2010.11.05

Simon Choat

Marx through Post-Structuralism: Lyotard, Derrida, Foucault, Deleuze

Simon Choat, Marx through Post-Structuralism: Lyotard, Derrida, Foucault, Deleuze, Continuum, 2010, 207pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826442758.

Reviewed by Jason Read, University of Southern Maine


To anyone who was educated in the Anglo-American academy during the 1980s and 90s, Simon Choat's Marx through Post-Structuralism might appear at first to be a work of alternative history, like the novels in which the Axis powers won World War II or John Brown's raid on Harper's Ferry was successful. Within the academy, at least for people interested in "theory," those decades were marked by a quarrel between Marxism and post-structuralism, in which each were hostile camps, vying for intellectual hegemony. The accusations on each side were as follows: Marxists were accused of being too wedded to totality, teleology, and economic determinism, while post-structuralists were accused of forgetting history, agency, and replacing politics with the play of language. This conflict has now dissipated as new philosophical perspectives have emerged and the heyday of theory has waned. Choat, however, rewrites this history by reexamining some of the central post-structuralist texts: Lyotard, Derrida, Foucault, and Deleuze. His intention is not to make post-structuralists into crypto-Marxists, or to argue that Marx was a post-structuralist avant la lettre, but to demonstrate that post-structuralism was constituted by an engagement with Marx; a critical engagement, but an engagement nonetheless.

Each chapter takes on a singular itinerary, following each thinker's specific engagement, critique, and (sometimes) avoidance, of Marx. These itineraries follow very different paths: from Lyotard, who began as a critical Marxist intellectual only to move away from Marx, penning the famous line about the end of metanarratives, to Derrida, who avoided Marx during the tumultuous sixties and seventies, only to declare his allegiances rather late, after the fall of the Berlin wall, with Specters of Marx, which situated deconstruction as an heir of Marx. The different paths of these thinkers risk turning the book into a series of essays, different variations on the themes of post-structuralism and Marx.

Choat avoids this by the way in which these specific examinations are organized. Althusser frames the book, introducing and closing the examinations. In the first case, Althusser functions as something of an origin, having been a teacher of Foucault and Derrida and an occasional correspondent with Deleuze. However, Choat is less interested in the intellectual history that would place Althusser at the origins of post-structuralism, than in demonstrating the way in which he is a precursor whose problematic frames much of the encounter between Marx and post-structuralism. This problematic can be summarized by a critique of humanism, historicism, and Hegel. Althusser's works of the 1960s were focused on expunging any remnant of these from Marx's thought, arguing for a break between the young Marx and the older, true Marx who understood "history as a process without subject or goals," to state the formula that comes the closest to encompassing all three critiques.[1] The later post-structuralists share this critique, but shift it from a distinction between the young and old Marx to a critique of all of Marx. Althusser also closes the book, appearing in its final chapters as someone whose posthumously published writings on "aleatory" materialism reveal that he learned from post-structuralism as much as he may have initiated some of its basic orientations. Althusser's presence is meant to suggest that it is less a matter of deciding between Marxism or post-structuralism as it is developing a materialist philosophy.

The fact that all of the thinkers concerned continue the criticism of Hegel, historicism, and humanism is not meant to suggest the fundamental unity of a project. To take historicism as our center piece, and it is this rather than the other two that is in some sense central to Choat's rereading (Hegel is more or less left to the side, making it possible to focus on Marx, and humanism, as we will see, is primarily examined as something intertwined with historicism), it is possible to see how the different philosophers articulate different and even contradictory critiques of historicism. Choat's book is not organized chronologically. Derrida is arguably the last to write on Marx, finishing his book long after most of the other thinkers had completed their different examinations of Marx, but he is examined before the chapters on Foucault or Deleuze. Nor is the book organized according to some simple debate, for or against. The chapters, rather, are grouped according to the thinkers' different levels of intervention with respect to Marx's thought. Lyotard and Derrida critique the general ontology of historicism, the lost origins and return, while Foucault and Deleuze can be understood to be more concerned with power and politics, engaging Marx at the level of the critique of capital rather than of the overarching ontology. It is in the organization of these criticisms that they begin to become something more than just a series of interventions, developing the idea of what Choat will call a new materialism.

Lyotard is perhaps best known as a critic of teleology. He has largely been eclipsed in contemporary discussions and debates, but his remark regarding an "incredulity towards metanarratives" lingers on as a general dismissal of not just Marx's philosophy of history.[2] Choat reminds us that this claim, which appears in The Postmodern Condition, published in the late seventies, is the culmination of a long engagement and disengagement with Marx. This critical disengagement predates The Postmodern Condition, beginning with Libidinal Economy. Despite the fact that this early critique is articulated in a highly original and idiosyncratic manner, written in the form of romantic narrative (a "Desire Named Marx") in which Marx is seeking the proper suitor for the proletariat, it provides the general terms of the poststructural rejection of Marx: the critique of the lost origin and the promised end. "Lyotard undertakes a joint attack on Marx's ontology and teleology, on Marx's reliance on a natural given that will one day be restored" (48). Choat rightly points out that this is incorrect; Marx's concepts of pre-capitalism, the inorganic body, and use value are not some lost origins. Marx was never nostalgic for the past, but he did focus his critique on the present, on capitalism. Choat does not just correct Lyotard, however, but sees in Lyotard's critique, as misguided as it is, a genuine philosophical problem. How is it possible to critique capital, to critique the present, without some nostalgia for the past or a belief in a better day to come? (173) Aside from Lyotard's misreading of Marx, there is an important point: that capital might not have an outside, a loss origin or a promised end, no position from which we could critique it. For Lyotard, capitalism is not the destructive force against our nature: it thoroughly seduces us, capturing our desires. Lyotard's critique of the lost origin and end is coupled with difficulty of finding any perspective in the present from which to critique capitalism.

Choat does not mention Fredric Jameson's often cited remark from his preface to The Postmodern Condition regarding postmodernism as the colonization of nature and the unconscious, "which offered extraterritorial and Archimedian footholds for critical effectivity," an equally well known rejoinder to Lyotard's remark about meta-narratives, nor does he engage with the historical conditions of Lyotard's position.[3] This is because he wants to separate post-structuralism from postmodernism, the philosophical critique from the historical period, distancing himself from some of the most virulent criticisms which made post-structuralism simply the ideology of postmodernity, of some late stage of capitalism in which difference, decentering, and desire are all so much fodder for marketing and merchandising (31). Choat is correct in trying to separate the philosophical positions of post-structuralism from the morass of postmodernism, which is the name of either an artistic movement, a historical period, or a political position -- and often some combination of all three. However, the problem with doing so, with situating Marxism and post-structuralism on the terrain of ideas, is not just that it obscures the context of this shift of positions as to why this shift from the economy to language, subjectivity, and desire. More importantly, it undermines Marxism and post-structuralism as new materialisms, as philosophies for which the interplay of ideas is secondary to the transformation of forces.

As I have stated above, Choat's strength resides in situating these different post-structuralist readings of Marx within and against each other, revealing both the differences within the supposedly monolithic entity called post-structuralism and the complexity of Marx's philosophy. This becomes clear in the differences between Lyotard and Derrida. At first glance much of their criticism takes the same general objects (Marx's ontology), and specifically the idea of some original and natural condition. In Derrida's case this becomes the idea of use value as an original and uncontaminated use, free of the specter of exchange. For Derrida Marx's ontology repeats the problem of any ontology: it tries to do away with the ghost, with that which exceeds the metaphysics of presence, in this case the presence of what can be directly produced and worked. Choat demonstrates that this critique fundamentally misunderstands Marx's strategy, which is not so much about a naturalization of use, but a denaturalization of exchange, of the fetish (82). Rather than dwell on this similarity between Lyotard and Derrida's critiques, their critique of Marx's nostalgia for origins, Choat exposes their difference. Derrida is a critic of Marx's teleology, but he also distances himself from anyone (most directly Althusser) who would purge Marx of any reference to the future. It is a critique of teleology, but also a critique of the critique. Derrida would like to retain an element of messianism, a messianism without a messiah, an open sense of futurity. Thus, in Derrida what remains of Marx is not so much a presence, the critique of political economy and class struggle, but a ghost, a specter. The specter of capital, of exchange, that haunts every use, and the specter of the future which haunts every presence.

Despite the massive chronological gap that separates Lyotard and Derrida's writings on Marx, Choat's "untimely" presentation of their projects, one immediately after the other, serves to illustrate some broad philosophical similarities. While Lyotard and Derrida differ slightly in terms of their critiques of historicism, Lyotard purging any reference to metanarrative and Derrida retaining, under erasure as it were, history in its messianic form, they are similar in terms of their general approach to Marx. The critical focus is on Marx's ontology, on the idea of origins and history. But despite this criticism of ontology, both Lyotard and Derrida want to retain something of Marx's critique of capital. In Lyotard's later work this takes the form of a translation of Marx's fundamental objection to the liberal ideology of the labor contract of an equal exchange between worker and capitalist, a translation into the terms of a "differend," a conflict without common measure of language (58). In Derrida's Specters of Marx the critique of Marx's ontology is coupled with a rather vague critique of the celebratory jubilation of the neoliberal order, of the end of history that accompanied the fall of the Berlin wall, and an enumeration of persistent disorders of the new world order. It is difficult to understand what is being retained of Marx except some sort of leftist good conscience. More to the point, this critique of ontology and retention of political economy, Marx as bad philosophy but good politics (however vaguely), stands in sharp contrast to Foucault and Deleuze. Foucault and Deleuze do not just deal with Marx as a philosopher, with his ontology, but with his critique of political economy, with the understanding of politics, power, and history.

Despite the fact that Foucault and Deleuze can be situated on the same terrain with respect to Marx, which is to say that they are both concerned, in one way or another, with the critique of political economy, they differ profoundly in terms of their engagement with Marx's text. Foucault's texts are overtly critical of Marx, relegating him to the nineteenth century, while famously citing him "without quotation marks" in his analysis of disciplinary power and biopower (101). Deleuze and Guattari, on the other hand, refer to Marx often, albeit idiosyncratically, structuring their understanding of capitalism and schizoanalysis around a reading of Marx that is anything but doctrinaire. This difference of textual engagement, which is mirrored in their general difference of philosophical strategy, belies some fundamental similarities of their approach to Marx. As Choat indicates, this simularity can be broadly characterized as anti-dialectical but materialist, or even an expansion of materialism. The dialectic is eschewed as much for its dualism -- its reduction of all conflict to that between the two classes, workers and capitalists -- and its necessity, as for its teleology. While at the same time materialism, or materiality, is expanded beyond the economy to encompass other relations, other forces. There is an expansion of productivity beyond labor power to the productivity of power (in the case of Foucault), and desire (in the case of Deleuze).

This expansion of productivity, of materiality, liberated from the duality of class has its positive theoretical effects. In Foucault it expands the terms of analysis from the exploitation of labor in the production of surplus value to the production of knowledge, health, and docility (120). In Deleuze it leads to an understanding of the multiplicity of factors (legal, libidinal, and political) constitutive of capitalism, making it the contingent effect of an encounter rather than the outcome of a necessary progression. Where it is limited, however, is in how it understands the conflict in this expanded terrain of productivity, of materiality. As with Choat's presentation of Lyotard and Derrida, the juxtaposition of Foucault and Deleuze illustrates similarities that might be obscured; namely, the tendency to frame conflict around a dehistoricized encounter between power and resistance. This emphasis on bodies and desire as the point of resistance could be called vitalism. However, Choat is less interested in the particular weight of that charge, than with underscoring the common limitation of their perspective. Foucault and Deleuze reject the dialectic because of its overarching dualistic logic, but the concepts that they put in its place repeat the same error. As Choat writes with respect to Deleuze,

Deterritorialization and reterritorialization can be very useful concepts for analyzing present-day capitalism -- but if this basic duality can in some form also be applied to any phenomena whatsoever, then what can they tell us about the specificity of capitalism? (153)

Thus there is, in Choat's view, a fundamental paradox at the heart of Foucault's and Deleuze's projects: their concepts (biopower, discipline, deterritorialization, and desiring production) are incredibly useful for analyzing capital, for augmenting Marx's critical project, even if the conceptual logic presents them in the form of a static, and even ahistorical, opposition between life and the forces that would control it. The situation with Foucault and Deleuze is thus the reverse of the situation with Derrida and Lyotard.

Where does this leave us, then? What final conclusions can be drawn from this encounter between post-structuralism and Marxism? For Choat it is not a matter of affirming either Marx or post-structuralism as victor, but of defining a new materialism. Choat defines this materialism as "not a philosophical reflection on matter, but a political intervention aware of its own material conditions and potential consequences" (172). This materialism is produced through the intersection of Marx and post-structuralism, combining the critique of ontology and teleology with a focus on the concrete analysis of the specific situation, the conflict of forces and desires. As such Choat offers a remarkable revision of the established history, demonstrating how much more productive an encounter between Marxism and post-structuralism would have been to the old debates and divisions. However, the separation of intellectual history from the history of forces and conflicts not only betrays this new materialism, but it also closes off some important ways of understanding this encounter, situating the turn to language and subjectivity within the larger transformations of capital. Choat, however, has cleared the dust of the old debates, letting "the dead bury the dead," producing an intellectual history of the present that will hopefully make it possible to move beyond intellectual history, to grasp the present in terms of its forces and conflicts.


[1] Louis Althusser, Essays in Self-Criticism, translated by Graham Lock (London: New Left Books, 1976) p. 94.

[2] Jean-Francois Lyotard, The Postmodern Condition: A Report on Knowledge, translated by Geoff Bennington and Brian Massumi (Minneapolis: Minnesota, 1984) p. xxiv.

[3] Fredric Jameson, "Introduction," to The Postmodern Condition: A Report on Knowledge, (Minneapolis: Minnesota, 1984) p. xiv.