2010.10.17

Vera Hoffmann-Kolss

The Metaphysics of Extrinsic Properties

Vera Hoffmann-Kolss, The Metaphysics of Extrinsic Properties, Ontos, 2010, 222pp., $131.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868380774.

Reviewed by Ralf M. Bader, New York University


The Metaphysics of Extrinsic Properties is an attempt to provide a comprehensive account of the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties, as well as to examine the role that extrinsic properties can play in discussions concerning supervenience and dispositions.

Intrinsic/Extrinsic

Part I focuses on the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties. After a brief discussion of her background assumptions regarding the metaphysics of properties and individuals (properties are sets of possibilia; n-ary relations are n-tuples of possibilia; individuals are world-bound; necessary and impossible properties are ignored), Hoffmann-Kolss provides a detailed and helpful account of the debate regarding intrinsic/extrinsic properties, ranging from Kim's early analysis to Denby's recent combinatorial account. She rejects modal and combinatorial accounts on the basis that they need to appeal to naturalness and that they are unable to deal with disjunctive properties. She then focuses on relational accounts, which she considers to be inadequate since they appeal to a notion of 'consists in', which she considers to be as problematic as appealing to naturalness. To avoid these problems, Hoffmann-Kolss proposes her own modified relational account (p. 96), according to which:

A property P is extrinsic iff there is a relation R, such that at least one of the conditions (i) and (ii) is satisfied:

(i) (a) For all actual or possible individuals x, x has P iff there is an individual y inhabiting the same possible world as x, such that x stands in R to y, and

(b) there is an actual or possible individual having P which does not stand in R to itself, nor to any of its proper parts, and

(c) there are two individuals z1 and z2 which both inhabit some possible world w and instantiate P and an individual y also inhabiting w, such that z1 stands in R to y, whereas z2 does not.

(ii) Same condition as (i) with 'P' replaced by '¬P'.

Otherwise, P is intrinsic.

This account is meant to be able to deal with all the troublesome properties that have plagued other attempts at characterising the distinction between intrinsic and extrinsic properties, such as disjunctive properties, quantificational properties and border-sensitive properties (importantly, Hoffmann-Kolss sets aside non-qualitative properties as well as necessary and impossible properties).

If P is the property of being accompanied by the tallest object and Rxy is the relation that holds between x and y iff x is accompanied by y and y is the tallest object, then the biconditional to the effect that x has P iff there is an individual y inhabiting the same possible world as x, such that x stands in R to y holds. Yet, condition (c) will be neither satisfied in the case of P nor in the case of ¬P. Since there is only one tallest object in each world, it is not possible for there to be two objects having P, such that one is R-related to the tallest object while the other is not. Similarly, it is not possible for there to be two objects having ¬P since having this property requires a thing to be either lonely or to be the tallest object, neither of which can be true of two objects in the same world.

Thus, the property of being accompanied by the tallest object fails both conditions of the analysis if R is understood in this way. This strongly suggests that this extrinsic property is mistakenly classified as being intrinsic by the account proposed by Hoffmann-Kolss. It is important to note that in order to conclusively establish that a property is (mis)classified as intrinsic by this account, one needs to show that there is no relation R that satisfies conditions (i) or (ii). While we have not shown that there cannot be such a relation, we have at least cast serious doubt on this possibility. In particular, we have identified a property that is such that condition (ii) will not be satisfied, independently of which R is picked, since ¬P cannot be had by two objects in the same world, thereby ensuring that condition (ii-c) will not be met. Moreover, as regards condition (i), the relation R that we have considered seems to be the most plausible candidate for yielding the biconditional of condition (i-a) and for providing us with insight into whether or not P is intrinsic. Accordingly, it seems reasonable to conclude that the relational account of the intrinsic/extrinsic distinction devised by Hoffmann-Kolss misclassifies extrinsic properties such as the property of being accompanied by the tallest object as being intrinsic.

Qualitative/Non-Qualitative

Hoffmann-Kolss also attempts to provide a relational criterion for characterising non-qualitative properties (p. 106):

A property P is haecceistic iff there is a relation R such that the following two conditions are satisfied:

(i) There is an actual or possible individual y, such that for all actual or possible individuals x, x instantiates P iff x stands in R to y.

(ii) There is an actual or possible individual z having the existential derivative of R, but not having P (i.e., ∃z(∃z1 Rzz1 ∧ ¬Pz); here, z and z1 may, but need not inhabit the same possible world).

Otherwise, P is qualitative.

If P is the property of being red and R is the is the same colour as relation, then there exists a y, namely a red thing, such that any x is red iff x stands in the is the same colour as relation to y. Accordingly, condition (i) will be satisfied. It will also be the case that there is an actual or possible individual z, for instance a blue thing, that has the existential derivative of R, i.e. has the monadic relational property of bearing the is-the-same-colour-as relation to something, and that is not P, i.e. not red. Accordingly, condition (ii) will be satisfied as well. Yet, the property of being red is surely a qualitative property and is thus misclassified by the proposed account.

It should also be noted that this criterion is unable to deal with disjunctive haecceistic properties, such as the property of being identical to X or being identical to Y since there is no y that is such that any x that has P is R-related to y. Instead, it will be the case that there is a y1 and a y2 such that any x that has P is either R-related to y1 or R-related to y2. This suggests a modification of criterion (i) that would specify that there is a disjunction of actual or possible individuals y1 … yn, such that if x is P then x stands in R to y1 or … yn. Yet, this will not do either since problems arise when dealing with disjunctive properties that have qualitative as well as non-qualitative disjuncts, such as the property of being red or identical to X. Specifying conditions to adequately classify such mixed properties will require more work.

Supervenience

Most of Part II is concerned with supervenience. Hoffmann-Kolss provides a helpful discussion of the standard notions of supervenience. She then argues that traditional accounts are problematic when it comes to dealing with extrinsic properties since they are subject to the irrelevant features problem. This is the problem that if there is no restriction on extrinsic B-properties, then it is compatible with supervenience that there are objects that differ in terms of A-properties even though the only reason why they are B-discernible is that they differ with respect to extrinsic B-properties that intuitively seem to be entirely irrelevant to the possession of the A-properties in question. She discusses the solution proposed by Paull and Sider, which consists in filtering out the extrinsic B-properties that are taken to be irrelevant by examining isolated duplicates of regions of possible worlds in order to see whether these duplicates differ in terms of A-properties. Hoffmann-Kolss rejects this solution on the basis that there is no guarantee that the isolated duplicates will be found in physically possible worlds, thereby giving rise to problems when making supervenience claims about physicalism.

In response to these perceived problems, she develops a notion of property-dependent supervenience, according to which (p. 182):

A-properties supervene on B-properties in a property-dependent way iff for all A-properties PA and all individuals x: if x has PA, then there is an intrinsic B-property PB, such that x has PB and for all y: if there is a PA-dependent isomorphism between the possible worlds inhabited by x and y relative to x and y and if y has PB, then y also has PA.

As Hoffmann-Kolss notes, this account is problematic in that it only deals with positive extrinsic properties, i.e., those that depend on the existence of other objects and not those that depend on their absence (cf. p. 177, fn 48), and thus at best constitutes a partial solution to the irrelevant features problem.

Moreover, this account ignores the much more straightforward solution to simply consider restricted base expansions. The problem of irrelevant features arises in the first place in cases in which a maximal base expansion is at issue, i.e., an expansion involving extrinsic base-properties that provide a complete B-description of the entire possible world. Once more restricted base expansions are considered, irrelevant features can be filtered out. Thus, if one wants to say that A-properties supervene on B-properties (whereby the set of A-properties includes extrinsic properties), one can avoid the irrelevant features problem by using the minimal base expansion that ensures that B-indiscernibility gives rise to A-indiscernibility. In this way one can identify the set of relevant extrinsic B-properties.

Overall Assessment

Hoffmann-Kolss provides useful descriptions of discussions regarding intrinsicality and supervenience, as well as interesting criticisms of a number of extant proposals, yet most of the analyses that she herself puts forward suffer from serious defects. Those wanting to get a good overview of the state of play will find the book helpful. Those looking for promising new analyses and solutions are recommended to look elsewhere.