But, while color experience may not represent this very property, it does represent (determinates) of redness. Now we have just seen that, given any reasonable psychosemantics for sensory representation, our color experiences arguably do not represent Cohen's (fine-grained or coarse-grained) relational properties, but some other properties O and O*. Given the harmony principle, it would follow that John and Jane's utterances also do not attribute to the chip Cohen's (fine-grained or coarse-grained) relational properties, but rather properties of roughly the same kind as O and O* (as it might be, overlapping reflectance-types, or primitive non-relational properties).

Cohen might reply as follows. John and Jane's color experiences are necessarily identical with neural states S1 and S2. (As we saw, Cohen is under some pressure to adopt this view.) These neural states are apt to cause John and Jane to form certain color beliefs and make certain utterances. On the best theory of their content, the reply continues, they represent Cohen's relational properties, in accordance with his linguistic representation claim. (Above I allowed that no theory of linguistic representation rules out this claim.) Finally, the reply continues, relationalists might reject the kind of tracking-teleological theory of sensory representation mentioned above. Instead, he might accept a doxastic theory of sensory representation, on which (very roughly) a sensory state S represents property P in an individual I if S is apt to cause in I the belief that something before him has P. In this derivative sense, John and Jane's color experiences might be said to represent Cohen's (fine-grained or coarse-grained) relational properties, roughly in accordance with his sensory representation claim. The problem with this response, it seems to me, is that it forsakes the extremely plausible and widely-accepted claim that experiences have color contents that are constitutively independent of the contents of the beliefs we form on the basis of those experiences.

But, of course, every theory of color and color experience has serious costs. Cohen's book provides the most complete and sophisticated case to date that the considerable benefits of relationalism outweigh its costs. In addition, it contains important and thorough discussions of nearly every rival theory of color. Cohen presents his ideas admirably. This is the most important book on color in some time.


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Byrne, Alex and Hilbert, David. (1997). Colors and reflectances. In Readings on Color, Volume 1: The Philosophy of Color (ed. A. Byrne and D. R. Hilbert), pp. 263-288. MIT Press, Cambridge, Massachusetts.

Byrne, Alex and Hilbert, David. (2004). Hardin, Tye, and color physicalism. The Journal of Philosophy, CI(1), 37-43.

Byrne, Alex and Hilbert, David. (2007b). Truest blue. Analysis, 67(293), 87-92.

Cappelen, Herman and Hawthorne, John. (2009). Relativism and Monadic Truth. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Chalmers, David. (2006). Perception and the fall from Eden. In Perceptual Experience (ed. T. S. Gendler and J. Hawthorne), pp. 49-125. Oxford University Press, New York.

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[1] See Jackson and Pargetter (1987) and McLaughlin (2003). There is a difference between these authors and Cohen. They are realizer functionalists about color. By contrast, Cohen's view is unique in that it is role functionalist (184) -- something that was not so clear in some of his earlier work. However, realizer and role functionalists agree on the truth-conditions of whole color predications; they only disagree about the referents of color nouns. The dispute might appear trivial. (Indeed, Lewis (1994, 420) says the analogous realizer-role dispute in the mental case is 'superficial'.) But it is related to interesting modal issues, as Cohen discusses (195, 198).

[2] Tye 2006 and Byrne and Hilbert 2007 begin with this argument. Cohen might reply that the conflict intuition is dubious on the grounds that a survey conducted by Cohen and Nichols (reported by Cohen at p. 148) shows that many do not share this intuition. Cohen and Nichols presented undergraduate students with a case of variation and gave them three options: (i) variant 1 is right and variant 2 is wrong, (ii) variant 2 is right and variant 1 is wrong, (iii) there is no (absolute) fact of the matter. Cohen and Nichols found that some students chose (iii). But, even if students have conflict intuition, they are unlikely to choose (i) or (ii), given the symmetry of the evidence and the absence of an 'independent test' for color. In addition, (iii) is extremely vague: while it can be taken to express relationalism, it can also be taken to express an eliminativist or non-factualist attitude quite consistent with the conflict intuition. Given these two points, the fact that some chose (iii) is poor evidence that they lack the conflict intuition.

[3] For the supervenience answer, see Byrne and Hilbert 2007, 88-89 (though they do not use this name).

[4] As Cohen notes (47), Byrne and Hilbert try to defend inegalitarianism by saying that cases like the John-Jane case are similar to a case involving miscalibrated thermometers in which inegalitarianism seems like the right verdict. Cohen replies (52) that it is not obvious that the cases are similar. Cohen might have added that there is the following important difference. In the thermometer case, inegalitarianism is only plausible if some thermometers are miscalibrated or operating in non-optimal conditions. By contrast, neither John nor Jane is miscalibrated or operating in non-optimal conditions. So, whereas a plausible reductive psychosemantic theory might be consistent with inegalitarianism in the thermometer case, no reductive psychosemantic theory is consistent with inegalitarianism in the John-Jane case. The reductive inegalitarian might object against Cohen that the problem merely concerns providing a reductive theory of the representation of fine-grained colors (Byrne and Hilbert 2007, 90). In fact, this is not the problem Cohen stresses. Indeed, a simple tracking theory provides such a theory: as we saw, it entails that the fine-grained colors which John and Jane represent are identical with highly overlapping but distinct reflectance-types, in favor of (non-relational) pluralism and against inegalitarianism. The problem for reductive inegalitarians like Byrne and Hilbert is how to devise a (different) reductive account of the situation compatible with their inegalitarianism.

[5] For a strong statement of anti-Mooreanism, see Sider (forthcoming).

[6] For different versions of conciliatory eliminativism, see Jackson 1977, 128 and Chalmers 2006, 92.

[7] Byrne and Hilbert (1997, 223) and Kalderon (2007, 583) describe non-relational pluralism as a possibility. Kalderon also is responsible for the metaphor of 'selection'. But they admit that they do not have an argument for non-relational pluralism. (More recently, Byrne and Hilbert (2004, 2007) side with inegalitarianism.) However, as noted in the text (and as discussed at the end of this review), it might be that tracking theories and other naturalistic theories of representation provide a kind of psychosemantic argument for non-relational pluralism, so that Cohen must consider it a particularly serious rival to his relational pluralism. By contrast, as we have seen, inegalitarianism actually seems to conflict with reductive psychosemantics, making the reductive inegalitarianism of Tye and Byrne and Hilbert an inconsistent position. So, non-relational pluralism would be a natural retreat for reductive inegalitarians, even if it violates the conflict intuition motivating their inegalitarianism.

[8] Tye and Bradley 2001, 482.