2010.10.19

Ralph D. Ellis, Natika Newton

How the Mind Uses the Brain (to Move the Body and Image the Universe)

Ralph D. Ellis and Natika Newton, How the Mind Uses the Brain (to Move the Body and Image the Universe), Open Court, 2010, 267pp, $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780812696639.

Reviewed by Robert Hanna, University of Colorado at Boulder


I

Ralph Ellis and Natika Newton's How the Mind Uses the Brain is an exciting study in contemporary philosophy of mind. The Introduction clearly states their book's main thesis, which is that the conscious, intentional mind is essentially active, alive (in the precise sense that it is a self-organizing complex thermodynamic system), emotive, and embodied, and that, correspondingly,

The purpose of this book is to develop and defend a coherent action-centered and self-organizational theory of consciousness and intentionality that emphasizes emotionally motivated action imagery, and to show how such an account can resolve the many facets of the mind-body problem. (p. viii)

Here is an outline of their argument for that thesis. Chapter 1 critically addresses the now-familiar "hard problem" of consciousness. Chapter 2 sketches a theory of intentional action based on a distinction between action and reaction. Chapter 3 provides a theory of mental representation based on the notion of imagery. Chapter 4 extends the action theory of chapter 2 from the macrophysical level to the microphysical level. Chapter 5 presents a solution to the only slightly less familiar "amazingly hard problem" of mental causation. Chapter 6 works out a phenomenological analysis of consciousness. Chapter 7 connects this analysis of consciousness to the concept of action. Chapter 8 returns to the notion of imagery and relates it to introspection. Chapter 9 discusses the role of efferent processes in the brain in the production of imagery. Finally, chapter 10 ties the earlier chapters together by means of a general discussion of how it might be possible to close the "explanatory gap" between physiology and phenomenology and then "end[s] on a hopeful note, suggesting that the theoretical framework offered by the understanding of emotionally motivated self-organizing processes can bring mind and body back together again." (p. xxx)

II

How the Mind Uses the Brain fully belongs to what I will call the "non-Classical" or Radical tradition in the philosophy of mind, which runs from Aristotle's De Anima, Pascal, Spinoza, Kant, and the 19th century post-Kantian idealistic tradition forward to Bergson, Whitehead, Wittgenstein (both early and late), Husserl, Heidegger, Merleau-Ponty, Brian O'Shaughnessy, J.J. Gibson, Francisco Varela, Andy Clark, Alva Noë, and Evan Thompson. This tradition is either Idealist/Panpsychist or Dual-Aspect Monist, and strongly oriented towards first-order or pre-reflective consciousness (i.e., subjective experience), intentionality (i.e., the attentiveness and directedness of conscious mind to acts, objects, other minds, or itself), affect and emotion, sense perception, intentional action, rational intuition in mathematics and logic, organismic biology, complex systems dynamics, and (perhaps above all) animal embodiment. More precisely, according to contemporary versions of Radical philosophy of mind, we are nothing more and nothing less than minded animals -- i.e., essentially embodied, conscious, intentional, caring, self-organizing complex thermodynamic systems in a fully natural but also inherently non-mechanical world.

By sharp contrast, what I will call the "Classical" or Orthodox tradition in the philosophy of mind runs from Plato's Phaedo, Descartes, and Hobbes all the way forward to Russell, Carnap, J.J.C. Smart, David Armstrong, Saul Kripke, Jerry Fodor, David Chalmers, Frank Jackson, and Jaegwon Kim. This tradition is either Dualist or Physicalist, and strongly oriented towards qualia, self-consciousness, thinking, deductive reasoning, mechanism, causal-role or computational functionalism, and the brain. More precisely, according to contemporary versions of Orthodox philosophy of mind, we are fundamentally qualia-instantiating, self-conscious, thinking, and deductively reasoning beings somehow also attached to a fundamentally physical body at the brain (Dualism), or else we are fundamentally physical beings endowed with brain-processes that constitute or implement the functional information-processing operations of self-consciousness, thinking, and reasoning, and somehow also instantiate qualia (Physicalism). The basic aim of Orthodox philosophy of mind is therefore to explain the existence, specific character, and causal efficacy of the qualia-instantiating, self-conscious, thinking, deductively reasoning mind in a fundamentally physical world.

But as it turns out, Orthodox philosophy of mind is a tragic failure. On the one hand, Dualism is a Super-Naturalism that makes the mind into something that mysteriously exists "over and above" the spatiotemporal physical world and has no causal powers of its own, except perhaps for some equally mysterious overdetermining causal powers which cannot explain how it ever causally pairs this mind with that physical effect, whether by mutually isolating the mental and the physical as either

(i) essentially separate substances (Substance Dualism)

or

(ii) essentially separate properties instantiated in physical substances (Property Dualism without Substance Dualism).

But on the other hand, Physicalism either

(iii) reduces the mind to something that is in itself fundamentally physical or "nothing over and above the physical," whether by downward type-type identity or by upward logical supervenience (Reductive Physicalism),

or else it

(iv) refuses reduction, so that the mental is again "something over and above the physical," but still makes the mind downwardly token-token identical with and upwards nomologically supervenient on the fundamentally physical world for its existence, specific character, and causal powers in a way that not only metaphysically mimics the weaker forms of Dualism but is also afflicted by the same basic metaphysical mysteries as all forms of Dualism (Non-Reductive Physicalism).

At this point Eliminative Physicalism -- the thesis that the very idea of the mental is hopelessly confused and should be purged in favor of the physical, which at least we (supposedly) understand correctly via the natural sciences -- can begin to seem attractive. But that is like destroying a village in order to "save" it.

Here, then, is my working taxonomy of basic metaphysical positions in the philosophy of mind, with Ellis and Newton's book falling within the third division and not within the other two divisions:

(1) Orthodox philosophy of mind

(1A) Dualism or Super-Naturalism (= the two-way essential independence of the mental and the physical)

(1Ai) Substance Dualism

(1Aii) Property Dualism without Substance Dualism

(1B) Physicalism (= the one-way necessary dependence of the mental on the physical):

(1Bi) Reductive Physicalism

(1Bia) Downward Type-Type Identity

(1Bib) Upward Logical Supervenience without Type-Type Identity

(1Bii) Non-Reductive Physicalism

(1Biia) Downward Token-Token Identity without Upward Nomological Supervenience

(1Biib) Upward Nomological Supervenience with Downward Token-Token Identity

(2) Eliminative Physicalism (= the denial of the existence of the mental and the corresponding affirmation of the exclusive existence of the physical)

(3) Radical philosophy of mind

(3A) Idealism or Panpsychism (= the one way necessary dependence of the physical on the mental)

(3B) Dual-Aspect Monism or Liberal Naturalism (the two-way essential interdependence of the mental and the physical)

Placed in this context, the basic aim of How the Mind Uses the Brain is to develop and defend a theory of consciousness and intentionality specifically within the (3B) tradition of Dual-Aspect Monism or Liberal Naturalism, which is therefore explicitly oriented towards the central Radical-philosophy-of-mind themes of first-order consciousness, intentionality, affect and emotion, sense perception, intentional action, organicism, complex systems dynamics, and above all animal embodiment. More precisely, then, the basic aim of How the Mind Uses the Brain is to develop and defend a Radical philosophy of mind that either avoids or adequately solves all the central problems of Orthodox contemporary philosophy of mind, while at the same time taking our best contemporary formal and natural sciences very seriously indeed. I am deeply sympathetic to this way of doing the philosophy of mind, and therefore I am also deeply sympathetic to the basic aim of this book.

III

In my opinion, there are at least three basic conditions of adequacy on a correct philosophy of mind:

(1) It must explain the mind-body relation: It must provide a metaphysics of the mind-body relation that avoids both Dualism and Physicalism.

(2) It must explain mental causation: It must provide a theory of mental causation that solves Kim's Causal Exclusion Problem.

(3) It must explain consciousness: It must provide a theory of consciousness that conforms equally to phenomenology and to cognitive neuroscience.

I will now critically consider some of the most important details of How the Mind Uses the Brain along these three dimensions.

III.1: The mind-body relation

As we have seen above, Dualism says that the mind and the body are necessarily mutually separated from one another, either as essentially different substances or else merely as essentially different properties in a fundamentally physical world. Physicalism, by contrast, says that the mind is either fully reducible to (via logical supervenience or type-type identity) or else irreducible but still strictly dependent on the body (via nomological supervenience or token-token identity). By sharp contrast, what Ellis and Newton hold is that the mind is thoroughly natural but also inherently non-mechanical, purposive, and intentionally active because it is nothing more and nothing less than the ontologically emergent -- i.e., not merely epistemically emergent, and also causally efficacious -- asymmetric spatiotemporal form of a certain special class of self-organizing complex thermodynamic systems, namely living organisms with wholly embodied vital and neural systems that express various goal-directed activities spontaneously and endogenously driven by proto-conscious and conscious desires and emotions. In short, conscious, intentional mind is nothing more and nothing less than a special complex form of life -- the sentient (and sometimes also sapient) inner and outer life of animals:

In this book, our goal can be represented … rather simply: we aim at an organic account of consciousness, one that emphasizes its continuity with other activities of a living entity. (p. 69)

Living organisms must be distinguished from "merely mechanical" systems that process information and emerge in feedback loops -- such as thermostats -- and also from systems that are self-organizing and do appropriate their own needed substratum, such as mineral crystals, yet are not living.

Self-organizing systems must be distinguished from systems that do show a tendency to maintain themselves across multiply-realizable replacements of their parts, yet obviously result from causal operations on them and merely react rather than act, remaining purely externally regulated rather than self-organizing -- for example, a sophisticated robot that has been designed to replace its own parts when they quit working.

Emotion must be distinguished from a completely mechanical and non-conscious process in which things "want" outcomes only in the sense that they exhibit a tendency to behave in certain ways -- for example, atoms "want" to achieve electrical neutrality by filling or emptying their outer electron shells, and this atomic "wanting" fits together with others to form nervous systems that "want" to reach electrolytic balance, and so on; yet there seems to be a difference between mere "wanting" in this sense, of which atoms are capable, and emotions which are capable of being consciously felt in the way that humans when awake or dreaming can consciously feel them. We want ultimately to show, however, how the latter develops from the former [emphasis added].

Purposeful intentions must be distinguished from mere tendencies, which of course all natural phenomena, even the simplest, exhibit, and which are merely descriptive of the principles of physics and inorganic chemistry. If living self-organizing processes are really to be distinguished from nonliving ones, we must understand how the overall process can be purpose-directed in a way that is compatible with linear causality, yet whose explanation is not completely exhausted by principles of linear causality applied at the micro-level of analysis [emphasis added]. (pp. 87-88)

This Radical way of thinking about mentality, organismic biology, and their relationship is sharply different from mainstream Orthodox-driven accounts and therefore requires some further elaboration. The concept of teleology is importantly ambiguous as between

(i) intentionality: goal-directedness, purposiveness, or self-organization -- the local functions and operations of the proper parts of a complex dynamic system subserve the global functions and operations of the whole system,

and

(ii) intelligent design: planning, purposefulness, formal causation, or final causation -- a structure or end is imposed on a set of material elements which otherwise lacks this structure or end.

In conformity with this distinction, it is possible to hold two very different and logically independent metaphysical theses about universal teleology, namely, either

(iii) universal teleology-as-intentionality: the natural world as a whole necessarily includes goal directed, purposive, or self-organizing systems,

or else

(iv) universal teleology-as-intelligent-design: the natural world as a whole necessarily requires planning, purposefulness, formal causes, or final causes.

Since the two theses are logically independent, obviously it is possible to hold one while rejecting the other. Indeed the Radical philosophy of mind explicitly affirms (iii) and denies (iv). Universal teleology-as-intentionality is smoothly compatible with complex systems dynamics and Dual-Aspect Monism or Liberal Naturalism, whereas universal teleology-as-intelligent-design is thoroughly Super-Naturalistic, Dualistic, and sharply incompatible with the formal and natural sciences. According, then, to the universal teleology-as-intentionality picture defended by Ellis and Newton and other contemporary Radical philosophers of mind, parts of the natural world are indeed inherently mechanical -- i.e., they are Turing-computable facts and processes -- but not all of the natural world is inherently mechanical in this sense. The non-mechanical natural world includes all Turing-incomputable facts and processes, especially the complex self-organizing thermodynamic facts and processes constituting organismic conscious, intentional, caring animal life, but also

(i) formal facts about provable yet also undecidable necessary truths in classical first- or second-order logic,

(ii) formal facts about logically unprovable and also undecidable necessary truths in Peano arithmetic and all the parts of mathematics that presuppose the axioms of Peano arithmetic,

and

(iii) formal facts about logically unprovable and also undecidable necessary truths in axiomatic non-linear geometry and topology.

Moreover, and perhaps most importantly of all, even those parts of the natural world that are inherently mechanical nevertheless presuppose the necessary possibility of inherently non-mechanical facts and processes. What I mean is that necessarily, if Turing-computable facts and processes actually exist in the spacetime world (which of course they do), then possibly living organismic sentient and sapient animal systems also exist, along with the correct Turing-incomputable mathematical descriptions of their dynamical careers. The basic idea here is that Newtonian physics and the Turing-computable linear mathematics of mechanism are essentially proper sub-structural parts within a larger holistic physical and mathematical structure that is globally non-mechanical, Turing-incomputable, teleological in the sense of teleology-as-intentionality, and includes diachronically emergent biological and mental processes and facts.

In general terms, this approach to the mind-body relation seems to me to be entirely correct. But unfortunately there are at least three very natural, yet also excruciatingly difficult, follow-up questions that still need to be answered:

(i) Precisely what kind of properties or facts are mental properties or facts according to this Radical theory?

(ii) What is the specific difference between (iia) causal-mechanical processes that are neither living nor mental, and (iib) causal-purposive processes that are living or mental according to this Radical theory?

(iii) What is the specific modal character of the relation between (iiia) causal-mechanical processes that are neither living nor mental, and (iiib) causal-purposive processes that are living or mental according to this Radical theory?

Correspondingly, the threefold problem is this. If mental properties or facts are really just fundamental physical properties or facts, if the specific difference between non-living or non-mental causal-mechanical processes on the one hand, and living or mental causal-purposive processes on the other hand, is only just a Turing-computable function in the essentially richer mathematics of complex dynamical systems; and if the specific modal character of the relation between non-living or non-mental causal-mechanical processes on the one hand and living or mental causal-purposive processes on the other hand is either

(a) an asymmetric or "upwards" logical entailment according to what Chalmers, Jackson, and others (following and refining Kripke's modal metaphysics) call "the primary (or a priori) intension,"

or

(b) an asymmetric or "upwards" logical entailment according to what Chalmers, Jackson, and others (again following and refining Kripke's modal metaphysics) call "the secondary (or a posteriori) intension,"

then the mind-body relation is one of logical supervenience, and thus one of physicalistic reduction. So it seems that Ellis and Newton's Radical theory would ultimately collapse into Reductive Physicalism. Unfortunately, this logical supervenience doctrine is strongly suggested by at least one of their formulations:

Our goal, then, is to explain why certain physical features, when combined in a particular way, will inevitably entail the familiar experience of consciousness. The entailment here will be an inductive entailment between physical events and phenomenological experiences, not a deductive inference from the physical events to the experiences. To put it another way, the equivalence between its separable components is "extensional" rather than "intentional." That is, the meaning of the terms "Clark Kent" and "Superman" is not equivalent, yet the two are "extensionally" equivalent in that, as a matter of fact, they are the same. To use a different example, the Morning Star and the Evening Star are extensionally equivalent, because they happen to be the same object; but they are not intentionally equivalent, because "Morning Star" does not mean the same as "Evening Star." So the equivalence of the Morning Star and the Evening Star is not something to be logically deduced, but rather something to be discovered empirically, just as someone might discover empirically that Kent is Superman. A sweeping explanation that would allow consciousness to be deduced from physical observations would require them to be intentionally equivalent, but that kind of equivalence is not called for in philosophy of mind. What is called for at most is only an extensional equivalence. (pp. 140-141)

Since "extensional equivalence" in this context is none other than the type-type identity of mental properties with corresponding physical properties, then this appears to be a statement of the second logical supervenience thesis, according to which the mental logically supervenes on the physical according to the secondary or a posteriori intension. But that would be sharply incompatible with the overall thrust of the Radical philosophy of mind.

So I do think that Ellis and Newton are in need of some metaphysical help here. My own view, for what is worth, is that the correct answers to the three excruciatingly difficult follow-up questions are these:

(i*) Mental properties or facts are nothing more and nothing less than egocentrically-centered, or essentially indexical, intrinsic structural orientable spatiotemporal properties in self-organizing complex thermodynamic neurobiological systems. This fleshes out, in Radical metaphysical terms, Thomas Nagel's deep thought that to be conscious is "to have a point of view."

(ii*) The specific difference between (iia) causal-mechanical processes that are neither living nor mental, and (iib) causal-purposive processes that are living or mental is that the former are Turing-computable whereas the latter are Turing-incomputable, even though the latter processes still have a true formal description in the essentially richer non-linear mathematics of complex thermodynamic systems.

(iii*) The specific modal character of the relation the relation between (iiia) causal-mechanical processes that are neither living nor mental, and (iiib) causal-purposive processes that are living or mental is reciprocal or "two-way" synthetic a priori entailment via property-fusion (i.e., one natural substance with a dual mental-physical essence), and not asymmetric or "upwards" a priori or a posteriori logical entailment.

As regards the third issue, in parentheses immediately following the passage I just quoted about extensional equivalence, Ellis and Newton say: "(or even more modestly, a sense in which mind and its physical substrate are ontologically inseparable in some strong sense … )" (p. 141). And then later in the book they also explicitly say: "we do at least agree with the vast majority of neuroscientists that [a conscious state] C and [a corresponding physical process] P are at least ontologically inseparable in some strong way" (p. 212), but they also explicitly reject the idea that "P deductively entails C" (p. 213). So at least on the face of it, given these qualifying remarks, nothing they say contradicts my (iii*). Therefore it seems to me quite possible that my proposal to the effect that the "ontological inseparability" of C and P is in fact a two-way synthetic a priori relation of dual essence could be accepted by them as an entirely friendly addition to their theory of the mind-body relation.

III.2: Mental causation

The contemporary problem of mental causation, as crisply formulated by Kim, is this: How is it possible to account for the causal relevance and causal efficacy of the conscious, intentional mind in a causally-closed physical world? If the mind is "something over and above the physical," as in Dualism or Non-Reductive Physicalism, then since by hypothesis physical processes are already causally efficacious and closed, then the mental is either causally superfluous (non-standard overdetermination) or inert (epiphenomenalism). This is Kim's Causal Exclusion Problem. But if the mind is "nothing over and above the physical," as in Reductive Physicalism, then although the mental is indeed causally efficacious, its efficacy does not flow from either consciousness or intentionality, as such, but rather only from fundamentally physical processes. That in turn is physical causation, not mental causation. So mental causation has been "saved" by simply destroying it -- by turning it into something else, namely fundamentally physical causation. That is not a real solution to the problem of mental causation -- it is just the de facto elimination of the mental.

According to Ellis and Newton, the real solution to the problem of mental causation, in a nutshell, is this:

(i) Conscious, intentional mental processes, as such, are self-organizing biological processes.

(ii) Self-organizing biological processes are inherently non-mechanical, causally relevant, and causally efficacious natural processes.

(iii) Therefore conscious, intentional mental processes, as such, are inherently non-mechanical, causally relevant, and causally efficacious natural processes.

More explicitly, however, their route to this conclusion goes via the theory of emergent "top-down" self-organizing dynamical causation in systems that integrally contain both micro-level constituents and events and also macro-level constituents and events:

"Self-organization" refers to the ability of some "open" thermodynamic systems -- that is, those which exchange energy and materials with their environment across organizational stability -- to maintain their existence and function by means of external mechanisms, not by external control. An example of external control would be a living body on "life-support," with vital functions maintained by external invasive technology. Without that intervention, the functions would cease. In contrast, living and healthy biological systems are self-organizing: in many of their systems and at many organizational levels, if one component fails to perform its vital function adequately, others can often step in and supply the necessary elements. Thus "self-organization" refers to a system's ability to re-organize its components and appropriate new elements as necessary for a continued pattern of functioning … . Self-organizing systems are goal-directed; the primary purpose of self-organization is self-maintenance, ensuring the continuity of the essential functions of the organism (including growth and reproduction), and reserving the integrity of the system against the invasion of its boundaries by external forces and loss of energy to the environment. (p. 72)

If self-organizational processes, which are relational ("R"s), really are to be capable of appropriating their own needed micro-constituents ("P"s) -- and thus genuinely acting rather than only reacting -- then what we need to show is this: there must be some processes (which we will call "self-organizing processes") in which not only is a multiply realizable relation R necessary and sufficient for O [=the Outcome] given the BCs [=the Background Conditions], but also, in those same types of processes, R has the power to arrange the BCs in such a way that, if P1 is not able to subserve R given the BCs, then P2 will be able to subserve R given the BCs. We could picture this situation this way:

R - - - > BCs under which …

R - - ->O

|

|

{P1 or P2 or P3, etc.}

That is, R pre-arranges for the background conditions that would be needed to ensure that, whichever of P1 or P2 or P3 is available, one of them can be used to subserve the relational pattern R that is needed to ensure outcome O. (pp. 93-94)

So the crucial point is that (in the logically possible type of case under consideration, the self-organizing type of case) R is necessary and sufficient for O given all BCs other than those controlled by R itself, whereas no particular P is necessary and sufficient for O given all BCs other than those controlled by R itself. (p. 96)

In this dynamic emergentist picture, and in the special case of mental causation, R is a multiply realizable emergent dynamical structure that is identical with the conscious, intentional mind, as such. This solves Kim's Causal Exclusion Problem by guaranteeing that conscious, intentional mental processes, as such, are amongst the causally relevant, causally efficacious, causally-closed physical processes constitutive of certain forms of biological life -- e.g., human animal life. Conscious, intentional mind is neither "something over and above the physical" nor "nothing over and above the physical" but rather "something already essentially within the physical," namely, a special form of biological life. This brings me to Ellis and Newton's proposed theory of consciousness.

III.3: Consciousness

Consciousness is subjective experience. How can it be adequately explained in a way that is compatible with formal and natural science? Ellis and Newton correctly note that any pure physical explanation of consciousness "seems to leave unresolved certain 'mysteries' of consciousness," which include:

a. The dual location of phenomenal properties "out there" yet "in here" in consciousness.

b. The mysterious "thickness" of the specious present.

c. The feeling of "free agency," that we can voluntarily direct our actions, including the act of conscious attention, while at the same time attention and the emotions that direct it seem responsive to physiological substrates with physical causes. (p. 99)

Correspondingly, they argue that "these paradoxes … can be resolved by relating each of them to three elements of consciousness," namely:

i. Organismically interested anticipation.

ii. Sensory and proprioceptive imagery generated by the interested anticipation rather than by sensory input.

iii. Resonating of these activities with activity stimulated by sensory data, where the interested anticipation precedes the processing of the input. (pp. 99-100)

They then note that

Each of these elements is bridged to physiological processes such that, if they occur in a certain relation to each other, we can understand why they would inevitably be accompanied by the corresponding elements of conscious experience. (p. 100)

How do the details of this highly original theory of consciousness work?

By "organismically interested anticipation," Ellis and Newton mean roughly what Leibniz called appetition and also what later empirical psychologists called conation, namely a state of pre-conscious desire within an organism that is seeking to maintain itself, develop, and survive in a complex world. This means that consciousness is fundamentally affective and emotive and localized in vital systems that not only include the brain but also include the limbic system, the nervous system, and the endocrine system. In short, consciousness is an irreducible fact, but not a simple fact, nor is its nature fundamentally cognitive, although consciousness in this affective-emotive is also necessarily associated with all cognitive mental facts as well.

By "sensory and proprioceptive imagery," Ellis and Newton mean something much broader than visual imagery alone, since for them images can be multi-modal -- auditory imagery, olfactory imagery, tactile imagery, gustatory imagery, proprioceptive imagery, and so-on. But the essence of imagery in their sense is that it is inherently action-related and consists in a spatiotemporally-framed schematic content which guides and structures intentional animal body-movements. At sophisticated levels of animal mental functioning, this content is also conceptual in nature; but at much less sophisticated or more basic levels of animal mental functioning, i.e., in sensorimotor activity, it is thoroughly non-conceptual in nature. Therefore consciousness has its underlying basis in the imagery-based, non-conceptual guidance of desire-driven sensorimotor intentional body-movements in minded animals: "We are arguing, then, that conscious experience is fundamentally this imagined performance of sensorimotor activity, explicitly or implicitly." (p. 137)

Finally, by "Resonating of these activities with activity stimulated by sensory data, where the interested anticipation precedes the processing of the input," Ellis and Newton mean two things. First, resonance is a dynamical notion that consists in the relatively smooth, self-reinforcing, and determinately patterned interaction of different elements in an inherently asymmetric or forward-directed temporal thermodynamic process. Second, to say that conation and desire already precede information processing is to say that the brain and central nervous systems primarily send outgoing or efferent signals to the various parts of the living body, which are then recorded by the brain, and suppressed if necessary, but also guarantee that the minded animal is in a perpetual state of action-readiness, prior to the reception of incoming or afferent signals from the sense organs and external sensory systems.

Putting these three factors together allows Ellis and Newton to offer a unified action-oriented theory of consciousness grounded on the self-organizing organismic generation of imagery-content in the neurobiological dynamics of animals like us:

Conscousness occurs when a self-organizing system represents (imagines) itself as acting towards unactualized possibilities that play a role in terms of organismic desires or aversions. (p. 161)

The complex self-organizing process constitutive of the emotionally motivated efferent processes needed for the subject's phenomenal consciousness are experientially accessible only from the standpoint of the organism that executes them, because conscious experiencing per se entails executing rather than merely observing emotional processes. (p. 212)

In other words, for Ellis and Newton, consciousness is not a separate, intrinsic non-relational fact of any sort -- it is not any sort of quale or sense-datum. On the contrary, for them consciousness is nothing more and nothing less than an essentially relational fact within the larger fact of animal intentional agency. Consciousness is nothing more and nothing less than the biological-indexical relational fact that the minded living organism, just by virtue of being essentially embodied, has an egocentrically-centered point of view on its own desire-driven intentionally active life. In this way, the theory of consciousness has been shown to flow from the theory of self-organizational dynamics in living organisms, together with the theory of imagery-guided (i.e., non-conceptually guided, pre-conscious) intentional agency.

IV

Two further remarks by way of a conclusion. First, it is difficult to overstate how important the Radical philosophy of mind is, given the tragic failure of Orthodox philosophy of mind. Perhaps the most ironic thing about this tragic failure, however, is how contemporary Orthodox philosophers of mind have, at the very same time, also successfully managed to brand the Radical philosophy of mind as "Continental" (read: "Crazy") and "anti-scientific," even despite the fact that the work of contemporary Radical philosophers of mind is every bit as informed by and sensitive to the relevant results of the formal and natural sciences as that of Orthodox philosophers of mind -- and sometimes even more so. This is certainly true of the work of Gibson, Varela, Clark, Noë, Thompson, and also, in an exemplary way, true of Ellis and Newton's book too. Unfortunately, there is not much that can be done about the all-too-successful job of negative branding. But there is a larger and more significant philosophical point which needs to be made.

The Orthodox philosophy of mind simply cannot claim a theoretical monopoly on the basic results of our best contemporary formal and natural sciences. For the total set of truths of our best contemporary formal and natural sciences simply does not entail either Cartesian Rationalism or Quinean/Sellarsian Scientific Naturalism, i.e., this corpus of truths simply does not entail Scientism, according to which, in Sellars's famous slogan, "Science is the measure of all things." Scientism is just a questionable, even if highly mainstream and government-funding approved, philosophical doctrine, not a part of formal or natural science itself. Put otherwise, and now as a word-bite:

Taking science seriously does not entail Scientism, and rejecting Scientism does not entail neglecting science.

Hence the Radical philosophy of mind is not anti-scientific merely because it is anti-Scientistic. Indeed, contemporary Radical philosophy of mind, and How the Mind Uses the Brain in particular, is actually just the contrary. Its Liberal Naturalism is a fully legitimate form of naturalism in the strong sense that no truth of our best contemporary formal or natural sciences is denied by it. It merely refuses the reduction or the elimination of teleology-as-intentionality, conscious mentality, and intentional agency, and on the contrary strongly asserts their inclusion in the spacetime causal-dynamic world as fully natural facts.

Second, as I mentioned above, I am deeply sympathetic to the basic aim of this book. But one minor critical quibble I will just mention, however, is the book's title, which oddly suggests an Orthodox treatise in Substance Dualist Causal Interactionism, whereby an essentially separate disembodied mind somehow enslaves or manipulates the brain by ghostly causal means. It seems to me that a much more accurate and evocative title would have been How the Mind Lives the Body, or How the Mind Activates the Body, or even How the Mind Animates the Body. Leaving aside this minor quibble, however, I do think that Ellis and Newton's How the Mind Uses the Body most certainly should be carefully studied and widely discussed by all contemporary philosophers of mind, whether Orthodox or Radical.