2010.04.03

Melinda A. Roberts, David T. Wasserman (eds.)

Harming Future Persons: Ethics, Genetics and the Nonidentity Problem

Melinda A. Roberts and David T. Wasserman (eds.), Harming Future Persons: Ethics, Genetics and the Nonidentity Problem, Springer, 2009, 348pp., $189.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781402056963.

Reviewed by Jörg Chet Tremmel, London School of Economics and Political Science, and Ned Chambers, University of Nottingham


 

In both everyday conduct and in specific ethical cases we generally feel an intuitive obligation to treat future, as-yet-nonexistent persons in roughly the same way that we would treat existing persons. This is noted by Melinda A. Roberts and David T. Wasserman in their introduction to this anthology. In many situations -- from the way that we approach the moral complexities surrounding a pregnancy to the terms that we lay down in a climate change agreement that will affect the standard of life for generations to come -- it can be difficult to decide upon exactly what our obligations to future persons are. Is it possible that we have no obligation at all towards posterity? Is it possible that a future individual cannot be harmed or wronged through our actions in the present day? A compelling complication when considering future generations, and the focus of this anthology, is the nonidentity problem.

The nonidentity problem or 'future individual paradox' was first mentioned by Schwartz (1978)[1] and Adams (1979)[2], then discussed in more detail by Kavka (1982), and most famously by Parfit (1984).[3] This problem is rooted in the observation that future persons may sometimes owe their very existence and identity to choices made by present persons -- choices that, however, appear to make things worse for those same future persons. In these cases, if we had chosen a different course of action, those future persons would not have the same identity -- that is to say they would not be the same persons, but rather “nonidentical” others -- as they would have had if the choice that appears to worsen their life had been taken. Should a decision play such a crucial role in someone's identity, or in their very being, it is, as long as their life is still worth living, virtually impossible to say that the same decision has made life worse for that person, because we could not have taken an alternative course of action to make things better for that very same person. This faces us with the problem in question: if we cannot say that a future person has been wronged, or made worse off, by such a choice, but we still intuitively feel that the choice has a negative effect on the future person, how do we ground or justify these convictions through reasoning? This is the central conflict at play in the nonidentity problem.

A useful illustration of the nonidentity problem brought up in this anthology is Parfit's analogy of the broken glass (pp. xvii-xviii).[4] Suppose that one walks through the woods and, for no good reason, leaves some broken glass in the undergrowth. Later on during that same evening, one conceives one's first child. Years later when that child is born and grown up, the child walks in those woods and is badly cut by the same broken glass. As the simple act of leaving the broken glass inextricably accelerated the conception by a few seconds, one could plausibly say that, had the glass not been left behind, that same child would have never been conceived, or another nonidentical child would have been born to the same person under different circumstances. We intuitively feel that it is wrong to leave broken glass lying around where people might accidentally injure themselves on it. Can that same child, however, accuse his parent of having wronged or harmed him if he owes his very existence to that shard of glass? The nonidentity problem demonstrated here affects considerations in several ethical, political and legal fields, including that of intergenerational justice.

This anthology, comprising an introduction by the editors followed by sixteen essays divided into seven parts addressing different aspects of the problem, seeks to explore the complexities surrounding the nonidentity problem from differing scholarly perspectives.

In Part I (which contains only one article, Can Bringing a Person into Existence Harm That Person? Can an Act That Harms No One Be Wrong?) David Heyd argues for the intractability, or "stubbornness", of the nonidentity problem. His essay defends a person-affecting approach to the problem using the addition of "biographical identity" to the strictly defined concept of numerical identity that is usually considered in nonidentity cases. He starts out by outlining the logical and metaphysical dimensions of the nonidentity problem, asserting that the nonidentity problem may be divided into a two-tiered set of questions: firstly, is the identity of persons at all relevant to ethical judgement, and, if so, secondly, how do we define the kind of identity considered in these judgements (pp. 3-4)? Proceeding to his argument, he outlines the four possible stances from which one may respond to the nonidentity problem: deny it is a problem and assume an impersonal approach, aspire to solve it by searching for a currently unknown integrative moral theory, make the problem more palatable by supplementing a person-affecting approach with impersonal features, or accept all the implications of the nonidentity problem and face it with a strict person-affecting approach (pp. 5-17).

Following this, Heyd proceeds systematically to point out the shortcomings and weaknesses of the first three possible points of view. His critique of impersonalism weights itself upon the difficulty of impersonally and objectively measuring what makes the world better or what makes people happier, above all emphasising the difficulty of individualising depersonalised experiences (p. 6-7). Heyd argues that the inextricably metaphysical aspect of the nonidentity problem renders useless any attempts to regard nonidentity as a scientific or mathematical problem which can be solved through objective values (p. 8). He then settles upon a strict person-affecting view as being a "lesser theoretical evil" with regards to its consistency and its appeal to our basic intuitions (pp. 15-17). In a final part Heyd discusses the relevance of biographical identity to the nonidentity problem, claiming that wrongful identity complaints are made just as incoherent by the nonidentity problem as wrongful life complaints (pp. 17-21).

Part II, If Bringing a Badly Off Person into Existence is Wrong, is Not Bringing a Well Off Person into Existence Also Wrong?, begins with an article by Ingmar Persson focusing on the asymmetry between creating good and bad lives. Persson claims that common sense morality dictates a doctrine of negative rights -- we feel it is our duty to prevent negative infringement on one's standard of life, but we feel less obliged to follow reasons of beneficence in order to positively affect lives (p. 30). The author proposes a rejection of the negative rights theory with regard to procreative obligations and suggests that we substitute it with an alternative view that we "have reasons to create good lives, proportionate to their goodness, just as we have reasons against creating bad lives, proportionate to their badness" (p. 30).

Persson argues more or less for a balanced symmetry that gives "as much reason to see to it that worthwhile lives begin as that miserable lives do not" (p. 29). The next paper, by Jeff McMahan, accepts that the asymmetry is difficult to avoid, leaning instead in favour of what he terms the "Weak Asymmetry". Weak asymmetry finds a middle ground between the two extremes of believing the total asymmetry that both McMahan and Persson reject and the impersonalist balance that Persson seems to defend. It argues that, as opposed to the total discounting of positive reasons (serving only to cancel out the negative instead of being standalone reasons to create lives in their own right), there are reasons to create worthwhile lives, but that they are weaker than the reasons not to create miserable lives (p. 57). McMahan contrasts this with Benatar's approach[5] to the asymmetry, labelling Benatar's approach "antinatalist" since it seems to suggest that there is a moral reason not to cause even worthwhile lives to exist (pp. 61-64). McMahan, however, concedes that while the weaker asymmetry seems to be the most palatable option, none of the proposed theoretical defenses of the asymmetry provide a solution that is easy to embrace (pp. 66-67). As such, both McMahan and Persson, though differing slightly in approach, both conclude on a note that seems to suggest impersonalism as a more fitting approach both to the asymmetry and, we may infer, to the nonidentity problem.

Identity and our conceptions of it form the majority of what is discussed in Part III, Must an Act Worse for People be Worse for a Particular Person? Nils Holtug's essay "Who Cares About Identity?" opens the section with an argument for insignificance of transworld identity in both moral and prudential matters. According to the author, it does not matter, morally or prudentially, "when comparing welfare distributions across possible worlds, whether or not the same people exist in these worlds" (p. 71). A wide person-affecting principle is employed to defend this claim. What matters under this principle is not that one comes into existence, or continues to exist, but that an appropriate continuer/replacement receives the benefits in question (p. 71). The end of the essay explains the consequences of Holtug's argument when applied to gene therapy, implying that "there can be person-affecting reasons to perform non-identity [therapy on a foetus] that rests on the self-interests of the new person, and even the pre-therapy fetus and the original person" (pp. 84-88).

From a quite different angle, Clark Wolf claims in "Do Future Persons Presently Have Alternate Possible Identities?" that our struggle with the nonidentity problem arises from the false assumption that personal identity has a very strict and narrow definition. The author advocates the position that, in reality, the criteria for transworld identity are much vaguer and more difficult to pinpoint than the conceptions of identity that are needed in order to tackle moral cases involving future persons (p. 93). Adapting Parfit's famous example of 'Depletionary Policy',[6] Wolf writes:

The U.S. President faces a decision that will determine the future of energy policy and will influence the availability of energy alternatives for many generations in the future. Policy A will create dramatic but relatively short-term benefits for the next two or three generations, but is expected to lead to environmental disaster in the long run. Policy B will yield slightly lower benefits in the proximate future, but these benefits will be sustainable for the foreseeable future. (p. 95)

In other words, there could be two options: to tackle climate change, or to spoil the climate for many generations to come. If the nonidentity problem applies, the US president would not act immorally if she chose option B because a different population would come into existence and they would have no reason to complain as they would have otherwise never existed at all.[7] The nonidentity problem is a nightmare for all theories of intergenerational justice! Wolf proposes a much more flexible conception of identity that cancels out any conflicts of "nonidentity" that would otherwise arise (see below).

While Holtug and Wolf both tackle notions of identity head-first, Tim Mulgan brings into play a supposedly more pragmatic approach to nonidentity, exploring how rule consequentialism can be used to help solve the nonidentity problem. His argument states that "rule consequentialism accommodates person-affecting intuitions without abandoning Parfit's no difference view" (p. 115). Proposing a new model of rule consequentialism that accommodates ordinary human traits of human and fallibility, Mulgan reflects on what concepts of identity ordinary human agents will be capable of applying in real life circumstances. He goes on to advocate the internalisation of an ideal code that incorporates viewpoints set forward previously in the chapters by Holtug and Wolf, setting aside previous stringent conceptions of identity, permitting agents to call upon commonsensical person-affecting principles in their judgement in order to justifiably treat, for example, "different people" choices as "same people" choices (pp. 127-130). Here Mulgan defends, above all, the psychological viability and thus the pragmatic aspect of the "ideal code" strategy and its ability to be internalised by future generations.

Part IV, Is the Argument to 'No Harm Done' Correct? Must an Act that Harms a Person Make that Person Worse Off?, contains four essays on the validity of the "No Harm Done" argument and the complexities of the harm issue in nonidentity cases. In "Harm as Causing Harm", Elizabeth Harman explores, with a focus on the subject of harm done, the particularly hard nonidentity cases in which an individual is not choosing comparatively between bringing one person into existence instead of another but is deciding non-comparatively whether to procreate at all (p. 137). She proposes a solution to the nonidentity problem "both [explaining] why the actions are wrong and [vindicating] the appearance that the actions are wrong in virtue of harming the relevant people" (p. 137).

Bonnie Steinbock, in "Wrongful Life and Procreative Decisions", argues for a defense and refinement of the claim that "procreation can be wrongful" (p. 155). That is, the nonidentity problem, though posing a challenge to moral matters, does not and should not require us to abandon our intuition that we should consider the welfare of the offspring in procreative decisions. Most obviously, Steinbock claims, it is harmful to bring someone into existence who meets the "non-existence condition" -- i.e., in the rare case where a child may be brought into a life of suffering that lacks all the conditions that make live worth living, and thus would have been better off unborn (pp. 161-162). It can, she argues, also be wrong to bring someone into an existence that does not meet a "decent minimum standard" of life. Such cases are subject, however, to debate among reasonable people as to what constitutes a "decent minimum", since even those born with debilitating disabilities may be able to have a life worth living depending on the efforts and resources of the parents (pp. 163-165). Steinbock suggests the impersonal "substitution principle" as a way of reasoning in these cases (pp. 172-174). Despite impersonal leanings, Steinbock concludes on a concession that "the morality of procreation, and the obligation to avoid procreation, is based partly on an objective assessment of the likely quality of the future child's life, but also on the reasons, intentions and attitudes of those who would have children" (p. 174).

Matthew Hanser's chapter, "Harming and Procreating", stands as a striking contrast to Harman's and Steinbock's considerations of harm in nonidentity cases. Hanser suggests a two-part test for discerning whether an agent has harmed a person, making a distinction between the fact that a person has been harmed and the separate conclusion that the agent is "at least partially responsible" in some way for harming the harmed person and thus making that person a victim of the agent's action (pp. 181-182). Hanser, however, regards with scepticism the possibility of linking the agent's action with the person's bad state -- for example, it is unclear how we may accuse a parent of causing harm by giving birth to a disabled child whose life is still worthwhile when their only other option is not to give birth to that child at all. Hanser concludes that in such nonidentity cases where Harman and Steinbock would conclude that a child has been wronged it is difficult "to find convincing grounds for thinking that such a relation holds between the parents of the disabled child and their disability" (pp. 195-196).

Melinda A. Roberts (one of the volume's two editors) concludes Part IV with "The Nonidentity Problem and the Two Envelope Problem: When is One Act Better for a Person than Another?" She draws a parallel between the nonidentity problem and the two-envelope problem (a logical paradox within Bayesian probability involving the switching of two envelopes) in the interest of defending an intuitive approach to nonidentity matters and questions of harm. Roberts first examines the complexities of the Can't-Do-Better problem and particularly the Can't-Expect-Better problem, citing Kavka's slave child case[8] -- wherein a couple enters into a contract that forces them to conceive and give away their child into slavery in exchange for money that will go to selfish ends -- and subsequently outlining and examining the two-envelope problem. She comes to the conclusion that, in both cases, the perceived problem arises because we are "haphazardly selecting from a potpourri of actual and expected values that can be … attached to the acts under scrutiny" (p. 201). When we follow a more orderly array of values we come to betterness results that mirror our initial intuitions, leading to the conclusion that "our best theories and best thinking leads us to exactly the same results" as our intuitions (p. 222).

Part V, Is the Morality of Parental Reproductive Choice Special? Can Intentions and Attitudes Make an Act that Harms No One Wrong?, concentrates on asking whether reproductive decision-making calls for its own unique moral approach. Hallvard Lillehammer discusses the difference between "person-involving" or "impersonal" reproductive decisions and partiality and impartiality in such choices. He suggests that "person-involving" and "partiality" do not always go hand in hand, explaining, for example, that some decisions can be person-involving and impartial at the same time (pp. 234-237). He contends that it is the other way round, however, that best fits reproductive moral decision-making (pp. 237-240). Lillehammer rejects the idea of total impartiality in reproductive matters, systematically asserting the difficulty of drawing comparisons between partial and impartial values while drawing the conclusion that "it is natural to expect that most reasonable reproductive choices will be based on a combination of partial and impartial values" (p. 246).

Peter Herissone-Kelly argues for an interesting variant on the person-affecting approach to procreative decision-making. He rejects the impersonal "principle of procreative beneficence" (p. 249) arguing that, instead of making procreative decisions from an external perspective (choosing one prospective child over another because one embryo appears to have an "objectively" better living standard), it is more appropriate for parents to adopt an "internal perspective" in reproductive choices (pp. 256-258). In these cases, instead of imagining two different potential children's lives from a step back, it is, according to Herissone-Kelly, better to "imaginatively inhabit" the child's life and gauge subjectively, according to a "principle of acceptable outlook" (p. 262), whether one would be content in the child's position. This, he concludes, would make it a "matter of indifference" (p. 262) whether one embryo or another is chosen as long as both meet a quality of life that does not fall below this "level of acceptable outlook".

Taking a different tack, David T. Wasserman (also an editor of the volume) asserts that it is not just the act and its consequences that should be taken into account when making decisions affecting future persons, but also our intentions behind the choices that we make (p. 265). A couple who decide consciously, intentionally and under affectionate and caring premises, to bring a child with a disability into the world cannot be accused of wronging the child provided that the child's life is worth living. By contrast, a child that has been principally brought into existence by its parents to serve as a "saviour sibling" and provide blood or other tissues to its existing siblings can be said to have been wronged by its parents on account of the fact that the parents' attitude towards the child's conception is disrespectful, even if its life is otherwise well worth living. Following the application of this intention-based principle to small-scale procreative choices, Wasserman demonstrates its similar moral consequences for large-scale policy decisions.

In Part VI, Is the Person Affecting Approach Objectionable Independent of the Nonidentity Problem?, Gustav Arrhenius questions the cogency and usefulness of the person-affecting restriction in population ethics. Arrhenius notes that restricting impersonal theories with personal-affecting elements possesses a certain intuitive appeal in seeming to find a solution to some of the more "disagreeable implications" of impersonal theories (p. 289). Outlining some such formulations of Comparativism which he deems to be "quite acceptable" on the outset, he goes on to argue that, on the other hand, these theories not only largely contain counterintuitive implications but, in any case, are rendered unhelpful by their compatibility with Total Utilitarianism and other such neutral impersonal theories (p. 297). Lastly he considers the advantages and disadvantages of Soft Comparativism as the most attractive alternative (pp. 301-303), though conceding that it still presents conflicts with the Repugnant Conclusion and does not solve problems involving tradeoffs between the welfare of "non-uniquely" and "uniquely" realizable persons (p. 309).

Part VII, What are the Implications of the Nonidentity Problem for Law and Public Policy?, acknowledges the new challenges for law and public policy if the nonidentity problem has bite. The essay by Philip Peters recapitulates why many courts in the Western hemisphere have rejected claims for wrongful life. Tort law and the law of negligence are constructed in person-affecting terms. In an act not "bad for" any specific person, no compensation is due to any claimant. But Peters distinguishes between law and morality by saying that such an act can still be morally wrong.

In the closing chapter Seana Shiffrin voices a final objection to the nonidentity problem by exploring the concept of reparations for historical injustices -- examining, in particular, the case of U.S. slavery. Shiffrin begins by outlining many people's philosophical objections to the concept of reparations for slavery -- namely, that both the perpetrators and direct victims of slavery are supposedly distanced from us by several generations, and that those who are affected negatively by slavery also owe their existence to the same historical occurrences, bringing up the "no harm done" argument (pp. 333-334). She refutes, however, the nonidentity-based argument against reparations, holding that "there are no genuine philosophical problems here" (p. 333) on the grounds that nonidentity as a concept "trades on an implausible, economically-influenced, caricature of what constitutes a harm or a wrong" (p. 334). Her argument for the need to implement reparations for previous slavery-related injustices focuses on the idea that slavery transgresses "boundaries of respect" that cannot be negated on simple nonidentity grounds (p. 334). Stating that slavery also has made far broader ripples throughout history than on the descendants of slaves in particular, she holds that, as reparations focus on the "relations between and histories of important social collectives" (p. 335), not being a question of blame or recrimination, we should undertake collective responsibility to make active reparations for historical injustices.

In philosophy, the nonidentity problem has become the leading paradigm. In the succession of paradigms, as described by Thomas S. Kuhn, it is the "normal science" of today.[9] In this anthology, virtually none of the articles explicitly labels the nonidentity problem as esoteric, far-fetched, or generally outlandish. What a pity. It would have benefited from such a radically sceptical view.

The nonidentity problem, if it were relevant, would be of utmost importance for moral judgements in areas such as climate change or reparations, and philosophers have remarked on that.[10] Why is it, then, that outside philosophy there is no talk about the nonidentity problem at all? Neither the climate negotiations in Copenhagen nor the different political talks about reparations (say about compensation for slave workers in Germany during WWII, or slavery in the U.S. before the abolition) have ever mentioned it. Are non-philosphers just too dumb to recognize the problem or are Roberts and Wassermann misled when they claim that the problem is broad and deep (p. xv)? What could be philosophical arguments against the nonidentity problem? We would like to consider two sets of arguments here.

The first set criticises the narrow definition of identity that the nonidentity problem implies. Parfit makes the 'time-dependence claim (TDC)', which he initially formulates as: "TDC 1: If any person had not been conceived when he was in fact conceived, it is in fact true that he would never have ex­isted".[11] Parfit wants to make his argument as strong as possible, so he takes into account that, if an embryo were conceived a few days earlier or later, it would most probably be the result of a different sperm, but of the same egg. He writes: "TDC 2: If any particular person had not been conceived within a month of the time when he was in fact conceived, he would in fact never have existed"[12]. Parfit therefore claims that the identity of a person is at least in part constituted by his or her DNA. This can be called the 'genetic dependence claim', which Tim Mulgan formulates as: If any particular person had not been created from the particular genetic material from which they were in fact created, they would never have existed".[13]

The Western 'body = person notion' is not the only pos­sible way of thinking. Non-Western reincarnation views should not be ruled out from the start. If they constitute what John Rawls[14] dubs "reasonable comprehen­sive doctrines", the nonidentity problem would only apply to a possible, but by no means certain state of affairs. This becomes even clearer if we think of a scenario in which the nonidentity problem could not apply at all -- neither to matters of generational justice, nor to strict matters of reproduction. That would be the case if we take the reincarnation view of many followers of Eastern religions, like Hinduism, Buddhism, and Jainism, as a basis. There are certain differences in the various metempsychotic notions of the religions mentioned that are too complex to be explained in detail here. Also, the element that is reincarnated (Atman) is not necessarily identical with the Western notion of 'self-awareness'.[15] What matters is that, in Eastern traditions, the notion of re­incarnation is dominant, whereas Western cultures primarily know and accept the 'person = body' notion. Mulgan describes one possible form of the reincarnation view:

Each currently existing person has died and been reborn in­numerable times prior to this life and will be reborn many times in the future. When a new human body is formed, a new person is not created. Rather, an already existing person is reborn.[16]

Nonidentity claims presuppose that humans are not reborn. But if we adopt the reincarnation view, the nonidentity paradigm is no longer applicable. Then, the disabled child could very well reproach its parents for having harmed it, because the same person might have been born with a healthy body if it had been born one year later.

The question of whether the Western 'body = person' notion or the Eastern reincarnation view applies cannot be answered empirically -- it is purely metaphysical. One way to deal with this is to consider all (mutually incompatible) notions of death and after-life in ethical issues.

But even if we stick to the Western notion, it is the nonidentity cases, including those described above like the 'broken glass' example, that are problematic from the start because they stretch the concept of identity beyond its meaningful application. This is the point that Clark Wolf makes in the anthology. He questions whether our identity is really fixed to our genetic code in the extremely strict way that the proponents of the nonidentity problem claim. He gives the interesting example of someone who changes his genetic makeup:

If a person were given a genetic therapy that changed the DNA in each of his cells but left other of his charcteristics unchanged, we would not regard him as having become a different person. Genetic therapy of this sort would not, for example, imply that the resultant individual no longer owned property that was owned by the person who chose to undergo the procedure, or that the person who left the operation would not be contractually bound to pay for it (since another person chose to undergo it!) (p. 100)

Another set of arguments against the nonidentity problem is not directed at the definition of 'identity' but at the definition of 'causality' used by the proponents of the nonidentity problem.[17] The nonidentity thesis can be rephrased as follows:

Because of an action by a present agent, a future individual came into existence. This action cannot have harmed this per­son since without it, she would never have existed.

The 'butterfly effect' argument takes issue with the 'because'. The question of which egg and sperm fuse depends on countless actions, so it is misleading to pick out only one that is detrimental to a future person and hold it responsible for the con­ception and birth of a child. In other words: the nonidentity argument describes causalities that cannot be proven. That does not mean that they do not exist. In chaos theory, the flapping of a butterfly's wing in Asia can set off a tornado in the Caribbean. In the same way, one of the countless developments that take place on the day a child is conceived might have an effect on its genetic code. It is misleading, however, to construe a monocausal relationship on the basis of such a weak multicausal connection.

To illustrate the nonidentity problem, Gosseries imagines the fictive dialogue between the fa­ther and his daughter to be as follows:

The car-driver example: Having reached the age of 17 and having be­come a green activist, she asks him: "why did you not choose the bike rather than the car? The atmosphere would be much cleaner today! And given your circumstances at that time, you had no special reason not to take the bike!" The father may well answer: "True. Still, had I done so, you would not be here. Since your life in such a polluted environment is still worth living, why blame me? I certainly did not harm you. Which one of your rights did I violate, then?"[18]

But his daughter would have no reason to fall silent. She could reply:

"Are you actually trying to tell me that this action that was hostile to posterity was responsible for the fact that I was conceived on the 14th of March 2007 at 8:11pm and 43 seconds? Okay, it made you get home half an hour earlier than you would have, had you gone by bike. But remember that you were running late that day anyway, because you had thrown a party the night before. And on the day that I was conceived, you got stuck in a traffic jam for half an hour on your way home. And if you hadn't petted the cat, you would have gotten home five minutes earlier, too. And if you hadn't gone to the fridge just before you had sex with my mother, the conception would have taken place at a different point in time than it actually did. And, anyway, you wouldn't have worked such long hours, had the government not dropped a limit on working hours shortly before. And that, in turn, was done to keep up with Chinese competitors. All that, and a billion other things, is responsible for the fact that I was conceived at 8:11pm and 43 seconds, far more than your taking the car. So don't try to talk your way out of it. There is no excuse for you having polluted the atmosphere."[19]

Our existence is highly sensitive to even the most negligible antecedent events (e.g., looking out of the window, yawning, coughing). For at each second, a man's genetic deck of 200,000,000 gametes are re-shuffled. The proponents of the nonidentity problem suggest that a certain action (e.g., one that is hostile to posterity) of person A was causal for the identity of his successors. But the fusion of a certain egg with a sperm is the result of countless independent actions and chains of actions. It is impossible to assign identifiable effects on concrete per­sonal identities to certain acts of polluting the environment. All the more, it is im­possible to assign an identifiable influence on the conception of certain future per­sons to concrete political programmes. The "sufficient/essential" terminology is inappropriate here. It refers to a straightforward quantity, x1 - xn, not to a virtually endless number of influencing factors.

On the other hand, there are indeed cases in which there is a clear connection between a present action and the procreation of a child. The nonidentity argument applies to reproduction decisions with selective character, usually taking place after conception:

- ending a pregnancy and starting another one

- choosing one specific embryo after a pre-implantation diagnosis (PID)

- cloning

Here is one example where the nonidentity problem applies (and a wrongful life lawsuit will possibly follow):

A deaf British couple choose to have an artificial insemination and the resulting embryo becomes subject to a PID. The parents share the outlook that deafness is not a disease, but rather makes up part of their cultural identity. "It is a cornerstone of modern society and law that deaf and hearing people have equal rights. If hearing people were to have the right to throw away a deaf embryo, then we as deaf people should also have the right to throw away a hearing embryo." The parents thus opt for a deaf embryo.

The nonidentity argument thus applies in the narrow field of reproductive medicine but, fortunately, future generations are usually created the traditional way.

The nonidentity problem has become the incumbent paradigm and the book at hand is ample evidence of this. It invites us to apply a particular conception of 'causality' in contexts where this is inappropriate. It is time to replace this paradigm.


[1] Schwartz T (1978) "Obligations to Posterity". In Sikora R, Barry B (eds.) Obligations to Future Generations. Temple UP, Philadelphia, pp. 3-14.

[2] Adams R (1979) "Existence, Self-interest, and the Problem of Evil". Nous 13 (1), pp. 53-65.

[3] Parfit D (1984) Reasons and Persons, Oxford UP, Oxford.

[4] Parfit D (1987) Reasons and Persons, 2nd revised edition. Clarendon Press, Oxford, pp. 356.

[5] Benetar, David (2006) Better Never to Have Been. Claredon Press, Oxford.

[6] Parfit D (1987), Reasons and Persons, 2nd revised edition. Oxford UP, Oxford p. 367.

[7] This has been described by Edward Page in great detail, see Page E (2007) Climate Change, Justice, and Future Generations. Edward Elgar, Cheltenham. S. 132-160.

[8] Kavka (1981) "The Paradox of Future Individuals". Philosophy & Public Affairs. Vol. 11, pp. 93-112.

[9] Kuhn, Thomas S. (1963) The Structure of Scientific Revolutions. U. of Chicago Press, Chicago, Ch. 2-4.

[10] See e.g. Cohen, Andrew I. (2008) "Compensation for Historic Injustices. Completing the Boxill and Sher Argument". Philosophy and Public Affairs 37 (1), pp. 81-102.

[11] Parfit 1987, p. 351.

[12] Parfit 1987, p. 352.

[13] Mulgan T (2002) "Neutrality, Rebirth and Intergenerational Justice". J Appl Philos 19 (1), pp. 3-15.

[14] Rawls J (1993) Political Liberalism. Columbia UP, New York, p. 59; 1999, pp. 573-615.

[15] For the differences in eastern religions and philosophical traditions, see O' Flaherty W (ed.) (1980) Karma and Rebirth in Classical Indian Traditions. U. of California Press, Berkeley.

[16] Mulgan T (2002) "Neutrality, Rebirth and Intergenerational Justice". J Appl Philos 19 (1), p. 6.

[17] Tremmel (2009) A Theory of Intergenerational Justice. Earthscan, London pp. 40-46.

[18] Gosseries A (2004b) "Constitutionalizing Future Rights?" Intergenerational Justice Rev 4 (2), p. 11.

[19] Tremmel (2009) A Theory of Intergenerational Justice. Earthscan, London p. 41.