Bernhard Weiss

How to Understand Language: A Philosophical Inquiry

Bernhard Weiss, How to Understand Language: A Philosophical Inquiry, Acumen, 2010, 271pp., $27.95(pbk), ISBN 9780773537354.

Reviewed by Jaroslav Peregrin, Academy of Sciences of the Czech Republic and University of Hradec Králové


There are many ways of applying philosophy to language, and there are many ways of writing about this topic. Bernhard Weiss is firmly rooted within the tradition of analytic philosophy, and this predisposes him to approach the topic along the lines of the analytic pioneers; however, he is far from ensnared by tradition. He wants to report on current trends and he wants to enter into conversation with their exponents. Another crucial feature of his book is that Weiss does not want to concentrate on a partial problem; his aim is to address language in its complexity as a challenge for philosophy. The result of blending these two ambitions is a compromise between an advanced introduction to the philosophy of language and a discussion of those topics in analytic philosophy that he takes to be the deepest -- mainly discussions within the intellectual space opened up by the writings of Donald Davidson.

The trouble with analytic philosophy of language is that it has amassed a huge heap of technical and semi-technical results that are deep in their own way, but their direct significance is often far removed from the questions raised by a layman contemplating language. When I teach my introductory course on analytical philosophy for philosophical fresh(wo)men, I find it not so difficult to present the technical side of, say, Russell's theory of definite descriptions or Tarski's theory of truth. To be sure, it requires some pedagogical experience to make these technicalities intelligible to beginners in philosophy; nevertheless, the real trouble is to explain to them why they should see these things are interesting and relevant for understanding language.

In this respect, Weiss's book cuts deeper than many other books on the general philosophy of language written in the analytic tradition: his point of departure is devoted to considering language as a puzzle. How does language relate to the world and how is it related to the mind? How does language work and how do words possess their meanings? Such questions are posed from the position of an outsider, who is only subsequently initiated into the labyrinth of methods and results of analytic philosophy and shown that this approach may help us alleviate the original puzzlement.

In the first part of the book, Weiss offers a quick look at the traditional considerations that have forged the framework for analytic philosophy of language: the basic Fregean distinctions, the Russellian analysis of definite descriptions, the Kripkean scruples about Russellian descriptivism, and also the Austinian and Gricean speech acts theory and the Quinean rejection of the analytic/synthetic distinction. Weiss then moves to his main problem, around which he circles throughout the rest of the book: the (Quino-)Davidsonian approach to language from the perspective of the radical translator/interpreter. (It is a little bit strange, given that radical interpretation is such a central topic for the book, and given that this project is largely continuous with the Quinean project of radical translation, that Quine is only an episodic figure in the plot of the book.)

The review of the Quinean thought experiment with radical translation and the following discussion of use-conditional vs. truth-conditional foundations of a theory of meaning is still presented in a rather disengaged textbook style. (This is not a criticism, for I think that the pedagogical qualities that Weiss displays in these non-controversial parts of the books are admirable.) But then it is time for Davidson to appear on the scene and here Weiss's disengagement slowly gives way to an engaged -- and no longer uncontroversial -- rethinking of the foundations of the Davidsonian program.

Weiss starts with a reconstruction of Davidson's method of radical interpretation, from which he moves to a review of Davidson's more enigmatic theory of interpretation, couched in terms of "prior" and "passing" theories, as presented especially in Davidson's "Nice Derrangement of Epithaphs". At this point Weiss starts to present some interesting and bold theses. The first of them is that Davidson's account of language and meaning is essentially normative, which appears to go against the grain of Davidson's own general aversion to taking normativity as something essential for language. At least at first sight.

Weiss tries to show that despite Davidson's own pronouncements, his approach could not work if there were no rules underlying language. I concur. I think that Davidson's occasional hostility towards linguistic rules derives from the fact that what he understands when he hears "rules" and "normativity" is an idea Davidson (correctly or not) ascribes to Dummett, namely that language forces us to speak as others do. I agree that one can read Davidson normatively, and Weiss does a wonderful job of working out the details of this reading.

The rest of the book is devoted to what seem to me to be the most interesting contemporary discussions within philosophy of language: the role of normativity within the foundations of language, the nature of the publicity of language, the relation of language to social practices and the nature of the theory of meaning. Weiss tries to show that Davidson's theory of meaning and interpretations as articulated in terms of the prior and passing theories is not fully compatible with his earlier notion of radical interpretation and writes:

interpretations are not just the constructs of radical interpreters and hearers; speakers are guided in their use by interpretations. In being guided by a scheme of interpretation a speaker intends to uphold patterns of use: those patterns that would ground the interpretative scheme. Because these patterns of use are objects of the speaker's intentions they are not mere regularities, but regularities to which she intends to accord, regularities to which she is bound by her linguistic intentions. Her use is thus subject to standards, in the absence of which it is mere babbling. So the argument is very simple. It depends on the radical interpreter to make plain the primacy of regularities of use and then uses the fact that interpreters (or hearers) are speakers too in order to show that these patterns of use acquire normative significance. (p. 132)

Weiss takes issue with those who have recently argued vigorously that meaning is not normative in any nontrivial sense of the word (Boghossian, Hattiangadi), that any "ought" contained in our semantic talk is at most instrumental and hence dispensable. I am happy to join him in his campaign against the anti-normativists, but I would prefer to use different weapons. Weiss grants the anti-normativists that it is unwarranted to assume that if a speaker S means that F by the sentence s, then she ought to assert s only if F; his proposal is that while this assumption is unwarranted, we may safely assume that if S means that F by s, then she ought to assert S only if s intends to assert that F. I would not grant this. It seems to me that the rules of language do make us assert what is true, not because of any norm over and above the rules of language, but because truth is nothing else than correct assertability (where this is, to be sure, one kind of correctness among others that we can think of in relation to language). Hence it seems to me that just as a chess player who takes a piece to be a bishop ought to move it only diagonally (otherwise it would be an error -- independently of any intention the player may or may not have), a language speaker ought to use sentences according to the rules of language. I think that to assert "It is raining" on a cloudless day is simply incorrect (incorrect, that is, in the sense of correctness that amounts to truth; it might be simultaneously correct in some other sense). This does not in any way contradict the fact that we may intend to assert it despite this incorrectness, perhaps by way of irony.

Weiss considers Dummett's criticism of the Davidsonian project of radical interpretation, and portrays the difference between the two philosophers as the difference between aiming at a "radical" versus a "robust" theory of meaning. It is only later that it becomes clear how deep Weiss's doubts about the entire Davidsonian project of radical interpretation are, but already here he presents some arguments pro Dummett and contra Davidson. Perhaps the most telling point is the one related to the joke where a person is asked whether she can speak Spanish and answers "I do not know, I haven't tried". Weiss then claims:

Dummett diagnoses the humor as stemming from an absurdity. In some cases there is obviously no absurdity in a similar remark: just imagine that the character had been asked whether or not she can swim or ride a bicycle. In cases such as these one can have a clear conception of the capacity in question in advance of possessing it but in the linguistic case it makes no sense to suppose that the character can conceive of what it is to speak Spanish in advance of speaking it. (p. 169)

This is surely a deep observation: Weiss interprets it as showing that knowledge of a language, though it may be thought of as a kind of know how, differs importantly from such skills as knowing how to swim. I would add that it is precisely this overhasty assimilation of language to the more practical skills that feeds the theory Davidson develops in his "Nice Derrangement of Epithaphs".

Now it becomes explicit that Weiss has serious doubts about the very concept of radical interpretation: he sees the project as based on the idea that whereas it is true that we must have learned language from scratch, it does not follow that there must be a way of describing its usage in some 'neutral' terms, uncontaminated by the concepts we possess thanks to our mastering language -- i.e., in terms that would be, as it were, 'the world's own', not ours. But this, Weiss urges, is a hopeless project. Thus, instead of a radical interpretation, Weiss argues for a similar, but different project that he calls robust interpretation and that takes seriously Dummett's criticism of Davidson.

When Weiss puts all his cards on the table, his account of the relationship between language and the world, underlying the understanding of language to which he converges throughout the book, is a view he calls "modest realism" that is condensed into the following four points (p. 217):

(i) realism is constituted not by a relation of the practice to something external to it but by its own internal richness, for instance, the necessity of an appropriate policing practice for any apparently rule-governed practice;

(ii) the world we describe is conditioned by our means of describing it;

(iii) the position is established by showing that it is the only position that coheres with our self-conception -- here as beings capable of binding their use to a norm;

(iv) although we cannot make sense of the idea in full detail given the contingency we discover at the base of our practice, we must admit the possibility of alternative practices, alternatives based in different forms of life.

This clarifies Weiss own position vis-à-vis not only those of Davidson and Dummett, but also other contemporary thinkers of a similar provenance, e.g., McDowell or Brandom. It seems to me that out of them, Brandom is Weiss's most natural ally, although he obviously does not want to be anybody's blind follower, thinking things through in his own way without paying excessive attention to the authorities. To follow him on his path through the labyrinth of language is not only very enlightening; it is also a great enjoyment.