2005.03.05

Bede Rundle

Why there is Something rather than Nothing

Bede Rundle, Why there is Something rather than Nothing, Oxford University Press, 2004, 204 pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199270503.

Reviewed by Erik J. Olsson, Lund University


The question, "Why is there something rather than nothing?", is a good candidate for being philosophy's most profound and disturbing question. Is it not a complete and utter mystery that there should be anything at all? That there should be nothing seems prima facie more plausible than that there should be something in view of the greater simplicity and naturalness of nothingness as compared to somethingness. And yet there is something. In this stimulating and well-written book, Oxford philosopher Bede Rundle tries to make likely that the problem of existence does have a reasonably clear solution and, moreover, that this solution is of a distinctively philosophical, as opposed to a physical or theological, kind.

The first half of the book (chapters 1-4) is an in-depth examination of the theistic belief that the world is because God created it to be. Rundle raises a number of objections to this traditional view, the main point being that it is difficult, if not impossible, to make sense of the notion that God, an immaterial spirit, could cause the world, something material, to exist. Non-theistic views are not seriously considered until section 5.2. There Rundle presents his own positive proposal according to which, although there is no particular being whose existence is necessary, there nonetheless has to be something or other. The suggestion is that it is inconceivable that there should have been literally nothing, a central contention to which I will return in a moment. Once it is conceded that nothingness fails to be a real possibility, the question, "Why is there something rather than nothing?", obviously ceases to be a living one. In identifying what he takes to be a false presupposition, Rundle claims to have provided a genuinely philosophical answer to the central question of existence.

Rundle proceeds to address the further issue why, given that there must be something, there is what there is. His response is that, if there is anything at all, there must be matter. The alternatives to a material world would be a world of only abstract or only mental entities. Rundle excludes these possibilities for the reason that, in his view, these other entities fail to enjoy sufficient independence of the material world. Hence, not only can we know that there must be something, we can also know that there must be matter. But this is at the same time the place where Rundle sees philosophical speculation coming to an end. The question as to why the material universe is as it is, more specifically, is one which he leaves for physics to answer.

Rundle, to be sure, is not the first philosopher to argue that the question, "Why is there something rather than nothing?", rests on a false presupposition. Peter Van Inwagen (1996) and Derek Parfit (1998a, 1998b, 1998c) have both found reasons to reject the implicit assumption that nothingness, in virtue of its supposed greater simplicity and naturalness, should be considered prima facie more plausible than somethingness. Rather, the novel feature of Rundle's position is that he, more radically, dismisses the notion of nothingness altogether. There is no mention of either Van Inwagen or Parfit in Rundle's book. Other authors who, although they have contributed substantially to the topic, are not addressed include Robert Nozick and Adolf GrĊ¸nbaum.

In his introduction, Rundle writes: "I cannot claim the arguments on key points -- as with the central thesis that there has to be something -- are compelling". He continues: "It is, rather, that good reasons can be given in support of the position advocated, and that the case for that position gains further in credibility from the apparent lack of any remotely plausible alternative". Since Rundle fails to address a considerable portion of the recent literature on the subject, I do not think that he has substantiated the last part about the presumed lack of alternatives. Indeed, I do not think there is any such lack. For yet another alternative, see Carlson and Olsson (2001).

How does Rundle defend his central claim that nothingness is not a genuine possibility? The general idea is that the expression "There is nothing" fails to express a genuine claim unless something more is added that completes it but that any such completion leaves us with something. One way of completing the expression is by specifying where there is nothing, as in "There is nothing in the cupboard". But as soon as we say where there is nothing, we thereby also grant that there is something, namely, the place in physical space which is claimed to be unoccupied. One might think that "There is nothing at all" would do the job, but this statement, too, raises the question of where the state-of-affairs that is described obtains (where there is nothing at all), at least this is what I think Rundle would say in response. Still, I suspect that most readers will find Rundle's position puzzling and paradoxical. Perhaps it is true that the logical grammar of ordinary language does not allow us to express complete nothingness and that everything we can say is relative to a presupposed non-empty domain, but it is not clear to me why this linguistic fact must be taken as an indication of a fundamental conceptual barrier or, indeed, as a constraint on reality itself. To some extent at least Rundle solves one mystery by introducing another.

Granted that nothingness falls short of being a genuine possibility, how can we explain why people, and philosophers in particular, have thought otherwise? Rundle, if I understand him correctly, proposes to explain this in terms of an imagined process of repeated subtraction. Given the present state-of-affairs, one can construct alternatives by subtracting one or more things. Thus, I can construct an alternative by subtracting this table now before me, this computer, this chair, and so on. If the subtraction process is carried out far enough, the state resulting is supposedly one where there is literally nothing. Not so, thinks Rundle. What remains is actually something, namely, some sort of space in a quiescent state (118).

In raising the question concerning the intelligibility of complete nothingness, Rundle puts his finger on an important problem which other authors have taken to lightly. Yet, as I have already hinted, his relatively brief discussion, as it stands, leaves a number of interesting questions unanswered. Here is another example: In support of his claim that ordinary language is impregnated with existence presumptions, Rundle draws a parallel to first-order logic with its supposition of a non-empty domain of individuals (115). But, as he also notes, though without commenting further on the matter, so-called "free logics" have been devised where this existence assumption is relaxed. This suggests, again, that the supposition of a non-empty domain of discourse might not be as indispensable in our thinking as Rundle claims it to be.

The title of the book is partly misleading, suggesting as it does a sustained discussion of one single subject matter, whereas in fact Rundle's essay contains a lot of material, including the lengthy discussion of causality in chapter 3, that does not have direct bearing on the question "Why there is something rather than nothing?". Rather, the book is best read as a consistent Wittgensteinian treatment of a number of interrelated problems involving, in Rundle's own words, "practically all concepts of interest to metaphysics" (ix): God, causality, space, time, essence, existence, necessity, infinity, explanation, and mind. Seen from that perspective, it is a valuable and, as far as I can judge, original contribution to metaphysics as a whole and, above all, a welcome contrast to much recent work of a more speculative nature. The book amply attains its author's modest goal of indicating "what might be possible in areas where it is so easy to think that we have come to a dead end" (ix).

References

Carlson, E. and Olsson, E. (1998), "The Presumption of Nothingness", Ratio, XIV, 2001: 203-221.

Parfit, D. (1998a), "Why Anything? Why This?" Part 1, London Review of Books, 22 January: 24-27.

Parfit, D. (1998b), "Why Anything? Why This?" Part 2, London Review of Books, 5 February: 22-25.

Parfit, D. (1998c), "The Puzzle of Reality: Why does the Universe Exist?", in Metaphysics: the Big Questions, P. Van Inwagen and D. W. Zimmerman (eds.), Malden, Mass: Blackwell.

Van Inwagen, P. (1996), "Why Is There Anything at All?", Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, 70 (suppl. Vol.): 95-110.