2010.10.24

Charles Taliaferro, Chad Meister (eds.)

The Cambridge Companion to Christian Philosophical Theology

Charles Taliaferro and Chad Meister (eds.), The Cambridge Companion to Christian Philosophical Theology, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 264pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521730372.

Reviewed by Scott A. Davison, Morehead State University


This is a collection of new essays, many by leading philosophers of religion, designed to "exhibit some of the most exciting work being done today in Christian philosophical theology" (p. xiv). The book is divided into two parts. The first part of the collection focuses on the nature of God. The chapters in the section include: 'Trinity,' 'Necessity,' 'Simplicity,' 'Omnipotence, Omniscience, and Omnipresence,' 'Goodness,' and 'Eternity and Providence.' The second part of the collection contains ten essays on God in relation to creation. These chapters include: 'Incarnation,' 'Resurrection,' 'Atonement,' 'Sin and Salvation,' 'The Problem of Evil,' 'Church,' 'Religious Rites,' 'Revelation and Miracles,' 'Prayer,' and 'Heaven and Hell.'

Most of the essays attempt to survey the state of the field with regard to an often discussed question and then provide a short version of a case for the author's preferred position. But the collection also contains a number of interesting essays concerning topics that are well off the beaten path and suggest very interesting directions for further study, including, for example, the essays on church by William J. Abraham and religious rites by Charles Taliaferro. In addition, some essays take new and interesting approaches to understanding a commonplace doctrine. For example, in a discussion of divine omnipresence, William J. Wainwright considers both the Eastern Orthodox conception of the divine energies and the Vishishtadvaita Vedanta's view of the relation between the soul and the body.

The essays are directed at those who have had little exposure either to the contemporary literature in this area or to the tools of contemporary analytic philosophy (although some of the authors utilize a good bit of this apparatus, including Brian Leftow in his essay on divine necessity). The editors state at the outset that although the project of Christian philosophical theology can include attacks upon traditional Christian belief as well as defenses of it, each essay "seeks to demonstrate the consistency and plausibility of the theological claims addressed" and "presents the authors' distinct views and approaches to the material" (p. xiv).

However, this is not always the case. Some chapters present an overview of the field or a description of the history of a question without really developing or advocating any point of view on the question at hand. This is the case with Ronald Feenstra's essay on the Trinity and John Hare's essay on goodness (which concerns goodness in general, not divine goodness in particular, despite its inclusion in the first part of the book). Contrary to what the editors say in the Introduction (p. xiv), the chapters do not include a list of further readings, and some chapters are rather thin on references to the literature. Each chapter contains a list of references cited in the body of the chapter, and there is a selected bibliography at the end of the book (which seems to be a subset of the works cited by the authors in each chapter), but such a list is not likely to be as useful to the novice as a list of further readings at the end of each chapter would have been.

Despite these shortcomings, the collection as a whole provides a helpful introduction to the major issues in Christian philosophical theology and, as mentioned above, includes some essays on topics that are often ignored completely in such collections. In what remains of this review, I will summarize briefly the contents of the essays and make a few remarks about them.

Feenstra contributes the first chapter, on the doctrine of the Trinity, which provides a helpful history of the development of this doctrine among theologians. But the very brief section at the end of the chapter, entitled 'Recent Proposals,' omits completely some of the most interesting and innovative work on the doctrine that has been done by analytic philosophers. In addition, the chapter as a whole does not even make a gesture in the direction of demonstrating the doctrine's consistency or plausibility.

Chapter 2, by Leftow, explores the doctrine of divine necessity. Leftow carefully distinguishes various concepts of necessity, outlines a number of considerations pointing in the direction of the view that God exists necessarily, and responds to objections. In chapter 3, Brian Davies explores the doctrine of divine simplicity in roughly the same way: first he explores the basis of the doctrine in the metaphysics of St. Thomas Aquinas, and then he responds to some of the most prominent objections to this doctrine from the literature. Although Davies' discussion will not convince every opponent of the doctrine of divine simplicity, his presentation is a model of clarity and is probably the best available starting point for those interested in this doctrine.

I mentioned Wainwright's essay, chapter 4, on omnipotence, omniscience, and omnipresence, which is creative and wide ranging. I also mentioned Hare's historical survey of the history of the concept of goodness, chapter 5, which provides a wealth of helpful background information in a short space but does not really defend any particular conception of goodness, human or divine. Chapter 6 contains William Hasker's discussion of eternity and providence, which provides a clear and helpful description of recent debates in this area and an argument or two for his preferred position.

Katherin A. Rogers's essay on the Incarnation, chapter 7, begins the second section of the book, which concerns God in relation to creation. In it, she explains the understanding of the Incarnation developed at the Council of Chalcedon (451 CE), explores the explanation of St. Anselm (1033-1109 CE) for the necessity of the Incarnation, and provides a new analogy for understanding this doctrine based on the relationship between a person playing a video game and the character whom this person controls inside of the game.

In chapter 8, Stephen T. Davis discusses different theories of both the resurrection of Jesus and the general resurrection (i.e., the resurrection of everyone else), including the most common objections to the coherence of this doctrine. Gordon Graham surveys the main theories regarding the mechanism of the atoning death of Jesus in chapter 9, concluding with an intriguing suggestion about how the penal model might overcome the criticism that only the one who does wrong may pay the penalty. In chapter 10, Paul K. Moser discusses sin and salvation, including what many would call the process of sanctification, manifesting (perhaps unavoidably) some particular theological commitments along the way. (I leave the identification of these commitments as an exercise for the interested reader.)

In chapter 11, Chad Meister surveys various problems of evil and their possible resolution by way of defense or theodicy. In chapter 12, Abraham argues that the concept of 'church' is an essentially contested concept. He tries to delineate the proper role of philosophy in advancing theological disputes concerning ecclesiology, which tend to get stuck in epistemological disagreements about authority. Chapter 13 is Taliaferro's fascinating discussion of the structure and value of religious rites, mentioned earlier.

Thomas D. Sullivan and Sandra Menssen discuss the relationship between revelation and miracles in chapter 14, covering a wide range of material in a clear and helpful way. Harriet Harris identifies a number of questions that one might ask about prayer in chapter 15, suggesting possible resolutions to those questions from within the tradition and recommending new directions for further study. The final chapter, chapter 16, is Jerry Walls' discussion of heaven and hell. He focuses mostly on hell since recent philosophical theology pays more attention to it than to heaven.

As I mentioned earlier, the collection not only provides a helpful introduction to the main issues that occupy those working in Christian philosophical theology today, but also covers new ground that suggests fruitful directions for the future. Not every chapter delivers on the editorial promise in the introduction, and a list of further readings that included some of the standard work in each area would have been helpful for those new to this literature, but this remains a valuable and important contribution to Christian philosophical theology.