As Raymond Geuss states in the introduction to his 2008 Philosophy and Real Politics (PP), his book “wishes to suggest the possibility that there might be a viable way of thinking about politics that is orthogonal to the mainstream of contemporary analytic political philosophy” (p 18). Politics and the Imagination (PI) is plausibly understood (though does not explicitly introduce itself) as a sequel to PP. PI is a wide-ranging collection of essays with which readers will come to terms more easily if they have some sense of how they fit in with Geuss’ attempt to provide such a non-mainstream approach. Therefore I begin with a few recollections of, and comments on, that earlier discussion.
Geuss rejects a particular way of understanding the idea that “politics is applied ethics,” a view he calls the “ethics-first” reading of that slogan, and that he thinks penetrates contemporary political philosophy in pernicious ways. According to the ethics-first view, there is an independent discipline called “Ethics” that arrives at prescriptions concerning human activities independently of empirical investigations of concrete and historically embedded human endeavors. This discipline tends to formulate relatively few basic and rather abstract principles meant to provide systematic guidance for human behavior and that, in principle, apply to all contexts of human interaction. Often this view also presupposes some kind of individualism and gives considerable weight to basic moral intuitions. Geuss considers Rawls, Nozick, and Habermas defenders of this view, and attacks them for it.
The view Geuss champions also adopts the idea that “politics is applied ethics,” but interprets it rather differently. Far from being a value-free enterprise, politics is populated by actors who pursue their respective conceptions of the good and think what they are doing is permissible, no matter how inconsistent or unreflective they are in their attitudes. Yet there is no independent subject called “Ethics” that can generate insights that then only need to be applied to the study of politics. Instead, value judgments of, or about, political actors always occur in particular contexts that we must understand before their historical background. This background must not merely inform value judgments, but a full understanding of this background renders abstract, non-context-specific ethical inquiries at best superfluous. At worst (and not unrealistically, as Geuss thinks, for instance with regard to Rawls) such inquiry leads to gross misconceptions of reality and thus, as the case may be, also to misguided interventions in it. Presumably as a consequence of this attitude towards what should be considered appropriate academic inquiry into human action, Geuss’ Cambridge website
recommends that prospective post-graduate students in his areas of interest consider applying to the interdisciplinary M. Phil. in Intellectual History and Political Thought, administered by the Faculty of History, rather than to the M. Phil. of the Faculty of Philosophy.1
Geuss advocates what he calls realist political philosophy. The study of politics is a study of action, which is always historically situated action. Beliefs and ideals (according to Geuss a central preoccupation of post-Socratic philosophers) do matter, but only to the extent that they motivate people, not for some independent philosophical value they may have. Geuss obtains a good deal of his own philosophical inspiration from the pre-Habermasian Frankfurt School, especially Adorno, but also from Nietzsche. (Like Nietzsche’s, Geuss’ writings help themselves to frequent references to antiquity.) In the spirit of Critical Theory — which Geuss elucidated very well in his first book, The Idea of a Critical Theory: Habermas and the Frankfurt School — ideals must never be taken at face value: what people think about why they endorse ideals and about what their effects are may be totally wrong. Ideals — like, say, social orders or academic disciplines — have a way of inculcating illusions about their own character. (As far as academic disciplines are concerned, and as readers of Geuss’ 2005 Outside Ethics may recall, he thinks that it is especially those who see themselves in the Rawlsian camp who are so deluded.) The study of politics, as a study of human action, is the study of power relations, and the adoption of belief systems cannot be detached from power relations. Politics itself is understood on the model of an art or a craft that requires particular skills (to make good judgments about what will happen, or to act at the right moment) that cannot be fully codified and thus neither systematically taught nor learned.
One must wonder about the contrast that Geuss draws between the “ethics-first” view (and the correspondingly low esteem in which he holds much philosophical work) and his own realist approach. It is worth recording these doubts because, again, the pieces in PI continue in the spirit of PP. Ethics, I take it, is concerned with offering systematic normative theories, theories about what it means to make judgments in terms of “right,” “wrong,” “good,” “evil,” etc. Thinking about what support systematic accounts of such terms have is independently worthwhile, so that we can come to an informed understanding of our evaluative practices. But such reflection does not immediately bear on what people actually do, and why they do it, and is consistent with lots of views about human motivation. Geuss is right that philosophers, like academics in other disciplines, tend to adopt ways of looking at the world that are highly partial (“To a man with a hammer everything looks like a nail,” Mark Twain is reputed to have said), often overestimate the reach and relative importance of philosophical questions, and therefore inevitably neglect much about human interaction that deserves serious inquiry. So Geuss is right that those of us who work on normative questions are well-advised to adopt, well, a “critical” attitude towards what we are doing, and how it shapes our perception of what matters.
But none of this means — and this manner of continuing is decidedly not meant to set aside the point just made, but merely to put it in perspective — that there is something wrong with what Geuss calls ethics-first view as such, rather than with attitudes towards its reach and importance. The ethics-first view can adopt many of the lessons he teaches, unless Geuss means to deny the sheer validity of any universally applicable normative thought. Perhaps that indeed is what he means to do, but he himself acknowledges the possibility of normative thought per se. Once he does so (for instance, once judgments are classified as right, wrong, appropriate, inappropriate, etc.), we must ask what makes them so, and what makes them so in some situations but not in others, which, I take it, drives us to some version of universally applicable normative thought. In any event, it drives us a good deal beyond analyses of specific historical scenarios although such ethical inquiry is not always (maybe is only rarely) what is of greatest interest in reflection on such scenarios. The challenge becomes to identify the most sensible forms of such thought, which may well not be the Kantian approach that Geuss loathes. These themes are also explored in Thomas Hurka’s review of PP in NDPR (2009.01.19).
Keeping these preliminary comments in mind, let us approach Politics and the Imagination. PI consists of twelve essays “that deal with several issues concerning the nature of the imagination and its role in politics” (p ix). It takes time to get used to this way of thinking, but, indeed, on Geuss’ approach as sketched above, questions about ideals (such as normative theories) arise as questions about the imagination, as questions of how people have found guidance for their actions. Geuss begins by distinguishing two major ways in which exercises of the imagination have provided guidance: the view that justice ultimately will be done because history is bound to work out that way, and the view that fate is unrestrictedly malleable regardless of precedents. One can now ask about these particular (and rather different) forms of the use of imagination: how they relate to each other, or how they provide guidance in politics, or why they were attractive to particular agents and how they mattered to their choices. A natural way of thinking about the tasks of Critical Theory indeed is as a discipline that explores the conditions that make certain exercises of the imagination possible or likely, and assesses what it takes to distance oneself from one’s own current imagination to determine if alternatives are available.
The unity created by this theme (“the nature of the imagination and its role in politics”) is not tight. For some essays it is hard to see how they fit in with it at all. What I said above should explain how this collection continues Geuss’ earlier work (and I think it captures how he himself sees this connection), but these essays have been published independently and reflect Geuss’ amazingly broad range of interests. In addition to several essays that lay out his understanding of political philosophy and his views on geopolitical questions, we find essays on Celan, Heidegger, Rorty, Kant, Don Quixote, Wagner, the future role of museums, and the future possibility of critical inquiry. The rather cryptic introduction is not as helpful as one would have hoped to give guidance to the reader. Some of these essays I am not competent to engage with. Some I find hard to digest since they read like several sub-themes tied together that are interesting to ponder on their own and indeed are also “somehow” connected, but that leave at least this reader puzzled as to their overall purpose, even after repeated reading. But Geuss, in any event, presents a wealth of material and thinks his questions through in intriguing and often unexpected ways that make an engagement with his ideas worth the effort. So in light of these parameters, I will here discuss only a few of his essays.
The first essay, “Political Judgment in Its Historical Context,” takes as its starting point a conversation between a former British ambassador to the US and several neo-conservative members of the administration of George W. Bush, a conversation recorded in the ambassador’s memoirs. Geuss uses this conversation to illustrate the program of a realist political philosophy I sketched above. The kind of political philosophy (“ethics-first”) that Geuss rejects is committed to a particular (post-Socratic) view of political judgment — namely, political judgments are opinions that can be investigated by appeal to rational standards, in isolation from other judgments, and independently of the identity of the speakers; to the extent that these judgments are ethical in nature, they trump all other considerations bearing on what the agent should do. Geuss suggests that, for the purposes of finding “a fundamental concept the analysis of which would allow one to decipher a whole area of human experience” (p 5), one should not, as many philosophers have done, focus on the conception of belief or option, but on action. Politics is interaction among groups with differential power, and verbal interactions should be analyzed in terms of that model. The conversation between the British ambassador and the neo-cons illustrates the point: pronouncements about the political possibilities of the British government (which were the subject of that conversation) are not academic assessments, but convey information about the attitudes of the American government and exert pressure on the British government to act in certain ways.
Politics — and this, I believe, indeed is the main point of this essay — must not be understood as a quasi-academic discussion about a domain that by itself is not influenced by the way the discussion proceeds or ends. Such a view of politics does not do justice to the phenomena. Once that lesson is digested, one also sees politics as a particular context of human interaction in which a distinctively political ability can flourish and must be recognized as such: the ability “of practical imagination, inventiveness, or creativity, of coming up with new possibilities, or seeing new possibilities or constructiveness, which is very important in politics” (p 14). Geuss means to make a statement about the distinctive nature of the political domain. Appropriate moral judgments about particular exercises of this ability are a separate matter. An example he gives of a striking exercise of this ability is the attacks of September 11, a set of political actions that sent a powerful signal (without, as Geuss stresses, “saying a word”) that got the opponents (the American government) to do precisely what quite plausibly had been intended by the attackers all along.
This first essay nicely illustrates the kind of realist political philosophy that Geuss thinks is appropriate and that I sketched above. But for that reason it also returns us to the points of resistance articulated above. It is true that one can watch any political debate, or even any interview with a politician, from various standpoints. One can think about it as verbal exchange and ponder whether the reply really addresses the point made by the opponent earlier, or whether the answer actually responds to the question the interviewer asked. Or one can think about the strategic political behavior displayed in the interaction: What points come across? What aspects of the politician’s personality transpire, and are meant to transpire? The same is true, mutatis mutandis, of interactions that are not immediately watched by a larger audience. Much of this will be lost if one merely thinks about such interaction as an exchange of beliefs, and thus construes them on the model of quasi-academic discussions. About all this, I think one can only agree with Geuss. But none of this undermines the actual validity of academic discussion: none of this implies that one should not also think about the cognitive value of statements made in relevant discussions. So while Geuss’ first essay illustrates what he means by realist political philosophy, it does not give us a reason to abandon the ethics-first view, or even illustrate why we should do so.
Geuss’ third essay, “Moralism and Realpolitik,” starts by insisting that philosophers are on the wrong track understanding politics by assuming that agents seek to obtain self-knowledge and consistency. This way of approaching politics leads to wrong views of how morality can sensibly enter politics. (This essay, I should say, is one of those that I find difficult to comprehend. I am here recording what I have made of it.) One way in which morality enters politics is through “moralism”:
the view that the distinction between good and evil is clear and easy to discern to all men of good will … The genuinely admirable moral agent sees the salient features of a situation quickly and immediately, faces up to the situation resolutely, and acts decisively to implement his intuitions (p 32).
But moralism is problematic, among other things, because it leads agents to construe conflicts of interests as matters of principles, and because its endorsement unduly neglects the role of reflection in politics, minimally considerations of consistency. But once this kind of resistance to moralism is in sight, we must ask precisely why consistency matters to action. Crucially for Geuss, again, the central piece in making sense of politics is actions, not propositions. Actions can conflict, but not contradict each other. As the fit between propositions and actions is inherently loose, actions cannot immediately come up for an evaluation in terms of consistency. The complexity of actions and motivations makes it difficult to think of them in terms of the consistency of propositions. As Geuss says:
The more we move away from the glass realm of explicitly formulated propositions … [and] as we enter the realm of imagination, of human desires, ideals, emotions, hopes, projects, the more clearly we enter the world which most of us inhabit much of the time. Here things are left indeterminate, contradictory beliefs are entertained, trains of thought are left unfinished, conflicting emotions are tolerated (or even enjoyed) (p 38).
So plain moralism is unsatisfactory because it is too simple-minded, and moralism enriched with reflectiveness generates considerable theoretical difficulties. One response is to adopt a crude version of realism, that we should abandon moral considerations altogether and instead merely pursue our respective “material interest.” But here too Geuss finds difficulties, in particular that material interest is an “accordion-like concept” (p 39). Following Max Weber (whom he considers the most important political philosopher of the 20th century), Geuss expresses much esteem for qādi justice, which largely gives up on generic advice and codification and instead expects experienced, wise judges to sort out the difficulties of particular cases. That is how he thinks value judgments should enter into politics. At this stage, this move should be unsurprising, because it captures Geuss’ general outlook: realist political philosophy distinguished both from the ethics-first view and from crude forms of realism that deny the point of normative inquiry beyond advocating to act on one’s material interest. Somewhat abruptly, towards the end of the essay, two additional thoughts enter whose connection with the rest of the train of thought Geuss does not explain well. To begin with, after the discussion of qādi justice Geuss articulates a view on genuinely significant political action. Like qādi justice, such action goes beyond codified rules. But it also goes much beyond qādi justice by creating an entirely new situation not even loosely connected to past conditions. (Geuss’ example here again could be the September 11 attacks, though he does not say so.) He also points out, in an existentialist manner — and I presume that this refers both to qādi justice and to genuinely political action — that political decision making involves deciding not merely what kind of people we want to be ourselves, but what kind of a social world we would like to create and leave for the next generation.
Apologies to Raymond Geuss if I have been unable to put together the train of thought accurately. Geuss’ admiration for qādi justice returns us to a general concern about his approach that I articulated above. Surely one should be able to ask the qādi just what factors about the situation in question prompted him to decide the way he did. Surely one would hope that the judge spent some time thinking about the matter by way of considering the weight these factors respectively should have in his decision, presumably also by thinking about what weight they would have under different circumstances, or in fact did have in the past in other decisions. Surely one would hope that the qādi, when prompted, could articulate his reasoning, and could thereby make clear to those subject to his jurisdiction that like case will indeed be treated alike. Some of the reasoning will be generic and broad-ranging in scope (for instance, pointing out that distinctly cruel treatment of human beings for entertainment purposes is unacceptable); some might draw heavily on details of the case, for instance, by working out precisely what would count as courageous action under the circumstances, what an agent could have been expected to know, what somebody could be blamed for given the conditions, etc. Perhaps these complexities are of a sort that does not allow for rigid codification of norms that in the future other judges merely have to apply. After all, there is a reason why there are judges in the first place.
If what I have said is correct, then Geuss, despite the validity of his concerns about the difficulties in obtaining insights about actions from considerations of consistency of propositions, too readily dismisses the relevance of careful background deliberation for politics. Thus he also too readily dismisses the relevance of philosophy as a discipline that engages in background deliberation about politics in a “cool hour,” to use Bishop Butler’s famous phrase. That such background deliberation needs to be subject to self-critical inquiry and comes with dangers of its own if that is not done I have already conceded. And that point, indeed, is an important insight that Geuss contributes.
Essay 4, “On the Very Idea of a Metaphysics of Right,” contains Geuss’ take on Kantian ethics. Geuss characterizes the view that he rejects as follows: (a) There is such a thing as Reason as an autonomous faculty that operates centrally with rules and principles, such as the principle of non-contradiction, and the results of the operation of which have the epistemic qualities of categoricity, aprioricity, universality, etc. (b) Reason has some powers of determining rules, and some motivational force for all human thought and action. © Because of a metaphysical connection between Reason and freedom, the enforcement of the rules that have their origin in Reason does not have the property of being truly coercive. (d) There is such a thing as (Kantian) Right, which provides for a set of rules that societies should be following even if they are not. Geuss articulates various objections to this view; the one that takes up most room in his discussion draws on the late Wittgenstein’s reflections on rule-following. The point is that we have no way of knowing if we actually are following the rules that such a Kantian view would generate. The Kantian view generates no criterion to verify whether we are indeed following Reason-based rules. By way of contrast, Geuss’ own realist approach can provide such a criterion quite readily, utilizing its emphasis on power: “the Athenians said so” might be such a criterion. Geuss offers additional objections: that Kant makes a mistake assuming that the operations of reason should be seen as a kind of legislation; that reason has the kind of authority over life Kant thought it did; and that a sufficiently broad and hence appropriate understanding of freedom cannot support the link between the conception of right and the conception of freedom that Kant supports because there is no inherent connection between freedom and rule-governing behavior.
Much of what Geuss says about Kant strikes me as plausible. In fact, his essay brings together a range of worries about Kant’s project that many in the profession share. But in conjunction with my reactions to Essays 1 and 2 and the general worries about his project that I articulated earlier, my sense of Essay 4 is that it makes clear that Kant indeed is the most plausible target of Geuss’ objections, in particular the specific conception of Reason and its role in human life that is distinctively Kantian. But one can object to that without throwing out as much philosophy as Geuss is inclined to do.
Let me proceed to Essay 7, “On Museums.” This is the essay that I find is most straightforwardly written. One may wonder at first why this essay is included in a collection entitled Politics and the Imagination. But after all, the past engages our imagination and is a source of ideas for how to go about shaping the future. Museum visits presumably do not take up a considerable share of most people’s time, but nonetheless it would be hard to imagine our lives entirely without museums and the kind of connection they provide to the past (at least for most people likely ever to read this review). Museums also compete for public funds. So the question of just what sort of exposure to the past, and what sort of stimulation for our experience museums create, does matter, and we can see how a discussion of museums fits in here. “Museums” are collections of artifacts intended for public display. Why should there be museums at all? One way of supporting the existence of museums is by appealing to their public usefulness. But how precisely would museums be useful? One way in which they might is by providing “edifying” knowledge, knowledge that could be moral or felicific. The former makes people better in their dealings with others, whereas the latter makes them better at improving their own lives. But is there such a thing as edifying knowledge? Even if there is, could museums (or could art) convey such knowledge? Geuss points out that Hitler was the greatest art collector and museum builder in the 20th century.
Nonetheless, at least the Enlightenment (an age that greatly promoted museums as we know them) did think that there was such knowledge, and that museums could provide it. According to Geuss, the Enlightenment assumed that there was “a single final system of all knowledge and that the knowledge in question would be both factual and edifying” (p 109), and thus could be readily connected to the improvement of both individual lives and social mores. Following Foucault, Geuss distinguishes between the doctrines and the ethos of the Enlightenment. The doctrines Geuss does not find persuasive, but he does endorse the ethos. That ethos requires an ongoing openness to criticism and self-criticism, and to new experiences. He thinks it is hard to envisage a flourishing future for museums unless they are connected to that kind of ethos. Given Geuss’ other views readers should at this stage not be surprised to find him argue in this way. One important implication is that museums should become less explicitly didactic than many of them nowadays are. They should shy away from coherence and order, and instead focus more on giving an account of themselves. That is, they should document how the particular objects on display have ended up in that location, and explain why we find a museum there to begin with, and perhaps also why that particular building has taken on the shape that it has. In this way, visitors can reflect on the power relations that stand behind the possibility of the current exhibitions. Thereby, according to Geuss, the ethos of the Enlightenment would be fostered.
Reading Geuss’ article on museums reminded me of a discussion of the Ashmolean museum in Oxford that I read a while ago, and that is rather contrary in spirit to Geuss’ account. This discussion is from a book about Oxford published before the Ashmolean’s recent renovation, I should add. The author reports on what he makes out to be a rather general feeling of disappointment with the museum, and then goes on:
It is not that wonderful things are lacking in the university collection; there are plenty. But no help is given to the visitor to find them. The Ashmolean is at least thirty years behind the rest of Europe when it comes to interesting and educating museum visitors — and in another century when compared to the United States — it ought to be in a museum itself. Almost everything is wrong; the entrance lobby is just a vast open space without information panels or direction pointers; one is left to just wander and see what one can find. Naturally, ninety percept of visitors march straight ahead and find themselves amid unfamiliar Chinese and Korean ceramics — beautiful certainly, and well-displayed, but not what one expects to be greeted with in an Oxford collection. From there things go downhill; the amount of information given in most rooms is woefully inadequate … Cases are often stuffed with a collection of dozens of similar objects without a sign anywhere saying ‘Hey! Look at this. It’s important, It’s exciting!’ (David Horan, Oxford: A Cultural and Literary Companion, New York: Interlink Publishing, 2000).
One thing that resonates strongly with me is the admiration for American exhibitions that the author articulates. My own first visit to the Smithsonian in DC, about 15 years ago, evoked in me a strong sense that, indeed, that is how museum exhibits should be presented. Coherent stories were told in informative ways, and just enough information was provided for a visitor to read a fair number of panels without being exhausted. European museums always somehow seemed to provide too much or too little. What was wonderful for me precisely was the existence of signposts saying something like “Hey! Look at this. It’s important, It’s exciting!,” and then explaining in some more detail why that was supposed to be so. I agree with Geuss that it is important to learn about the history of particular collections. Some museums (or exhibitions) are more forthcoming about this than others. But this is primarily interesting as a way of putting in perspective a particular story that is told in terms of the artifacts that the viewer sees on display. I presume the author of the excerpt about the Ashmolean would agree that this sort of self-documentation would not have solved the problems he identified about the pre-renovation Ashmolean. What we want, I think, is an interesting story told about, and in terms of, these artifacts, a story that then itself can be interrogated in terms of the story behind the presence of these artifacts in that particular location. Why would anybody want to go to a museum primarily to think about the story of the institution and its acquisition practices if there is no interesting story that can be told in terms of these artifacts? Or to put the point differently, a substantive story needs to be told in the first place that critical inquiry can then put in perspective.
The last essay I would like to discuss is Essay 12 (which is also the last essay in this collection), “On Bourgeois Philosophy and the Concept of Criticism,” one of the five essays Geuss says “deal with some of the various ways in which imaginative distance finds expression internationally in cultural artifacts” (p xii). This is one of those sentences that I think make the introduction rather cryptic and badly in need of expansion. I am not sure how each of these five essays (Essay 12 being the only one among them that I discuss) meets the description Geuss gives. But in any event, the subject matter of Essay 12 is the future of Criticism, presumably with a capital letter because it is “Criticism” as in “Critical Theory.” It is a reflection on the kind of philosophical approach that Geuss favors and its intellectual future. That is, Geuss ends his collection with self-reflection. Geuss begins this essay quoting some comments of Wittgenstein’s about Frank Ramsey, whom Wittgenstein called a “bourgeois thinker.” Geuss takes this to mean that Ramsey is being characterized as a philosopher who is not at all interested in radical criticism, especially in the sense that he does not investigate whether a political order of a fundamentally different sort is possible. Instead, Ramsey sets about to discover the order that existing political structures do exhibit.
But there is more to this notion. Bourgeois philosophy as Geuss understands it is a complex phenomenon that, in one version or another, characterizes many well-known thinkers. Geuss offers the following conditions to characterize bourgeois philosophy: (1) the world as we encounter it really is in order; (2) I can thus “make sense” of what I encounter in the world; (3) I can make sense of the world by using clear forms of surveyable knowledge that will be instrumentally useful and be capable of being justified; (4) I ought to embrace the world warmly. This indeed is a complex set of thoughts, and according to Geuss different thinkers have embraced or emphasized different bits of it, including Leibniz, Descartes, Hegel, the utilitarians, the pragmatists, and contemporary analytical philosophers. By way of illustrating bourgeois optimism, and how it retains its power in the 20th century and beyond, Geuss draws attention to Jonathan Lear and (again) Frank Ramsey. In Love and Its Place in Nature, Lear, according to Geuss, argues that, to the extent that somebody has developed into a mature, thinking person at all, this shows that her environment is good enough to allow for this process to take place. So anybody who succeeded at becoming that kind of person has good reason to be optimistic about her surroundings. In his collection of essays entitled Foundation of Mathematics, Ramsey argues that there is no particular emotional reaction to the world that is per se most appropriate. In light of that, there is nothing irrational about the adoption of an optimistic attitude towards the world because it is better for all my own activities to have a set of feelings towards the world that are positive rather than negative. Geuss rejects both views. We may get to the point of feeling good about the world in the way Lear explains, but may have no reason to think that it will also continue to be good. And Ramsey’s approach holds for the world considered as the object of astronomy. But unlike the world of astronomy, it could be true of the world regarded as a social and political construct that my taking a positive attitude towards it implicates me in grave evil.
In an interesting (Nietzschean!) twist Geuss points out that Critical philosophy owes its existence to bourgeois philosophy. The existence of bourgeois philosophy itself presupposes particular societal arrangements in which philosophical thought is encouraged, and to some extent taken seriously. Bourgeois philosophy starts with the assumption that the world is fundamentally in order, but that does not mean that there cannot be local problems of all sorts, as for instance Hegel thought the Prussian state needed (comparatively) local reforms such as a constitution and universal trial by jury. In fact, this sort of gradual change is necessary for the perseverance of the bourgeois order, and clamoring for it is necessary for the continuation of bourgeois philosophy. Critical philosophy takes bourgeois philosophy as its starting point, and bourgeois philosophy must be able to persist for Critical philosophy to be applicable. But Geuss thinks that the whole bourgeois world is bound to collapse sooner rather than later (see also Essay 2, “The Politics of Managing Decline”), because of environmental and population problems and because of geopolitical shifts with considerable conflict potential. The collapse of the bourgeois world triggers the demise of bourgeois philosophy, which in turn triggers the demise of Critical philosophy. Geuss ends the book on a rather somber note.
And indeed, in the long run, as one might say in the words of yet another Cambridge man, we are all dead, and ditto for our philosophies. Unlike Geuss, Nietzsche, from whom he takes so much inspiration, was an optimist with regard to the questions that preoccupied him. He did think that we could overcome guilt, and he did think that we would eventually come to terms with the consequences of the “death of God.” There is not enough room here to offer much substantive argument on these large issues, but personally I find it hard to share Geuss’ gloomy-all-too-gloomy outlook. Perhaps that means I am firmly in the camp of the bourgeois optimists (given that I am certainly one who enjoys a good story being told about artifacts in a museum), but as far as the future of humanity is concerned, I think much remains open to us as long as sunlight continues to get to the earth to provide energy and as long as human intelligence continues to be connected to its accomplishments to date. Yes, technology has taken us where we are, but technology may also allow us to muddle through, at least to an extent required for the preservation of a bourgeois world with its bourgeois philosophy and its corresponding Critical philosophy. The jury is decidedly still out on this point. If the response to this move indeed is a charge of bourgeois optimism, a reply one might launch with equal plausibility (and this is a reply one might also launch with regard, say, to Geuss’ strong criticism, in Outside Ethics, of Rawls and his assessment of the Rawls reception in the Western world in recent decades) is that the “critical,” self-reflective part of Critical philosophy should also be applied to itself.
But this comment also puts me in a position to finish this review on a positive note. Raymond Geuss is an important contributor to contemporary political philosophy, not merely because of his particular way of continuing the tradition of Critical Theory, and not merely because of the sheer range of topics that he addresses with a mixture of intriguing analysis and unusual erudition, but also because he brings to bear the resources of Critical Theory on more mainstream political philosophy. In all these ways, he provides invaluable services to the profession.
1 http://www.phil.cam.ac.uk/teaching_staff/geuss/geuss_index.html; accessed on April 9, 2010.