2010.09.04

James Warren (ed.)

The Cambridge Companion to Epicureanism

James Warren (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Epicureanism, Cambridge UP, 2009, 342pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521695305.

Reviewed by Jeffrey S. Purinton, University of Oklahoma


Like earlier books in the series, The Cambridge Companion to Epicurus begins with an introduction by the editor followed by a number of chapters — fifteen in the present case — each by a different expert scholar. I shall discuss them in order.

(1) Diskin Clay’s “The Athenian Garden” is a fine summary of what we know about Epicurus and the Epicurean communities in Athens and elsewhere during Epicurus’ lifetime. Clay explains Epicurus’ approach to writing, defending Epicurus against the charge that his polemical derision of other philosophers represents “a nadir of philosophical discourse” and comparing Epicurus’ letters to the epistles of St. Paul. Clay speculates that Epicurus wrote “late in his career” his three surviving letters and the collection of forty doctrinal pronouncements known as the Kyriai Doxai when he “realized that for his thought to survive him he would have to reduce it to a comprehensible and memorable form.” The other “means Epicurus devised for perpetuating the community” was the perpetuation of “the five cults he had founded in the Garden.” Clay defends Epicurus against the charge that these hero cults “seem to contradict two fundamental doctrines of Epicurean philosophy” (no afterlife and no pleasure in death) by noting that the cults were for the benefit, not of the heroic dead, but of the living worshippers.

(2) David Sedley’s, “Epicureanism in the Roman Republic,” is also good. As a result of the “shift of the centre of gravity away from Athens,” writes Sedley, Epicureanism, like the other schools, underwent “decentralization,” with Epicurean centers springing up in Syria and Rhodes and conducting debates without paying close attention to the current Epicurean scholarch in Athens. Sedley then turns to Philodemus, explaining the neglect of Epicurean views on physics and mathematics in Philodemus’ writings in terms of the interests of Philodemus’ Roman audience. Some of Philodemus’ writings, observes Sedley, were meant for general circulation, e.g., his non-partisan histories of the Academy and the Stoa, while others, based on notes taken from the lectures of his teacher Zeno of Sidon, were not. Most interesting is Sedley’s discussion of the focus in Philodemus’ day on “the study of foundational texts,” i.e., the writings of Epicurus and his three leading pupils. Philodemus’ teacher Zeno practised “athetization of allegedly inauthentic works” attributed to these four “great men,” while Demetrius of Laconia practised “emendation of the canonical texts, sometimes based on the collation of manuscripts and choice between competing readings.” Next Sedley discusses the “native Italian Epicurean movement … conducted in Latin.” Then he turns to Lucretius, arguing that, “although Lucretius’ profile resembles” that of the native Italian movement, “his emphasis on the novelty of his task in Latinizing Epicureanism … is an obstacle to seeing him as part of” that tradition. It is “safer,” says Sedley, “to view him as operating outside established philosophical circles” and "working directly from Epicurus’ On Nature," except in his proems and ethical diatribes. Lucretius’ poem gives no indication of any political allegiance, but other Epicureans did get politically involved: Torquatus, Caesar’s assassin Cassius, and some who sided with Caesar. This political involvement was justified, in spite of Epicurus’ injunction to stay out of politics, by “invoking a clause reported to have allowed the prohibition to be set aside in a time of emergency.” “The chief significance of Epicurean political engagement during the late Republic,” Sedley adds, lies “in the degree of sheer civic respectability that Epicureanism had acquired” among the Roman elite.

(3) Michael Erler’s “Epicureanism in the Roman Empire” completes the solid historical survey provided by the first three chapters. Erler covers a great many authors: the Stoic Seneca, who “appropriates Epicurean ideas” and shares the Epicurean “therapeutic model for dealing with life”; Plutarch, who is “much less open-minded and positive about Epicurus’ teachings” and employs “the arsenal of traditional polemics” against them, but who nonetheless sometimes borrows from Epicureanism; Diogenianus, who “argues from an Epicurean position” against fate and prophecy; Lucian, whose treatise Alexander or the false prophet “seeks to put up a monument to Epicurus the ‘saviour’”; Diogenes of Oenoanda, whose inscribed stoa was literally such a monument; Plotinus, who sees Epicureans as “heavy birds … incapable of flying high,” but who nonetheless makes use of some Epicurean ideas; and other Neo-Platonists. Erler concludes with the Christians, who, in spite of their obvious disagreements with Epicureans, shared their aversion to pagan superstitition and their offer of an alternative lifestyle and promise of salvation. Erler notes that Clement of Alexandria and Tertullian sometimes borrow Epicurean ideas, and that Augustine conceded, “I would have had to hand the palm to Epicurus … but for my own belief in … eternal life.”

(4) Pierre-Marie Morel’s “Epicurean atomism,” translated from the French by James Warren, is the weakest chapter of the book. It says precious little, and says it confusingly. It begins by identifying the “Atomist thesis,” that all bodies are either composites or the atoms from which composites are made, then speaks of this thesis as an “argument.” A thesis is an argument? “The second thesis,” says Morel, “is that the first thesis concerns not only a single aspect … of physics, but its essential core on which all others depend”. The second thesis is that the first thesis applies generally?

The first formulation of the Atomist Thesis might wrongly suggest that Epicurean physics is purely atomist in the sense that the Atomist Thesis and its corollaries would suffice to construct the entirety of natural philosophy. On the contrary, it appears that according to Epicurean epistemology the observation of the world, empirical acquaintance, is not merely legitimate but, rather, necessary.

To whom would Epicurus’ being an atomist suggest that he was not an empiricist? Further examples of such confusing pronouncements could be given.

Morel maintains that Epicurus attributed minimal parts to atoms to answer Aristotle’s criticism that Democritus’ partless atoms could not move, since no body can pass as a whole a spatial limit. I argued against this in “Magnifying Epicurean Minima,” Ancient Philosophy 14 (1994). Nor do I accept a second motivation for positing minima attributed by Morel to Epicurus: “the concern to think of the variations of atomic sizes as simple multiples of the smallest atomic size.” Morel closes his section on minima with various difficulties that remain with Epicurus’ theory of minima as he understands it: are they in contact? Are they three-dimensional? If so, how are they not divisible in thought? I answer these questions in the aforementioned article.

Morel makes a big deal of Lucretius’ descriptions of atoms as “the seeds of things,” “the generators of things,” and “generative matter.” “By nature,” Morel writes, “the atoms are both physically independent and also apt to form bodies. Hence the properties of atoms presuppose the existence of composites.” I am not sure what that last sentence means. Morel is concerned to show “that atoms are not only the constituents but also the generative principles of composites,” which is true enough. But he does not offer much of an explanation of how they can be. He simply cites Epicurus’ mention of "the atoms … out of which (ex hōn) a world might arise, or by which (huph’ hōn) a world might be formed," then insists that “the atoms … are not only the constituents (‘those out of which’) but also genuine spontaneous agents or immediate motor principles (‘by which’) of the formation of a world,” then adds that the atoms have to be “appropriate seeds.” Would it not have been more informative to note that some atoms have hooks?

(5) Elizabeth Asmis’ “Epicurean empiricism” discusses Epicurus’ “two basic rules of investigation: a demand for initial concepts as a means of formulating problems; and a demand for perceptions and feelings as a means of inferring what is not observed.” An “initial concept” is called a “preconception” (prolēpsis) by Epicurus. Asmis argues that “all preconceptions, even the most complex (e.g., the concept ‘god’), are a record of appearances from outside, free of any added element of interpretation.” “There is an act of inference,” she grants, in the formation of such concepts, “but it consists of simply recognizing connections that are given in experience,” i.e., of “attending to the differences and similarities among the appearances.” This is a clever attempt to reconcile the evidence that preconceptions are mere “memories” with the evidence “that some preconceptions at least involve some rational analysis of the appearances,” e.g., the preconception ‘god.’ My only objection is that she does not accept my reading of the phrase “similarity and transition” (similitudine et transitione) in Cicero, ND 1.49, reading it instead in terms of what Philodemus calls “transition by similarity” (kath’ homoiotēta metabasis). For my refutation, see pp. 206-9 of my “Epicurus on the Nature of the Gods,” Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy 21 (2001) 181-231.

Next, Asmis turns to Epicurus’ second rule of investigation: one must use “perceptions” (aisthēseis) and “feelings” (pathē) as signs of what is “waiting” to be observed (to prosmenon) and what cannot be observed (“the non-apparent”, to adēlon). “Feelings” are signs of inner conditions of pleasure and pain, “perceptions” of what is outside us (e.g., colors). And all perceptions are true. For this thesis, Epicurus

offered two basic arguments. The first is that unless one accepts all the perceptions, stripped of any added opinion, as a basis of judgement, there is no way of settling, or indeed conducting, any enquiry. The second is that whatever appears in perception corresponds to something that enters us from outside; in every case, therefore, we perceive something from outside as it really is.

Perception of this sense-object is always true, whereas added opinion may be true or false.

So far, so good. But now consider this:

Epicurus held that opinions of this kind ‘become’ true if there is ‘witnessing’ (epimarturēsis) and false if there is ‘no witnessing’ (ouk epimarturēsis). On the other hand, opinions about what is not apparent ‘become’ true if there is ‘no counterwitnessing’ (ouk antimarturēsis) and false if there is ‘counterwitnessing’ (antimarturēsis). The term ‘become’ indicates that the opinion is initially neither true nor false; it becomes true or false as the result of a method of testing.

This is to make a mountain out of the molehill verb “become” (ginetai), which could as easily be translated ‘turns out to be (true or false).’

Asmis goes on to say,

an opinion about what is ‘waiting’ [to be observed] becomes true whenever the feature that has been added by opinion becomes evident, whether or not this feature exists objectively. Against this view, one may object that this is to turn the notion of ‘true opinion’ on its head, for the truth of an opinion will be entirely relative to the observer.

She replies: “any opinion about what is ‘waiting’ is an expectation about what will appear, not an opinion about what exists objectively.” So, e.g., the opinion that is confirmed is not ’That’s Plato over there’ but merely ‘When I get a closer view, I will have a perception that is like the perceptions that I have had when looking at Plato in the past,’ an opinion that is confirmed even if one is looking, not at Plato, but at Plato’s evil twin.

(6) Liba Taub’s “Cosmology and meteorology” emphasizes that “Epicurean cosmology and meteorology were motivated by the desire to alleviate fear of gods.” “In order to alleviate anxiety,” she notes, “it is sufficient to be able to offer a number of possible explanations for” meteorological phenomena. And “sufficient understanding of cosmology and meteorology are available to ordinary people to alleviate their anxieties, simply using common everyday techniques involving using clear language, observations, and analogies to what is already familiar.” Her discussion of cosmology covers the infinity of the universe, the thesis that there is “an absolute, and natural, ‘up’ and ‘down’ in the universe,” the thesis that our cosmos is just one of an infinitely many, the stability of the earth, and “the life cycle of our kosmos.” Her discussion of meteorology emphasizes Epicurus’ “hallmark tactics of drawing analogies to everyday experience and suggesting a number of possible causes” for the various meteorological phenomena. “Curiously,” she observes, “Epicurus’ treatment of ice is markedly different,” for here he “refers to atomic theory and uses geometrical language (‘circular’, ‘scalene’, ‘acute-angled’) to describe the possible shapes of ice atoms.” This “use of technical terms … contrasts with the language of everyday experience used to describe most other phenomena.”

(7) Christopher Gill’s “Psychology” discusses “(1) the bodily nature of the psyche, (2) the atomic composition of the psyche, and (3) links between psychological functions and the structure of the body,” concluding with “(4) the capacity of the psyche, in human beings, for the development of agency and responsibility.” “The psyche is bodily,” he explains,

its distinctive make-up being explained by partial resemblance to other fine and mobile forms of body (wind and heat). Accordingly, Epicurus replaces the traditional … contrast between psyche and body with that between the psyche (one part of the body) and the rest of the aggregate (the total bodily complex).

For Epicurus, “the psyche must be a body, since it is capable of acting and being acted upon, causal properties which belong only to bodies.” The psyche’s features are explained in terms of “four exceptionally fine and mobile types of atom,” e.g., “the dominance of fire-like, wind-like or air-like atoms in the psychic make-up results in animal or human characteristics that are relatively angry, frightened or placid.” There is an “exceptionally complete blend” of these four types of atoms, which “helps to explain the occurrence of complex and subtle functions such as the discrimination of qualities involved in sensation.” He adds: “Producing this blend of qualities is the special role of the (unnamed) fourth type of psychic atoms, which seems to have been introduced to provide an explanation at the atomic level for this exceptionally complete blend.” But his only evidence for this is that the fourth type is described by Lucretius as “the ‘psyche of the psyche’,” and it seems to me better to say simply that it was introduced to explain sensation, which none of the other three can explain.

“The psyche as a whole,” Gill next notes, "seems to have been subdivided into (in Latin) animus (‘mind’) and anima (‘spirit’), characterized in one (Greek) source as ‘rational’ and ‘non-rational’ parts." He emphasizes “that the mind-spirit complex (which Lucretius describes as a ‘single nature’) is both bodily in itself and closely integrated with the rest of the body.” Epicurus’ view of the location of the mind, says Gill, was “probably derived from earlier accounts, such as the heart-centered theory of Praxagoras.”

Next, Gill argues that “Epicureanism shows how a materialist theory of the psyche is compatible with giving a coherent account of rational agency and ethical development.” He holds that “both Epicurus and Democritus adopt a reductionist view,” breaking with Democritus only in rejecting his eliminativism. “It is consistent with this approach,” he adds, “that we find, in Epicurean accounts, the combination of atomic and psychological explanations of animal activity, for instance in Lucretius’ account of the origin of motion.” But Lucretius’ account (4.881-90) does not mention atoms. Granted, it does mention the “images of walking” that must strike our minds before we walk, and these images are indeed “structures of very small and fine atoms.” But if every explanation citing something that happens to be made of atoms counts as an ‘atomic explanation,’ then every Epicurean explanation will count as one! As a second example of an account that “combines atomic and psychological analysis,” Gill offers “Epicurus’ description of human development” in On Nature 25. But atoms only figure into this account negatively, as not necessitating our development. “The description of human development,” says Gill, “is couched in atomic terms, for instance in the account of our ‘congenital nature’ and also, by implication at least, of the environmental influences or ‘seeds’ which ‘flow in through our passages’.” But, again, these are not ‘atomic explanations,’ but explanations in terms of things that happen to be made of atoms, as everything is.

Finally, Gill discusses points of “linkage between physics and ethics,” e.g., the way that "the recognition of human mortality is taken to be crucial for counteracting fear of death. He notes, for instance, that “the Epicurean definition of happiness … as pleasure, characterizes this in terms that combine physical and psychological well-being,” and that both kinetic and katastematic pleasures “include bodily and psychological dimensions.” I fail to see how these are linkages between physics and ethics, however, unless one counts any reference in one’s ethics to the body as a linkage to physics.

(8) Tim O’Keefe’s “Action and responsibility” is a synopsis of his book Epicurus on Freedom (2005). In both he argues against ‘the traditional interpretation’ of the role played by the atomic swerve in preserving our freedom. On this interpretation, as I defended it in “Epicurus on ‘Free Volition’ and the Swerve,” Phronesis 44 (1999) 253-99, our volitions are caused from the bottom up by one or more swerves of our minds’ constituent atoms. Lucretius explains that there are three kinds of macroscopic motion: motion caused by collision, downward motion caused by weight, and motion caused by “free volition,” when “we swerve our motions at no determined time nor in a determined place.” And “nothing can come to be from nothing”; all macroscopic motions must be caused from the bottom up by atomic motions. So our volitions must be caused from the bottom up by indeterministic swerves of atoms.

My main criticism of O’Keefe’s chapter is that he fails to explain away the appearance that this is what Lucretius means to say. According to O’Keefe, the aim of Lucretius’ argument is to preserve, not “the sort of ‘two-way’ power either to do or not to do something that is supposed by some to be necessary for free will,” but merely “effective agency,” the “ability to do as one wishes.” But this fails to do justice to the emphasis in Lucretius’ text on how indeterministic swerves underlie our indeterministic volitions.

It is true that the “horses Lucretius describes at the starting gates are not trying to decide whether or not to break from the gates.” They are presented instead to illustrate how it takes time for their volitions to translate into actions. Nevertheless, their motions are presented as occurring at an undetermined time and place. So, since nothing can come from nothing, they must be caused from the bottom up by atomic swerves. It is also true that Lucretius does not mention the swerve in DRN 4.877-96. But that is because there he is not concerned with explaining how our volitions can be free but merely with how they manage to set the great bulk of the body in motion. It is also true that “a random atomic swerving in one’s mind is an unpromising basis for the production of free and responsible actions.” But from that we should infer, not that Epicurus cannot have held such a view, but that Epicurus did no better than modern libertarians when they try to specify the physical basis of free volition.

But it is a mistake, says O’Keefe, to think that Epicurus is a libertarian facing such a problem. For Epicurus was not concerned to preserve the “’two-sided free will” of modern libertarians. He was concerned, says O’Keefe, only to defeat the causal determinism that he (mistakenly) believed is entailed by logical determinism. That is why Epicurus denied the principle of bivalence as applied to future-tensed propositions: he thought that, if all future-tensed propositions have a truth value at present, there must be causes at present that necessitate all future states of affairs. But that would make deliberation pointless. For, when we deliberate, we presuppose the contingency of the future. That, according to O’Keefe, is why Epicurus posited the swerve. But was not another reason that he wanted to reconcile his atomism with his libertarian intuition that it is genuinely open to us whether we do or not do a given action? O’Keefe would have us believe that it is anachronistic to attribute such a concern to Epicurus. But this seems to be what Aristotle is expressing when he says that, “when acting is up to us, so is not acting” (NE 3.5, 1113b7-8). And it is a rather basic intuition.

Lucretius says that the swerve preserves the “free volition” of “animals everywhere,” not just of humans. So why are we morally responsible agents when other animals are not? The answer, says O’Keefe, is that we have reason and reason allows us to modify our desires, whereas animals have only “irrational memory.” I agree. I also agree that Epicurus was a reductionist like Democritus; it is only Democritus’ eliminativism that Epicurus rejected. Democritus claimed that such sensible qualities as sweetness exist only “by convention,” inferring, from the fact that honey tastes sweet to some and bitter to others, that the honey is neither. Epicurus preserved the reality of such qualities as sweetness, O’Keefe explains, by adding the proper relativizing qualifications, so that ‘honey is sweet’ amounts to ‘honey is sweet to those in such and such circumstances.’ The Epicureans took Democritus’ eliminativism to include, not only sensible qualities, but also compounds quite generally, including our own bodies and souls. Epicurus replied, argues Keefe, not by denying that compounds are reducible to their constituent atoms, but by identifying compounds with their atoms and insisting that, though the compounds are not eternal beings like their atoms, they are nevertheless real.

I agree with this too. For, like O’Keefe, I reject David Sedley’s reading of On Nature 25, according to which the mind has radically emergent properties incompatible with reductionism. But I disagree with O’Keefe’s reading of this notoriously difficult text. (For what I take to be the correct reading, see pp. 290-94 of my aforementioned article.) The chapter ends with a solid discussion of Epicurus’ argument that the determinist is self-refuting.

(9) Raphael Woolf’s “Pleasure and desire” begins by arguing that it is a mistake to see Epicurus as an ascetic who swears off all luxury. Luxury “is in fact to be welcomed,” writes Woolf, “so long as one has the right attitude” toward it, “that it is to be enjoyed if present, but not missed if absent.” The desire for luxurious food, he notes, is a “natural” albeit “not necessary” desire; it becomes an empty desire only if one thinks that one needs it. I agree with this. But problems soon surface. Woolf wants to say “that one’s life is more pleasant but not happier” if one enjoys luxuries in the proper way. But in KD 18 Epicurus says that “pleasure does not increase once the pain caused by want is removed” but “is merely embellished (or varied),” which suggests that the luxurious life is not more pleasant. Woolf speaks of this as “the rather drastic expedient of denying that pleasure actually does behave differently than happiness,” and contrasts it with “an alternative strategy that Epicurus seems to have worked with,” that of distinguishing the katastematic pleasures (painlessness and undisturbedness) from kinetic pleasures and identifying happiness with katastematic pleasure, thereby allowing kinetic pleasure to behave differently from happiness, such that kinetic pleasures “might increase the pleasantness of a life … without increasing its happiness.” On my view, by contrast, Epicurus has just the one “drastic” strategy of denying that either the pleasantness or the happiness of a life can be increased once one has katastematic pleasure.

Woolf next asks why Epicurus counts the katastematic pleasures as pleasures and answers that “the state of freedom from pain and distress … is experienced as having a positive qualitative character,” “a relaxed freshness … that feels wonderful.” But, as I argued in "Epicurus on the Telos", Phronesis 38 (1993) 281-320, this is a mistake. Painlessness does not feel good. It is good. Indeed, it is the best possible condition of the body, a condition that cannot be made better by the addition of the pleasant feeling brought by a kinetic pleasure, but can only be varied. That is why Epicurus says that the katastematic pleasures produce the greatest joy to a rational agent. And, since pleasures are identified by Epicurus as objects of joy, the katastematic pleasures are the greatest possible pleasures. I do not deny that the position that I ascribe to Epicurus “seems a little strained,” since it amounts to denying that it is more pleasant for a painless person to be experiencing a feeling of pleasure than not to be. But Epicurus’ position should seem strained, I would argue, for how else to explain Cicero’s exasperated criticisms of it in De Finibus 2 without supposing that Cicero has misunderstood it?

In a footnote to his claim that painlessness “feels wonderful,” Woolf addresses my view. He concedes that there is “some evidence that Epicurus regarded the state of being free from pain and distress as an intentional object,” that in which the greatest joy is taken. Then he says, “By itself this would give Epicurus a rather promiscuous (and correspondingly bland) hedonism, since, as ancient critics pointed out, one can rejoice in anything.” True enough, I reply. In the chapter that I am writing for the Oxford Handbook of Epicureanism, I shall address this objection by defining Epicurean pleasure normatively, as that in which a rational agent has good reason to rejoice. Woolf also objects that katastematic pleasure ought to have a felt character since “feeling” is the Epicurean practical criterion. To this I reply that pain feels bad and mental distress makes it impossible to enjoy what feels good, kinetic pleasure, in its unadulterated state. Woolf also cites the so-called ‘cradle argument’, which starts from the “supposition that what young creatures find attractive is the feeling of pleasure.” True enough, I reply, but it does not follow that katastematic pleasure is a feeling of pleasure. We start off pursuing kinetic pleasures, but end up as rational Epicurean adults realizing that the key to living a pleasant life is removing pain and fear. This pleasant life will include kinetic pleasures, since one could not be free of distress if one had no prospect of enjoying pleasant feelings. But katastematic pleasure is the goal, and not because it “feels wonderful.”

(10) Eric Brown’s “Politics and society” begins by noting that, though Epicureans “discourage starting a family and engaging in politics” and “deny that justice exists by nature,” they are not “apolitical.” Rather, the Epicurean “adopts counter-cultural politics, rooted in his need for friendship and justice.” Brown ably defends Epicurus’ theory of friendship against a number of criticisms, but grants that one “sticks”: that “Epicurus’ egoistic hedonism cannot sustain valuing others for their own sake” and so Epicureans cannot be genuine friends. He notes that later “more timid” Epicureans caved in to this criticism and claimed that friends end up valuing one another for their own sakes. These later Epicureans, he rightly observes, “destroy Epicureanism’s elegantly systematic insistence that one should act always for the sake of pleasure alone.” He prefers the original Epicurean view that “we should seek our friends’ pleasures as much as we seek our own, but we should seek only our own pleasures for their own sake.”

Brown begins his section on justice by noting, “Curiously, it is not even clear at first that Epicurus’ theory of justice allows him to say that a community of sages would be just.” For “there is no justice without a convention that rules out inflicting and suffering harm” and “sages have no need for such laws to govern themselves.” Then he argues that there are “two necessary and jointly sufficient conditions defining just and unjust actions”: “An action is unjust if and only if it is proscribed by a convention made to avoid harming each other and being harmed and this convention actually benefits reciprocal community.” Even sages need this convention, he observes, because even they have “need for co-ordinated behaviour to avoid harm and achieve benefits for mutual community”: “The community of sages needs justice even though sages need neither laws nor the fear of punishment to encourage them to do as justice requires.” He concludes by explaining “why there is not a more concrete Epicurean ‘political philosophy’: what is just for one community is not just for another, since what benefits reciprocal community is relative to the community’s particular circumstances.”

(11) Catherine Atherton’s “Epicurean philosophy of language” begins by noting that the Epicurean interest in language is not the same as that of modern philosophers of language. So, for instance, though “Epicureans did accept the existence of a signifying relation between language and the world, our principal sources do not make it central,” leaving it open to scholars to debate whether Epicureans are intensionalists (the majority view) or extensionalists. Likewise, when one tries to specify what Epicurus means by "the ‘empty (vocal) sounds’ which are to be avoided by proper use of ‘first thought-objects’ in Ep. Hdt. 37," there is “a strong temptation to suppose that these are precisely sounds which have sense but fail to refer,” but Atherton warns us against using the modern sense/reference distinction here on the grounds that it does not employ Epicurean concepts. On her view, Epicurus is here simply “warning us off talk about impossible combinations of properties.” She emphasizes the inadequacies of Epicurus’ theory. For example, after presenting Epicurus’ naturalistic account of the origin of language, she notes that, in "its reliance on a causal linkage, running from external object via internal state to vocalization," it “removes control over vocalization from vocalizers,” with the result that utterances “will inevitably lack communicative (as opposed to informational) content.” Also, in reply to the Epicurean argument against “Plato’s knowledgeable or expert name-giver” that “he could not have had the anticipation … of the usefulness of names,” Atherton asks, “if a putative name-giver could not construct this anticipation without appropriate experience of names in use, whence did the real name-givers — primitive humans … — get their anticipation thereof … ?” Also, “the relevant evidence suggests a worrying deficiency in the relevant theoretical resources” to explain ambiguity and a “general lack of interest in explaining the phenomenon of syntax.”

(12) David Blank’s "Philosophia and technē: Epicureans on the arts" draws on his work on Sextus Empiricus’ Against the Professors of the Liberal Studies and on the fragmentary texts of Philodemus concerning rhetoric and other technai. Blank begins with Epicurus’ "opposition to paideia, the set of disciplines or subjects of instruction which instilled culture and bestowed prestige on the Greek elite and include the so-called ‘liberal’ arts, usually: grammar or literature, rhetoric, dialectic, geometry, arithmetic, astronomy, music." The Epicureans held that these arts “contributed nothing to the perfection of wisdom.” Philodemus grants that the Epicurean philosopher “will have a non-technical knowledge” of various arts, like household management, but denies that expert mastery of any of them is necessary.

From Philodemus’ On Wealth, Blank takes this: “The philosopher will not choose the military or political life of action, the art of horsemanship, using slaves to work mines, or cultivating the land with his own hands.” But he might “let others cultivate his farmland … or accept rent from tenants and profit from the expertise of his slaves.” The best way to get income, though, is to receive gifts from those who appreciate his philosophical discourses. Next Blank turns to Philodemus’ On Music, which argues against the view that music is “important in moulding the character of the young and in modifying behaviour by, for example, soothing the angry” and argues for the view that “music distracts us from what is needful.” Next Blank notes that “the sage’s attitude to writing poetry is apparently similar to his attitude to performing music: it is too much trouble and distracts from philosophy to learn and to practise it, but it is fine to listen to it with enjoyment, so long as the ears will tolerate.” What is to be avoided is “learned conversations about ‘musical problems and the philological questions of critics.’” Next Blank turns to Sextus, whose critique of “grammar — the expertise devoted to the study of what is in poets and prose-writers” draws on Epicureanism. This segues into a discussion of Philodemus’ On the good king according to Homer, wherein “Philodemus points out the beneficial precepts about monarchs in Homer’s text.” Then he turns to Philodemus’ On Poems, which “presents a critique of the poetic theories of other philosophers,” arguing that they “overlooked the ‘conceptions’ … ‘of good and bad verse and poetry.’” Finally Blank discusses Philodemus’ On Rhetoric, which argues that “there is no expertise of speaking to assemblies and courtrooms,” but there is one of panegyric rhetoric (or “sophistic”), for “it has method, but not much of it.”

(13) James Warren’s “Removing fear” begins by noting that, for the Epicureans, even though fear has a non-cognitive aspect, it is “the result of ignorance and false opinion.” So it is only "by use of our reasoning abilities that we can come to form the correct views of the gods and death and therefore attain and enjoy ataraxia." Next Warren discusses an interesting passage from Philodemus saying that fear of the gods can be “addressed directly because people tend to be conscious of what they believe about the subject,” whereas fear of death “is usually driven by a set of unarticulated and unnoticed beliefs.” Then he discusses each of these fears in turn. I have no criticism to make of his discussion of how the gods’ blessedness shows that they are non-providential, of how the argument from evil shows the same thing, or of how the Epicureans conceived of true piety. Just one quibble: Warren cites me as a supporter of the ‘idealist’ view of the gods “as thought constructs.” But in my aforementioned article “Epicurus on the Nature of the Gods” I reject both the idealist and the realist view of the gods in favor of the view that the gods are “dual-natured.”

Warren’s discussion of the fear of death is even better. He distinguishes “two related claims about the state of affairs after an individual’s death. (1) After the dissolution of the soul there is no perception of pleasure and pain. (2) After the dissolution of the soul there is no subject of harm; the individual ceases to exist.” Then he examines two modern criticisms of Epicurus’ view. On the ‘comparative deprivation account,’ people are harmed by death because they do not experience the goods which they would have experienced had they died later. To this Warren replies that “it seems odd to conceive of a ‘loss’ in which there is no subject at all after the disappearance of the supposed goods.” He also notes the oddness of “the symmetrical claim” that people could be harmed by being born later than they might have been, thereby missing out on experiences that they might have had. “The second principal criticism of the Epicurean view” discussed by Warren goes like this: “It is not at all incoherent not to fear ‘being dead’ but, while alive, nevertheless to be anxious that one’s life and its various projects, hopes and desires, will inevitably come to an end” and “more specifically that it might come to an end too soon.” The Epicureans reply that, “once the good life has been achieved, there is no sense in which it can be cut short prematurely since it is already complete.” This, says Warren, “is a radical and revisionist account of what constitutes a ‘complete life’” and it leaves one wondering “if the price for a life without fear of death in any sense is much too high: it is a life we cannot imagine wanting to attain or to continue living.”

(14) Voula Tsouna’s “Epicurean therapeutic strategies” begins with the Epicureans’ conception of themselves, on the “medical analogy,” as doctors purging patients of diseases of the soul. Then she turns to a discussion of the various therapeutic strategies that Epicureans employ. She discusses Philodemus’ On Frank Speech, which explains “the candid criticism that an Epicurean teacher addresses to a student,” criticism that is tailored to the individual student. Then she explains that, though a “large part of Epicurus’ conception of therapy … consists in arguments,” one must not overlook the extra-cognitive aspects of therapy, such as “repetition and memorization.” Next she discusses therapeutic techniques that she finds in Lucretius, like the repeated use of the first person plural which demands the reader’s active participation. Here her notion of a therapeutic technique shows itself to be rather broad indeed. If even the use of a lot of images and metaphors counts as a therapeutic technique, then what does not?

She goes on to give other examples of Epicurean therapeutic techniques: urging us “to cultivate an impartial perspective,” “redescribing familiar things in an unfamiliar light,” getting students to take the long view of their lives as a way of combating passions, getting students “to get to know their own selves,” shifting attention, and “moral portraiture,” composing sketches of characters who are moral paradigms, good or bad. She concludes by defending Epicurean therapy, insisting that it is not brainwashing, but a process that involves the student in “self-examination and self-criticism.”

(15) Catherine Wilson’s “Epicureanism in early modern philosophy” brings the volume to a fitting close. She begins by explaining how the recovery of Epicurean texts in the early modern period “contributed to the formation of a rival image of nature — the corpuscularian, mechanical philosophy — that replaced the scholastic synthesis of Aristotelianism and Christian doctrine.” Epicureanism, she explains, was regarded by many as a morally corrupting force, but found favor among scientists and influenced, not only Gassendi, but also Bacon, Boyle, Locke, Galileo, Descartes, and Hobbes. There was a sticking point, however: Epicurean mortalism, which “threatened the basis of the Christian religion.” This helps explain how Descartes’ dualism arose, why Leibniz “saw the necessity of constructing an entire rival system of immaterial atomism or ‘monadology,’” and even Kant’s two-world view.

“The vindication of pleasure was as significant a feature of early modern moral philosophy as its acceptance of corpuscularism,” she goes on to say, before tracing its influence from Lorenzo Valla to David Hume. Then she describes the influence of Epicurus’ conception of justice, aptly citing Thomas Creech’s remark that “the admirers of Mr. Hobbes may easily discern that his Politics are but Lucretius enlarged” and emphasizing that “the development of the Utilitarian view that the function of the state is to make men happy … is unthinkable in the absence of renewed attention to Epicurean moral and political theory.” Then she describes the critical reaction to the revival of atomism, noting the arguments made against atoms combining by blind chance to create our world and against atomism explaining our souls. She concludes by emphasizing how many “characteristically modern doctrines … have ancient roots in Epicureanism.”

This last chapter, like most of the others, is remarkable for how much is said so clearly in so short a space. (The average length of a chapter is 17-18 pages.) I have expressed reservations about a number of the chapters, but no reasonable reviewer will be critical of the work overall. James Warren deserves commendation for editing this welcome addition to Epicurean studies.

The book ends with a 23-page bibliography, a 26-page index locorum, and a 7-page general index.