2010.08.19

Alix Cohen

Kant and the Human Sciences: Biology, Anthropology, and History

Alix Cohen, Kant and the Human Sciences: Biology, Anthropology, and History, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 200pp., $84.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780230224322.

Reviewed by Colin McQuillan, Oglethorpe University


Alix Cohen has taken on the daunting task of developing a Kantian account of the human sciences. This task is all the more difficult because the place sciences like biology, anthropology and history are to occupy within the framework of Kant's critical philosophy remains unclear. According to Cohen, these sciences constitute "the necessary pragmatic counterpart to the transcendental project" (143). And while Cohen covers a broad range of texts and comments on many different parts of Kant's philosophy in order to demonstrate this thesis, Kant and the Human Sciences is less a work of analysis and commentary than an attempt to extract a conception of the human sciences from Kant (xiii). There is nothing wrong with appropriating the thought of one philosopher for another philosophical project, to be sure, but the way in which Cohen proceeds raises several questions about the Kantianism of her conception of the human sciences and its significance for contemporary philosophy.

In Chapter 1, Cohen situates her conception of the human sciences within the framework of Kant's critical philosophy. Cohen argues, first, that the purity of Kant's conception of freedom does not preclude further analysis of the human condition, which might begin from an empirical perspective (4). Because Kant's conception of freedom does not exclude the possibility of more worldly accounts of deliberation, decision, and action, which would address the difficulties moral agents face in real world situations, Cohen concludes that there is no contradiction between Kant's conception of freedom and a moral anthropology concerned with the cultivation of character and virtue. She takes this argument a step further, however, in order to show that moral anthropology is relevant to the constitution of a moral agency. "From the standpoint of the human deliberating agent," Cohen suggests, "anthropology is morally relevant because it identifies the form his exercise of autonomy should take at the empirical level" (11). Contemporary philosophers might not take issue with this claim, but it is not clear that Kant would see "the form the exercise of autonomy should take at the empirical level" as a moral problem. My suspicion is that Kant would see this as a technical or pragmatic concern, rather than a specifically moral problem. Robert Louden has noted the ambiguity of the relationship between the moral and the pragmatic in Kant, which might suggest a more modest appraisal of the moral significance of anthropology than the one proposed by Cohen.[1]

Having established the possibility of an empirical and pragmatic conception of the human sciences in Chapter 1, Cohen considers their methodology in Chapter 2. While she claims that the model she presents is derived from Kant's writings on biology, Cohen relies mainly on Kant's essays Of the Different Races of Human Beings (1775) and Determination of the Concept of a Human Race (1785) to illustrate the role teleology plays in the human sciences (21-29). These works could be said to belong to anthropology rather than biology, but Cohen draws from them a functionalist-intentionalist account of human nature, emphasizing the importance of an original form that provides a basic ordering principle as well as an end that is meant to be achieved through variation and differentiation. Because Kant thinks human beings must be understood from both of these perspectives -- from the standpoint of the original form of humanity as well as the ends the differences between human beings are meant to achieve -- Cohen argues that he presents a teleological conception of humanity, in which individual human actions "exhibit certain purposive characteristics that cannot be understood without resorting to the level of the species" (31). The species, however, cannot be understood without a clear conception of the intentionality of individual human actions and their relation to the "goal-directed natural predispositions" that are actualized in different ways by different individuals (31). By integrating these two perspectives, Cohen maintains, the human sciences represent a viable, teleological alternative to the mathematical methods employed by the natural sciences.[2]

Applying this method in Chapter 3, Cohen distinguishes the conception of human nature which is to be found in the human sciences from various species of aliens. By comparing human beings to different kinds of beings with different constitutions, she hopes to clarify both the original form and the natural ends of humanity. Cohen's discussions of aristocrats ("the sterile aliens"), extra-terrestrials ("the sincere aliens"), women ("the loquacious and yet secretive aliens"), and the non-white races ("the amoral aliens") is certainly a curious set of coordinates with which to locate human nature (35-40). Yet Cohen purports to show how Kant distinguishes human beings from all of these "aliens" in his writings on anthropology and moral philosophy.[3] She concludes that human beings are distinguished from non-human beings by their productive activity, their opacity, their capacity for deception, and their ability to make moral progress.[4] Cohen also considers the methodological, experimental, and metaphysical implications of these claims for the human sciences, arguing that introspection, empirical generalization and comparison, technical and pragmatic considerations, as well as ethical constraint all play an important role in the investigations undertaken by the human sciences (52-60).

Cohen focuses on the pragmatic and ethical effects of Kant's anthropology in Chapter 4. She begins by distinguishing Kant's pragmatic anthropology from the naturalistic accounts of human beings that are to be found in Kant's lectures on physical geography and Platner's physiological anthropology. Unlike pragmatic anthropology, Cohen contends, physical geography studies the human being "as an inhabitant of the earth like plants, animals and minerals" (63). Pragmatic anthropology shares physical geography's emphasis on the worldly dimension of human existence, but it explains human action in terms of intentions and purposes rather than natural causes. This also distinguishes Kant's pragmatic anthropology from Platner's physiological anthropology, which was only concerned to describe "the mutual relations, limitations, and interactions" of body and soul (64). Consequently, physical geography and physiological anthropology fail to account for the pragmatic and moral purposes that animate the peculiar way in which human beings are in the world.

Because it addresses "the development of skills, the means of achieving happiness, and the helps and hindrances to morality," however, Cohen argues that Kant's pragmatic anthropology "is based on the knowledge of what is necessary to achieve one's purposes, whether they are technical, prudential, or moral" (69). She considers the contributions that temperament, gender, race, and nation make to the achievement of the natural purposes of humanity (76-84), as well as the specifically moral purposes that are realized through the free actions of human beings (84-105). While Kant insists that these moral purposes are pure and not empirical, Cohen effectively shows the role that examples drawn from experience may play in orienting moral action in the world and improving its efficacy (87-89). Finally, because human beings "need more than mere moral command" to realize their purposes, Cohen argues that pragmatic anthropology is a map-making venture, which guides human beings through the obstacles they will face, as they constitute themselves as human beings, through their actions in the world (105-108).

If pragmatic anthropology provides a topographic guide to the difficulties human beings will face as they strive to realize their purposes in the world, then history serves as a diachronic register, orienting human action toward the ends of the natural, social, and moral worlds. Cohen addresses the distinction between empirical history and philosophical history in Chapter 5, in order to show how Kant's conception of philosophical history defines those ends. While empirical history provides an account of intentions of individuals, who "make sense of their actions in light of their own purposes and the context surrounding their purposes" (115), philosophical history provides a teleological account of the same intentions and explains their function in relation to the whole (117).[5] The latter, Cohen argues, is an important heuristic device, which historians may use to formulate new interpretations of historical events and establish connections between events, in cases where empirical evidence is lacking (119). Teleology thus

provides a guiding thread that allows the historian to put some order in the apparently disordered and meaningless succession of human behavior by distinguishing between the conscious motivations of human behavior and their objective consequences for the society or the species (119).[6]

By following this thread, Cohen reconstructs Kant's account of the beginnings of human civilization and the path to moral maturity. She argues that while Kant's account of human civilization and moralization is oriented toward the ultimate purpose of human nature, it is also pragmatic (123). Kant uses the idea of social and moral progress as a source of "rational hope" in the human capacity to make social and moral progress, which is neither impossible nor contradictory, even if it cannot be confirmed by empirical evidence (132).

Kant and the Human Sciences contains an intriguing and dynamic set of claims about Kant, his views on humanity, and the sciences which concern themselves with human beings. Yet charges of anachronism could be leveled against many of its conclusions. It is not clear that Kant understood the relation between biology, anthropology, and history in the manner Cohen describes, so the claim that they constitute a "pragmatic counterpart" to his critical transcendental philosophy remains questionable. Nor is it clear that the model Cohen provides played any role in the historical development of the human sciences in the nineteenth and twentieth centuries. Even when they claimed a specifically Kantian foundation for the Geisteswissenschaften and Kulturwissenschaften, the Neo-Kantians did not generally appeal to Kant's writings on biology and race.[7] And while an alternative foundation for the human sciences may certainly be found in Kant's writings on these subjects, it is unclear how relevant Cohen's account of the human sciences is for contemporary philosophical discussions. The teleological approach to history that Cohen recommends is particularly problematic, because it does not seem to provide any standard for historical judgment, apart from "what seems to make sense" to the historian narrating a sequence of events. Cohen does not sufficiently address these kinds of problems, which are crucial to the success of the method and model she proposes in Kant and the Human Sciences.


[1] See Louden, Robert B. Kant's Impure Ethics: From Rational Beings to Human Beings. New York: Oxford University Press, 2000. pp. 71-74. Cohen also addresses these concerns in Kant and the Human Sciences, pp. 70-71.

[2] Cohen also deals with the relationship between intentionalist and functionalist accounts of human action in terms of manifest and latent functions in Kant and the Human Sciences, pp. 71-76.

[3] It should be noted that Kant does not refer to aristocrats, women, or people of non-white races as "aliens" anywhere in his anthropology. While his views concerning women and people of non-white races are patronizing, prejudiced, and provincial, Kant did not consider them to be inhuman. Cohen has followed David L. Clark in emphasizing the "otherness" of aristocrats, women, and people of non-white races, but it remains unclear to me why Cohen and Clark would take them to be anything other than "different" human beings for Kant. See Kant and the Human Sciences, pp. 35-40. See also Clark, David L. "Kant's Aliens: The Anthropology and its Others." Included in CR: The New Centennial Review Vol. 1(2), 2001. pp. 201-289.

[4] It might be suspected that Cohen has chosen her "aliens" in order to emphasize these qualities. The fact that she does not discuss animals and angels, who are actually inhuman for Kant, and chooses instead to focus on human "aliens" like aristocrats, women, and people of non-white races suggests that Cohen's alienology is in fact derived from a presupposed anthropology.

[5] Cohen's account of the distinction between empirical and philosophical history does not correspond very precisely to the way Kant uses this distinction in his lectures on metaphysics. In Metaphysik L, for example, we see that the distinction between empirical and philosophical history derives from the sources of the cognition involved, rather than their ends. Empirical history is derived a posteriori from what is given in experience, while the rational cognition involved in philosophy is derived from a priori principles. See Immanuel Kant: Lectures on Metaphysics. Edited and Translated by Karl Ameriks and Steve Naragon. New York: Cambridge University Press, 1997. pp. 299-300 (AA XXVIII: 531-532). When Kant explores the possibility of a philosophical history in the "jottings" for his essay on the progress of metaphysics, he likewise argues that a "philosophizing" history is possible, but only to the extent that it is a priori and establishes "facts of reason" by drawing them "from the nature of human reason." See Kant, Immanuel. What real progress has metaphysics made in Germany since the time of Leibniz and Wolff? Translated by Henry Allison. Included in Immanuel Kant: Theoretical Philosophy after 1781. Edited by Henry Allison and Peter Heath. New York: Cambridge University Press, 2002. pg. 417 (AA XX: 341). This stands in sharp contrast to the account of philosophical history Cohen provides, in which philosophical history is a teleological narrative, which is meant to "fill in the gaps" of empirical history. See Kant and the Human Sciences, pp. 117-122.

[6] Teleological explanations are certainly one way of finding meaning and establishing connections between events in history. They may even be useful in some contexts. But there are more conditions determining the appropriateness and accuracy of teleological explanations than Cohen acknowledges. The extremely problematic example of the Napoleonic wars that Cohen adopts from B. T. Wilkins, for example, raises serious questions about the wisdom and probity of the approach to historical explanation that she recommends. One might ask whether it is really appropriate to claim that it was Napoleon's intention to "impose a just, stable, and uniform civil authority all over Europe," even if that were the effect of the Napoleonic wars. Because the way in which Cohen has characterized the ends of the Napoleonic wars is no less problematic than her account of Napoleon's intentions, her account of the means and ends of teleological historical explanation remains extremely questionable. See Kant and the Human Sciences, pp. 120-121.

[7] Rudolf Makkreel has provided a more historical account of the Kantian sources of the human sciences in Makkreel, Rudolf A. "Kant and the Development of the Human and Cultural Sciences." Studies in History and Philosophy of Science, 39 (2008). pp. 546-553.