2010.10.05

Thomas Holden

Spectres of False Divinity: Hume's Moral Atheism

Thomas Holden, Spectres of False Divinity: Hume's Moral Atheism, Oxford University Press, 2010, 246pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199579945.

Reviewed by Rico Vitz, University of North Florida


In Spectres of False Divinity, Thomas Holden clarifies Hume's challenge to "traditional theism," defending the claim that Hume is a 'moral atheist' -- that is, one who "positively rejects the existence of a god with moral attributes" (p. 2). More specifically, he claims that Hume argues not merely for weak moral atheism -- that is, the denial of the existence of a morally praiseworthy god -- but for strong moral atheism -- that is, the denial of the existence of a morally assessable god (pp. 7-8; see also pp. ix, 39). Moreover, he argues that Hume regards this strong thesis "as a provable certainty," not as "a provisional hypothesis" (p. 24). Recognizing and understanding the nature of Hume's moral atheism is significant, Holden claims, because it is a central element of Hume's naturalistic and irreligious agenda that "threatens to rule out any practically meaningful religion" (p. 3). If his interpretation is correct, Hume offers an argument not only against both the rational theology and arational faith of "Christianity and other traditional theistic systems," but also against the "optimistic deistic philosophies that dominated 'freethinking' thought in Hume's day" (pp. 212, 218-9). Thus, if Holden is right, Hume offers a philosophy of irreligion that attempts to neutralize the influence of theological speculation on morality and politics (see, e.g., pp. ix, 3, 182, 216, 218).

Let me begin by providing an overview of Holden's project. In the first part of the book, he attempts to stave off two "big-picture objections" to the plausibility of his interpretation. One such objection, which he addresses in Chapter 1, contends that since "Hume never explicitly endorses moral atheism in any of his writings," it follows that Holden's proposed interpretation "lacks an appropriate textual basis" (p. 15). Holden offers both a methodological and a textual response. With respect to interpretive methodology, he notes that "Hume often presents his irreligious views in an oblique manner," even engaging in "faux-pious indirection," when he deems it expedient. With respect to the textual evidence, he calls attention to those passages of Hume's writings when he speaks most freely -- namely, his letters, where he expressly notes that "even if God is benevolent, we can still have no positive feelings toward him for 'he is not the natural Object of any Passion or Affection'" (p. 17).

The other objection, which he addresses in Chapter 2, contends that "Hume cannot endorse moral atheism without contradicting his own underlying skepticism concerning all theological and cosmological speculation" (p. 19; cf. p. 15). Essentially, the objection implies that although Hume might be a moral agnostic, he could not be a moral atheist. In response to this objection, Holden employs a distinction between what he calls 'core natural theology', which "aims at knowledge of the deity's distinctive intrinsic character," and 'liminal natural theology', which "stops short of such ambitions" (p. 20). This distinction, he claims, is essential to understanding both (i) Hume's encouragement that philosophers avoid speculating about matters "beyond the sphere of everyday experience and common life", and (ii) his propounding "unorthodox, negative, and irreligious conclusions" about the nature of the deity (p. 46). On Holden's reading, the former motivates Hume's rejection of 'core natural theology'; the latter evinces his commitment to 'liminal natural theology'.

In the second part, he elucidates a pair of Hume's arguments for moral atheism and attempts to defend them against various objections. One of the arguments, which he explicates in Chapters 3 and 4, is what he calls "The Argument from Sentimentalism" (p. 95):

(S1) The deity is not a natural object of any human passion.

(S2) Moral sentiments are a species of human passion.

(S3) If a being is not a natural object of the moral sentiments, then it cannot have moral attributes -- either virtues or vices.

Therefore,

(S4) The deity cannot have moral attributes -- either virtues or vices.

The other, which he explicates in Chapter 5, is what he calls "The Argument from Motivation" (see, e.g., pp. 120, 209; cf. pp. 142-3):

(M1) In order to be morally assessable, a being must have a sentimental psychology sufficiently similar to that of human beings.

Therefore,

(M2) If the first cause lacks a sentimental psychology sufficiently similar to that of human beings, the first cause is not morally assessable.

(M3) The first cause does, most likely, lack a sentimental psychology sufficiently similar to that of human beings.

Therefore,

(M4) The first cause is, most likely, not morally assessable.

In the third part, he examines a pair of sets of irreligious arguments that Hume discusses but on which, he argues, Hume does not base his case for moral atheism. One set, which he explicates in Chapter 6, consists of three arguments concerning evil: (i) the evidential argument from evil, (ii) the logical problem of evil, and what he calls (iii) the inference problem of evil. On Holden's account, the evidential argument is one that Hume does not endorse but, rather, uses as a parody of traditional 'core natural theology'; the logical problem and the inference problem are arguments that Hume endorses but not ones that constitute his case for moral atheism (pp. 146-9, 154, 159, 178-9). The other, which he explicates in Chapter 7, consists of arguments from determinism that allegedly demonstrate that any god that created the universe would be the remote cause of vice and, thus, that such a being either would not be justified in making moral claims on human beings or would not be morally praiseworthy. He identifies two such arguments: (i) the argument from determinism against duties to God and (ii) the argument from determinism and evil. Regarding the former, he contends that Hume endorses the argument but that its thesis is distinct from moral atheism, saying "nothing one way or the other about whether the original cause is morally praiseworthy, or whether it is a possible object of moral assessment" (pp. 181-2). Regarding the latter, he suggests that although Hume does use the argument for dialectical purposes, it is not one that he ultimately endorses (p. 182). Thus, Holden concludes, "the bare fact that evil exists provides no evidential support for … moral atheism," and the truth of determinism "makes no real difference to this picture" (p. 206).

He concludes by noting that Hume's moral atheism is important because it

closes off not just the possibility that rational theology has genuine implications for our behavior, but also the possibility that an arational faith or religious hope could shape our moral lives without falling into open irrationality. In positively ruling out a deity with moral attributes, Hume disallows practical implications from any religion, rational or arational, centered on the first cause or organizing principle responsible for the ordered universe. (pp. 218-9, Holden's emphasis; see also, pp. ix, 3, 216)

Having summarized the essential elements of Holden's Spectres of False Divinity, let me offer a critique of some of the key details of the text. I suspect that some may be inclined to take issue with various aspects of the third part of the book -- i.e., Holden's account of Hume's position on the arguments from evil and the arguments from determinism. These are reasonable concerns, but I am going to set them aside for two reasons. First, all things considered, these are likely interpretive issues on which reasonable people can differ, given the textual ambiguities created by the rhetorical devices and strategies that Hume employs. Second, even if Holden's account of Hume's position on these arguments is inaccurate, his error would not seem to threaten his reading of Hume as a strong moral atheist. Nor would it seem to threaten his point that Hume's moral atheism attempts to neutralize the influence of theological speculation by demonstrating that the moral and political implications of any traditional, monotheistic religion are rationally unwarranted (see, e.g., pp. ix, 3, 182, 216, 219). Therefore, in what follows, I will focus on two tasks: (i) examining whether the Argument from Sentimentalism is sound and (ii) examining the nature of Holden's conclusion regarding the implications of Hume's moral atheism.

Regarding the first issue, the Argument from Sentimentalism is certainly valid, and (S2) seems to be warranted. So, if there is a problem, it would seem to be with either (S1) or (S3). Since Holden's defense focuses principally on (S1), my comments will as well (see pp. 100-14). (For the sake of clarity: my interest in what follows is not the interpretive question of whether Hume endorses (S1). I found Holden's argument on that point rather persuasive. Rather, it is the evaluative question of whether (S1) is warranted, even if Hume offers the defense that Holden suggests.) (S1) implies that the first cause of the universe is not a natural object of any human passion. Thus, (S1) suggests, rather implausibly it seems to me, that the first cause of the universe is not for many people the natural object of, say, the passions of awe or wonder. Given that the Argument from Sentimentalism focuses on the 'moral sentiments' -- and assuming that being able to inspire either awe or wonder is not a sentiment concerning a quality, e.g., agreeable to oneself or others -- we could omit both (S1) and (S2), and represent the more easily defensible essence of the argument as:

(S1*) The deity is not a natural object of the moral sentiments.

(S3) If a being is not a natural object of the moral sentiments, then it cannot have moral attributes -- either virtues or vices.

Therefore,

(S4) The deity cannot have moral attributes -- either virtues or vices.

Recognizing the revised version of the argument as valid and, setting aside (S3), we are faced with a new question: namely, is (S1*) warranted? On Holden's account, although Hume grants that there may be some individuals with "idiosyncratic sentimental attitudes" -- e.g., such that the deity is the natural object of their moral sentiments -- he would not regard the sentiments of such people as part of our shared natural attitudes and, hence, would not regard them as having moral authority (p. 105). In fact, perhaps Hume would suggest that these are mere "spectres of false divinity" -- mundane sentiments "projected by the restless mind and its wheel of inner passions" onto what people mistakenly take to be the first cause of the universe (p. 76).

Holden is right to suggest that this is the line of defense that Hume would likely employ. It is not clear, however, how effective this defense of Hume's position is. He contends, in his Essays for example, that there are moral experts whose faculties are not only 'sound' but also 'delicate', or finely tuned. The defense implies that the individuals with "idiosyncratic sentimental attitudes" are people whose faculties are either not sound or not delicate or both -- essentially, and more importantly, that they are people whose cognitive faculties are 'deficient', 'diseased', 'disordered', 'perverse', and so forth. In other words, it implies that those with "idiosyncratic sentimental attitudes" are people whose cognitive faculties are not functioning properly.

This teleological implication, alone, might not be problematic for Hume since there are probably naturalistic accounts of teleology that are compatible with his project -- cf., for example, Garrett's account of teleological explanation in Spinoza or Hoffman's account of Aquinas's "stripped down" version of final causation. However, being a person with "idiosyncratic sentimental attitudes" is not a sufficient condition for being a person with cognitive faculties that are disordered, and having sentiments that are common or consistent with those of the masses is not a sufficient condition for having cognitive faculties that are 'sound' and 'delicate'. Thus, it seems that Hume cannot easily appeal to the kind of normative teleology the defense seems to require -- one that would allow Hume to disregard the potential moral authority of those with what he would regard as disordered moral sentiments. This is an intriguing puzzle, and quite possibly a significant challenge, for Hume's philosophical project.

There is, obviously, much more one could say on the first issue, but in the interest of brevity, let me stop there and turn to the second. Holden concludes that Hume's moral atheism "closes off not just the possibility that rational theology has genuine implications for our behavior, but also the possibility that an arational faith or religious hope could shape our moral lives without falling into open irrationality" (pp. 218-9, Holden's emphasis; cf. pp. ix, 3, 182, 216). Given that Holden's principal goal is to offer an accurate interpretation of one critical aspect of Hume's irreligious project (cf. p. x), his conclusion is better understood as an interpretive claim, suggesting (i) that Hume's arguments for moral atheism, if cogent, would neutralize the influence of traditional, monotheistic religions on morality and politics, rather than as an evaluative claim, suggesting (ii) that Hume has, in fact, offered arguments which demonstrate that the moral and political implications of any traditional, monotheistic religion are rationally unwarranted. In this respect, Holden's conclusion is like the defenses he offers of Hume's views, which aim to show how Hume would respond to objections not, necessarily, whether such responses are successful. Circumscribing his analysis of Hume's moral atheism in this way is understandable, but I, for one, would like to have seen him submit Hume's bold thesis to a more thorough and critical evaluation. Perhaps, however, this is less a criticism of and more a compliment to Holden's project: it left me wanting more.

In summary, Thomas Holden's Spectres of False Divinity is an important book that makes three significant contributions to the literature on Hume's philosophy of religion. First, it clarifies Hume's methodological approach to religious epistemology. Second, it clarifies a central and critical aspect of his irreligious program. Third, it offers a thought-provoking and innovative interpretation of his position on the arguments from evil and determinism. In light of these contributions, it is an interesting and very worthwhile read.