2010.10.07

Robert B. Talisse

Democracy and Moral Conflict

Robert B. Talisse, Democracy and Moral Conflict, Cambridge University Press, 2009, 205pp., $39.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521183901.

Reviewed by Terence Ball, Arizona State University


Not so long ago political scientists spoke confidently, if none too felicitously, of “consensus” on “the democratic creed” as a “functional prerequisite” of democracy.1 In the United States and other western democracies this alleged consensus was attributed to “the genius of American politics,” which was said to be nonphilosophical and anti-ideological (Boorstin); to a “Lockean consensus” which made material interests and property rights central to our politics (Hartz); and even to “the end of ideology” itself (Bell).2 “Consensus historians” narrated the history of the United States as a story in which conflicts — social, political, ideological, and class — did not loom large but were subsumed under a larger and grander narrative of widespread agreement about what it meant to be an American and a small-d democrat.

Beginning in the 1960s and continuing to this day, this alleged American consensus came under severe strain as students and others protested the Vietnam war, marched against racial segregation and for civil rights, women’s rights, gay rights, and (more recently) animal rights and environmental protection. No less significant was the reaction from the right as: the Republican Party nominated Barry Goldwater for president in 1964; the Religious Right rose to political prominence, fueled in large part by objections to (as they saw it) illegitimate, immoral, and unjust Supreme Court decisions allowing abortion and outlawing prayer in public schools; more recently still, Tea Party activists rant about the “radical socialist agenda” of President Obama and have unseated congresspeople they deem insufficiently conservative in bitter and hard-fought primary contests (whether or to what extent they might succeed in the 2010 mid-term elections remains to be seen).

In short, if there once was a fairly seamless American consensus (which I rather doubt, as I shall later explain), there is no longer. This is the ragged backdrop against which Robert Talisse attempts to argue a new and compelling case for democracy in post-consensus America and elsewhere. He writes that at present “our popular democratic politics is driven by insults, scandal, name-calling, fear-mongering, mistrust, charges of hypocrisy, and worse” (p. 1). Hardly Habermas’s “ideal speech situation” in which “the forceless force of the better argument” carries the day!3

Philosophers, political theorists and others who try to account for and make sense of such discord are at a loss to do so in any wholly satisfactory way. Oversimplifying somewhat, two general accounts have emerged of late. The first is "the clash of civilizations account, which holds that the world is on the brink of … a global conflict between distinct and incompatible ways of life." This is the view advanced in very different ways in Samuel Huntington’s The Clash of Civilizations (1996) and in Benjamin R. Barber’s Jihad vs. McWorld (1995). There are global and local variants of this view; according to the latter, a clash of civilizations or a “culture war” is being waged within the United States.

A second account — "the democracy deficit narrative" — holds that a once-widely shared commitment to democracy is in decline, as citizens draw ever-sharper lines dividing them from their fellow citizens, which makes it ever more difficult to find common ground or to compromise (pp. 1-2). According to these two accounts, politics is thus either a politics of difference driven by a kind of “us vs. them” tribalism or by a militant moralism — which is of course different from morality — that brooks no quarter and no compromise.

Under these conditions of moral pluralism and fundamental clashes of conviction, the stage seems set for a Hobbesian bellum omnium contra omnes. If this war is to be avoided, Talisse argues, we shall as democrats have to forgo any claim to base our commitment to democracy on prior moral commitments, since those very commitments are in contention and conflict. Talisse opts instead for an epistemic defense of democracy. His contention is that even though we disagree morally, we are all pretty well in agreement epistemically. This is because we subscribe to a real but largely unconscious and unargued “folk epistemology” (about which more in a moment). Before expounding and defending that bold and even audacious claim, however, he has some spade-work to do.

Consider first Talisse’s method or approach. He has, he says, attempted in the fashion of John Dewey to make a contribution to “public philosophy,” that is, to write a book that is both a work of technical (but readily accessible) philosophy that appeals both to academic philosophers and to intelligent and interested laypeople (p. 9). To that end, he addresses the reader as “you,” and asks what “you” think, what “you” would do, and the like. This is not merely a stylistic tic or affectation but a strategy of argument which asks readers to look within themselves and to their own first-person experiences to assess the adequacy of the claims and arguments he advances (pp. 4-5). In spite of his frequent references to Hobbes and, particularly, to the Hobbesian state of nature, Talisse omits to mention that his method is also that of Hobbes. In Leviathan Hobbes invites the skeptical reader to “read thyself” (nosce teipsum) if he should doubt that what Hobbes says is true of all men’s motivations, fears, and hopes. If you would

learn truly to read one another, … nosce teipsum, Read thyself … to teach us that for the similitude of the thoughts and passions of one man, to the thoughts and passions of another, whosoever looketh into himself and considereth what he doth when he does think, opine, reason, hope, fear, and upon what grounds; he shall thereby read and know what are the thoughts and passions of all other men upon the like occasions.4

To know oneself is perforce to know others. Hobbes bases his view on a universal and timeless conception of human nature or psychology, while Talisse bases his view upon a shared and half-conscious “folk epistemology.” But their aims are akin. Hobbes addresses his book to friend and foe alike, to monarchists and republicans, Anglicans and Presbyterians, and more generally to disputatious human beings who share little in common except identical natures. Ditto for Talisse, except that he does not rely on any grand universalist view of human nature. Both are concerned to show that, for all their differences, humans share certain interests which can be the basis for a shared and commodious common life. So close are their aims and (at least one aspect of) their method that I might almost be tempted to suggest a subtitle to Talisse’s book: Democracy and Moral Conflict; or, Leviathan for our Time.

Hobbes’s solution (in)famously involved imagining a leviathan-state headed by an authoritarian sovereign. As a committed democrat, Talisse does not even entertain such a possibility. But the problem of political legitimacy within the context of moral conflict remains. Talisse frames the problem as a “paradox”:

legitimacy requires that democratic decisions be justifiable to all citizens, but when citizens are deeply divided at the most fundamental moral levels, they are also divided over what constitutes a successful moral justification. And so it seems that democratic justification — and thus democratic legitimacy — is impossible when citizens are deeply divided at the level of their basic moral commitments. (p. 19)

One “standard solution” to this paradox is to point out that democracy is not about outcomes; it is all about agreed-upon procedures. To keep the peace we agree in advance to accept losing on some occasions and winning on others. Talisse argues that “proceduralism does not resolve the paradox of democratic justification” but simply obviates it. To accept and abide by a democratically made decision — say, to forbid the teaching of evolution in public schools in Kansas — does not necessarily mean that I accept it as correct. Thus proceduralism simply sidesteps the problem of “deep politics” and democratic justification (pp. 23-31). The “problem of deep politics” arises when some citizens hold "values and commitments that [they] take to be fundamental and hence non-negotiable" and thus not subject to compromise (p. 37).

With the rise of the Religious Right, in particular, the problem of deep politics has become ever more acute, leading to a legitimacy crisis in democratic theory and in American political practice in particular. Attempts by John Rawls and others to address and perhaps overcome this crisis, Talisse argues, have been less than successful inasmuch as they presuppose the abstract possibility of agreement in a context of actual deep disagreement. Rawls’s resolutely secular conception of “political liberalism” rules out religious reasons and reasoning in public discourse and political argument and thus creates a “politics of omission” in which a sizable portion of the American citizenry is marginalized or excluded entirely (pp. 43-71).

More promising, perhaps, is the approach taken by Jeffrey Stout, who recognizes that religious commitments run deep and that any politics or political theory that fails to acknowledge this fact is doomed to fail. Stout formulates a pragmatic theory according to which, pace Rawls, religious reasoning is on an equal footing with secular reasoning in public discourse; any citizen may employ any kind of reasons or reasoning he or she sees fit to employ. But, says Stout, given the fact of religious diversity and plurality, religious reasoning won’t as a matter of fact gain any traction in the public square, and so religiously minded citizens will resort to secular reasoning as a default or fall-back position, after all. Just as Latin was the common language of medieval and early-modern Europe, so secular discourse becomes the shared language of the modern (or perhaps postmodern) age. Thus Stout, in effect, reaches a Rawlsian conclusion by a non-exclusionist, non-Rawlsian route. And that, says Talisse, leaves unresolved the problem of deep politics.

We appear to be at an impasse. But Talisse claims that there is a way out and that he knows it. Drawing on the work of Paul Churchland and Daniel Dennett on “folk psychology,” Talisse develops the idea of a “folk epistemology.” The adjective “folk” is meant to mark a distinction between the ostensibly objective, external-evidence based “third-personal” scientific psychology and/or technical epistemology and an introspective “first-personal” epistemology and/or psychology. As Churchland puts it, folk psychology refers to the “prescientific, common-sense conceptual framework that all normally socialized humans deploy in order to comprehend, predict, explain, and manipulate the behavior of humans and the higher animals” (quoted, pp. 82-3).

Or, in Dennett’s version, folk psychology is evidenced in the “everyday psychological discourse we use to discuss the mental lives of our fellow human beings” (quoted, p. 83). You need not be a trained professional psychologist to know with reasonable certainty that people act with intentions and ends-in-view, for reasons, and on the basis of the beliefs they hold. And you don’t have to be a specialist in epistemology or philosophy of mind to give a rough but reasonably accurate account of why this is so. Much of our knowledge of how the world works and what makes people “tick” falls under the heading of what Michael Polanyi called “tacit knowledge,” that is, knowledge which you and I possess but if called upon could not give a systematic, much less theoretical, analysis or account of.

Talisse formulates “five principles of folk epistemology,” as follows:

(1) To believe some proposition, p, is to hold that p is true.

(2) To hold that p is true is generally to hold that the best reasons support p.

(3) To hold that p is supported by the best reasons is to hold that p is assertable.

(4) To assert that p is to enter into a social process of reason exchange.

(5) To engage in social processes of reason exchange is to at least implicitly adopt certain cognitive and dispositional norms related to one’s epistemic character (pp. 87-8).

This is followed by an elaboration and defense of the five principles (pp. 88-108), which consists largely of showing that to deny any or all of these principles leads either to self-contradiction or reductio ad absurdum. For example, I (or you) cannot meaningfully assert that "I believe that p but do not believe that p is true" (p. 91). Nor can I (or you) meaningfully assert, "I believe that p but have absolutely no reason for thinking that p is true" (p. 94). In short, to state a belief is implicitly to engage in a social act in which I am prepared to defend my belief by having recourse to reasons resting upon other beliefs, the best available evidence, and other publicly accessible routes to possible or potential agreement or, at least, to cognitively meaningful disagreement which allows us to recognize exactly where we disagree and why. If we are to be “proper believers” we must be prepared to defend our beliefs to others and in public.

Now what exactly (you might ask) does all this have to do with democracy and its defense? Just this:

only in a democracy can an individual practice proper epistemic agency; … in other words, only in a democracy can one be a proper believer. Since we are already committed to proper believing, we are implicitly committed to democratic politics. Folk epistemology accordingly justifies democracy: democracy is the political entailment — indeed, the political manifestation — of the folk epistemic commitments each of us already endorses (p. 121).

In other words, the political context and conditions that allow for the rational articulation and defense of our beliefs — moral, political, or otherwise — are those that exist only in a reasonably open and democratic society. Insofar as we are committed to articulating and defending our beliefs, we are committed to democracy.

By contrast, an anti-democratic, authoritarian, or totalitarian society in which “information is strictly controlled and the exchange of arguments and reasons is suppressed is incompatible with proper believing” (p. 122). So powerful is the pull of folk epistemology, however, that even these heinous regimes will attempt to create the appearance of proper believing.

If a tyrant is to succeed in controlling the beliefs of his subjects he must reinforce the official doctrine by means of institutions that mimic the processes of proper reasoning; he must create the illusion that the official doctrine is supported by the best reasons (p. 123).

(Talisse omits to mention that Aristotle was arguably the first to take note of such tyrannical stratagems in Book V of his Politics.)

Talisse also argues that a folk-epistemological defense of democracy entails a defense of equality: we are all equally entitled to state our beliefs and to defend them with reasons and arguments. This defense, moreover, has no necessary recourse to morality — e.g., the (moral) principle of equal respect or the moral equality of persons — but is "fully epistemic" (p. 124).

All this leads Talisse to a conception of “dialogical democracy” in which citizens practice “the politics of engagement,” and “the problem of deep politics” is resolved or perhaps dissolved. Insofar as we are rational believers (i.e., we have reasons for having the beliefs we have) and reason-givers we must perforce be committed to democracy, despite our deep and persisting moral differences and disagreements. In short, in defending democracy, epistemology trumps morality.

Talisse’s brief book is a minor masterpiece of concise argumentation in which he advances a genuinely novel defense of democracy. That said, a number of objections and unanswered questions remain. For one, factual considerations. There never was the kind of seamless democratic “consensus” that some scholars claimed to detect and thus there was no irreparable “breakdown” that began in the 1960s. Talisse accepts without argument (or adequate evidence) the oft-touted claim that we are living in an era of “deep politics” in which moral differences estrange us from our fellow citizens. His primary evidence for this consists of books by Ann Coulter, talk-radio hosts, and others who have a vested interest in fueling at least the simulacrum of deep and irresolvable moral conflict. Meanwhile, in the real world of American politics, Morris Fiorina and others have shown that most Americans actually agree about much more than they disagree about.5 And, as often as not, even where we disagree, our disagreements are not moral disagreements. Take abortion, for example. Opponents on both sides of that fraught question agree that human life is invaluable and should be protected; but they disagree about what counts as a human life and when that life begins. These look more like definitional disagreements than moral ones tout court.

These rather minor reservations aside, one must marvel at the powerful punch packed by Talisse’s brief book.


1 See the essays collected in Charles F. Cnudde and Deane E. Neubauer, eds., Empirical Democratic Theory (Markham, 1969).

2 Daniel J. Boorstin, The Genius of American Politics (University of Chicago, 1953); Louis Hartz, The Liberal Tradition in America (Harcourt, Brace, 1955); Daniel Bell, The End of Ideology (Free Press, 1960).

3 Jurgen Habermas, “Warheitstheorien,” in Wirklichkeit und Reflexion (Neske, 1973).

4 Thomas Hobbes, Leviathan (1651), “Introduction.”

5 See Morris P. Fiorina et al., Culture War? The Myth of a Polarized America, 2nd ed. (Longman, 2006); a third edition (forthcoming) provides further evidence for Fiorina’s earlier findings.