This volume makes available for the first time fine English translations of fourteen articles on a variety of themes in Kant's moral and legal philosophy. Ten of the articles are taken from German-language cooperative commentaries on the Groundwork, Critique of Practical Reason, Doctrine of Right, and Toward Perpetual Peace that Otfried Höffe has edited during the past two decades. Those contributions are commentaries of the kind that address a handful of larger themes from a chapter or section of Kant, rather than the more painstaking, paragraph-by-paragraph variety. Aside from that common etiology and the goal of exposing good German-language work to a larger readership, there is no unifying substantive theme to this collection, which is narrower than its broad title would indicate. So this is not a volume that anyone except a reviewer would be likely to read cover to cover in one go. That's fine. Taken for what it is, this volume is a welcome addition to the English-language Kant literature.
Four of the essays (those by Dieter Henrich, Dieter Schönecker, Michael Albrecht, and Eckart Förster) will sometimes be recommended to my undergraduates, who would have been unable to read the originals. And there are other essays that will benefit more advanced students of Kant who do not yet have facility in German. This is not to say that I approve of all of the choices. Three of the essays are uneven or worse. I think that readers are also likely to be somewhat disappointed by the editors' Introduction. Most of its article summaries are at least moderately helpful. Yet too little effort is made to place these articles, many of which are on formidably technical issues, in the context of current research on that topic. Moreover, the Introduction seems to be burdened by the fiction that Kant scholars who know little or nothing about German-language scholarship could get a serviceable overview of that large world here. That is not a recommended use of this volume. But, again, this is not to say that it won't be useful in other ways.
The first article is Henrich's classic "Hutcheson and Kant," which unlike many of Henrich's other important shorter works had remained untranslated until this volume. It is a rich and subtle essay, well worth reading more than fifty years after its original publication. Henrich's thesis is that Hutcheson played the role of a Hume for Kant's practical project by "pos[ing] the question concerning the essence of moral consciousness with such clarity that he effectively revealed the very inadequacy of his own solution" (57). Henrich suggests, more specifically, that Hutcheson helped Kant to see the categorical nature of obligation (48) and the hopelessness of rationalist and empiricist solutions (42ff). He takes Kant's allusions to Hutcheson in the early Prize Essay (1764) to signal his recognition that Hutcheson's "particular achievement" was " identifying and defending the essentially internal and original character of morality over against any attempt to derive it from something else" (50). Hutcheson was held back partly by an impoverished conception of reason (46), partly by a conception of moral feeling that makes its "force … [a] purely factical" arrangement by God (38). I find Henrich less specific and helpful when he turns, briefly, to filling out Kant's alternative. For instance, Henrich takes the Second Critique's appeal to the fact of reason to overcome "the merely factical dimension of moral sense" because it grounds morality in an intelligible world (56). The nature of this connection is, however, left obscure.
I am also glad to see a translation of work by Clemens Schwaiger, who has been responsible for some of the most extensive recent research on Wolff and Baumgarten and the question of their respective influences on Kant. The translated article, which originally appeared in Italian, provides a brief survey that is organized around the concept of obligation. Schwaiger has long emphasized aspects of Baumgarten's philosophy that distinguish it from Wolff's -- the traditional tendency has been to view the former as simply parroting Wolff -- and has argued that the Kantian community greatly underestimates Baumgarten's specific influence on Kant. We are first given a summary of Wolff's development from an early positivistic theory of obligation to his mature psychological conception, according to which "obligation consists in motivation" (67). Then Schwaiger lists distinguishing features of Baumgarten's theory that make it more likely to have played a decisive role in influencing Kant: (1) obligation is the single unifying theme of Baumgarten's Initia philosophiae practicae primae (1760), whereas Wolff's parallel investigation is conceived as an investigation of the rules that govern free acts in general, so that it treats obligation as merely one theme among many; (2) Baumgarten introduces the term "necessitation," whereas Wolff had only "necessity"; and (3) Baumgarten -- again, unlike Wolff -- restricts the term "obligation" to cases in which a motivating ground is more powerful than competing impulses (68-71).
It is easy to see why (1)-(3) provide prima facie support for emphasizing Baumgarten and deemphasizing Wolff, though a few words of caution are in order. First, it isn't at all clear from what Schwaiger writes here how philosophically significant Baumgarten's advance over Wolff really is. What is the philosophical import of Baumgarten's decision to orient his study on the concept of obligation? And precisely what insight, if any, was Wolff missing by virtue of not having the term necessitatio at his disposal? Schwaiger gestures at an answer to the latter (70), but more needs to be said. It is also appropriate to caution against taking (1)-(3) alone to demonstrate that it is Baumgarten, rather than Wolff or both of them taken more or less indifferently, that exercised the crucial influence on Kant. In a passage that must be reckoned extremely important because it is central to the Groundwork's attempt to motivate Kant's new a priori approach to grounding morality, Kant diagnoses an error that leaves those who commit it with a "concept of obligation that is anything but moral," but here Kant specifically mentions "the celebrated Wolff's universal practical philosophy" (Gesammelte Schriften, 4:390f). One might argue that Kant mentions Wolff and not Baumgarten in this context ("universal practical philosophy") precisely because of (1). Whether this is correct, it is beyond dispute that Kant takes Baumgarten, and not merely Wolff, to have made the essential errors that he goes on to cite in this Preface-critique. In particular, Baumgarten neither investigates the a priori origin of practical concepts nor "distinguish[es] motives that, as such, are represented completely a priori by reason alone" (4:391). So though Baumgarten may have gotten (1) correct, Kant appears to think that this is of little consequence when one does not make one's investigation an a priori treatment of obligation.
Of course, there are reasons other than (1)-(3) to ascribe more influence to Baumgarten than to Wolff -- for one, that Kant was regularly lecturing on Baumgarten's moral philosophy and writing himself notes about those teaching texts, which is not the case with Wolff. Yet if this were the primary reason that Baumgarten was more important for the development of Kant's moral philosophy, then this fact would be less philosophically interesting than one might initially assume. What is worth stressing is that the question of what Kant regarded as the philosophically significant differences between Wolff and Baumgarten -- a question that obviously cannot be separated from the question of how he conceives of his own project -- is not to be ignored when assessing Schwaiger's important corrective thesis.
The next two articles, by Ludwig Siep and Schönecker, are thematically related to the extent that both authors are concerned with Kant's methodology in the Groundwork, though each examines a different portion of that work. Siep focuses on its Preface and Kant's larger case that morality requires a foundation in a metaphysics of morals (MM). However, the article is not precise in determining Kant's concept of MM. For example, Siep simply assumes that MM is based upon the ontological distinction between natural beings and uncaused causes, and he faults Kant for not being clear about this presupposition. Meanwhile, Siep dismisses signs that Kant somehow uses the difference between 'is' and 'ought' to distinguish between a metaphysics of nature and MM (79-81). This is a missed opportunity. Mightn't there be a way to do justice to the latter texts? No serious consideration is given to this possibility. In general, this section of the article felt to me more like the application of a pre-formed picture of Kant to the Preface than an exercise in really looking closely at that extremely illuminating section of the text.
Most of Siep's article is devoted to probing weaknesses in Kant's claim that morality should: (1) receive an a priori foundation free of anthropological premises; (2) be based on a single principle; and (3) be centrally concerned with laws, commands, and reason, as opposed to virtue-theoretic alternatives. Some interesting points are certainly made along the way, but Siep spreads his attention too thin to have any shot at accomplishing those goals. Moreover, his critical ambitions sometimes lead him to overreach. An example that stuck with me is the charge that any part of Kant's project that takes into account our susceptibility to inclinations and our end of happiness is thereby incorporating facts about human nature and thus is no longer metaphysics (83, cf. 9). The problem is that Kant holds that those facts already follow from our mere finitude (cf. 6:25), which is not a specifically anthropological property. Moreover, it would be a spectacular example of a failure to abide by one's own plan if the Groundwork's routine treatment of the moral law in imperatival form already constituted a breach of its own Preface's proposal for a metaphysical foundation. It is helpful to consider the rough parallel provided by Kant's theoretical project: is transcendental logic's apriority compromised because it provides an account of cognition that takes into account beings who can err?
I heartily recommend Schönecker's article -- and I recommend it especially to anyone who has ever grown impatient with (what has seemed to some readers to be) the 'filler' between §I's statement of the moral law and §II's famous primer on practical reason and imperatives. This article is an excellent example of the fruits that can be obtained through careful, even stubborn, attention to a problem that generations of interpreters had neglected, perhaps in part because it seemed minor and boringly 'methodological' in comparison to the many classic philosophical questions raised by the work. Schönecker's modest aim is to explain the importance of §I's announced transition from [A] common rational moral cognition to [B] philosophical rational moral cognition (4:392). The most important result of his investigation is that the Groundwork contains five rather than four stages: after §I's transition from [A] to [B], §II effects a transition from [C] popular moral thought to [D] metaphysics of morals, and §III effects a transition from [D] to [E] critique of practical reason (i.e., the type of inquiry, not the book of the same title). Contrary to what many have assumed, [C] is not identical to [B]. For one thing, in [B] Kant is already able to present a correct, abstract formulation of the moral law, whereas [C] is characterized as "groping about with the help of examples" (4:412). One of Schönecker's topics is how a "natural dialectic" in reason -- more specifically, cultivated reason's tendency to "rationalise against the moral law" (111) -- spoils the insights that Kant thinks we all already possess (in [A]), thus leading some of us to [C]. The clarifications provided by this article raise rather directly many questions that are beyond its goals. For instance, what exactly distinguishes [B] from [D]?
The volume takes a sharp turn with an essay ("Reason Practical in Its Own Right") that is a great example of strong interpretation. Here, in what is perhaps best taken as an introduction to his important, and as yet untranslated, Kant über Freiheit als Autonomie (1983), Gerold Prauss argues that in order to grasp Kant's genuine philosophical contribution we must conceive of the will as "a reflexive self-relation" that is both practical and theoretical (128, 132). Signs of Kant's own failure to reach this level of understanding are to be found, we are told, in his unexplained use of practical terminology to describe theoretical spontaneity, as well as in his shrinking back from the deduction-project of Groundwork §III to take refuge, improperly, in a putative 'fact of reason'. Prauss goes on to tie these claims about how to set Kant's practical project on its proper course to the famous axiological remarks that open §I. This interesting article is certainly evocative, but I should warn that without the fuller background of the book many of its claims are rather scantly explained and lightly supported.
I am very glad to see that there is now a translation of Albrecht's important essay on maxims, which comes next in this volume. Interpretations of Kant's position range from the view that maxims are basically just intentions, so that all intentional action has at least one maxim, to Albrecht's claim that having a maxim is an achievement, in which one self-consciously resolves to direct one's own agency according to a general principle. Albrecht's position comes with several problems that the unsuspecting reader may not glean from Albrecht's somewhat polemical presentation, so it is best read in conjunction with other secondary literature. But this is a clear, helpful, and very accessible essay that must be taken into account by anyone working on the topic.
The next four contributions cover the Second Critique and are all drawn from a single Höffe-edited cooperative commentary on that work (2002). Höffe's own contribution to the present volume is conceived as a commentary to §§4-6, and it covers lots of territory in 19 pages: (1) the argumentative structure of §§2-6; (2) §4 and Kant's use of the Deposit Example in its explication; (3) the Reciprocity Argument (§§5-6); and (4) the Remark to §6, which includes the well-known 'thought-experiment' involving a despot's threat. Those who are working on the first topic will want to consult Höffe for his suggestions -- little work has been done on this topic -- though this discussion is rather brief and not always especially precise. Similarly selective in their coverage are (3) and (4). Much of what is said there will be unsurprising to readers. But there are exceptions, such as Höffe's claim that "one could hardly become immediately conscious of the moral law" through the act of drawing up immoral maxims; "in deciding to adopt moral principles, and indeed only then, does one become immediately aware of the moral law" (176). (The immediacy in question stands in contrast to our mediate "cogni[tion]" that we are free via the "'ought' implies 'can'"-principle (5:30).) Surely what we are "immediately conscious" of "as soon as we draw up maxims" and attempt to universalize them (5:29) need not be -- indeed, will not normally be -- one of the "formula[e]," which "determine … quite precisely what is to be done to solve a task," here the task "of all duty in general" (5:8). It falls to the philosopher to achieve that high level of precision in moral cognition.
There are two ways to read Höffe here, but they are equally problematic. If he has in mind that an agent "decid[es] to adopt moral principles" (176) only when she decides to make Formula of Universal Law or some other distinctly represented formula a criterion for her maxims, then he is mistakenly ascribing to Kant the claim that our consciousness of a precise expression of the moral law must precede our cognition of our freedom. If, on the other hand, Höffe's phrase is meant to include an agent's adoption of permissible maxims concerning any number of particular actions and ends (e.g., playing horseshoes to relax, rather than competitively), then this misses the fact that there is no reason to treat an agent's realizing that a maxim is permitted as special. An agent's realizing that she ought not to act according to this or that maxim can presumably be just as much help along the route towards a more distinct cognition of precisely what morality requires, as well as a route to the mediate cognition of our freedom.
In setting up the most striking section of his paper, Höffe applies his widely known position on maxims to §4's deposit example, pointing out that the maxim that Kant uses in the subsequent Remark is actually "to increase my wealth by every safe means" (5:27) -- Höffe identifies this with the attitude of "avarice" -- rather than any more specific principle, such as one that specifically mentions unrecorded deposits. He makes some rather extreme claims (e.g., "Kant is not concerned with any specific means or rules in regards to human conduct" (166)). Höffe then introduces the most controversial, and potentially most significant, portion of his discussion with Hegel's claim that Kant's treatment of the deposit maxim fails because Kant has not shown that property ought to exist in the first place.
I, along with many others, believe that the proper response to this objection is that Kant need not demonstrate the latter, since his problem with a maxim to deny unrecorded deposits is that it is impossible for a rational agent with that maxim to believe that she will be successful in achieving her chosen end (which is taken as fixed for purposes of this use of the test) in a world in which denying unrecorded deposits is what anyone would do in that situation. That is, the putative problem is not some defect in the envisioned world by itself but instead a conflict between that world (or an agent's rational expectations regarding such a world) and the maxim (or the agent's ability to believe that the maxim's act is a way to achieve the maxim's end). Against positions that take the effects on the world (or rational expectations regarding such effects) into account -- these are labeled "consequentialist" -- Höffe offers the argument that they are inconsistent with Kant's well-known refusal to make consequences, as opposed to the agent's maxim, criteria for moral worth (169). This is surely a category error, which confuses Kant's criterion of right (to use current terminology) with his position on moral worth. Just as it is open to a rule-consequentialist, once she has specified the precise formula that determines which rules have normative authority (e.g., either the set of rules that maximizes the good under conditions of 100% compliance, or the set that does so under realistic levels of compliance, etc.), to adopt various positions regarding an agent's moral worth, so these are in principle two separate issues for Kant.
Höffe proposes to find a "logical contradiction" by "turn[ing] our attention from the … consequences [of universalization] and concentrat[ing] exclusively upon the maxim itself" (170). The problem with this reading can already be seen from that still programmatic statement: if we identify something defective in the maxim itself (apart from any consideration of the 'consequences' of universalization), then it is difficult to see why Kant thinks that universalization is an essential element of this test for permissibility. If the maxim by itself is already irrational, then recourse to universalization is otiose. As it turns out, Höffe's more detailed proposal in effect dodges the issue of what makes the deposit maxim impermissible by fiddling with the maxim:
The case of a deposit knowingly and deliberately retained for oneself results from the 'intrinsically self-contradictory' maxim to recognise something as the property of another and simultaneously to deny its status precisely as another's property (170).
Were I to let my avarice carry the day, I doubt that this would be my maxim. Why not instead join a long tradition of agents who have rationalized larceny by regarding the money as something that society's arbitrary or unjust rules assign to another, while they contentedly regard it as their own?
The volume's next commentary on the Second Critique, by Annemarie Pieper, treats what is surely its murkiest stretch, the Analytic's second chapter on the concept of an object of pure practical reason. The reader who is limited to English will find almost nothing to help her puzzle through this chapter, so this is certainly an area in which a translation project might really help. The obvious choice would have been an excellent and untranslated article by Susanne Bobzien that has long been the starting point for any German reader seeking to deepen her understanding of this chapter. What we are given instead is an article that is nearly unusable. It will be worthwhile to discuss it, nonetheless, since it makes some flashy claims that some might find tempting.
Pieper's essay is dominated by two concerns: (1) Kant's avoidance of the naturalistic fallacy, and (2) Kant's alleged claim that the practical faculty of judgment is "situate[d] … in a space between determining and reflecting judgement" (196). On the first point, it is difficult to tell precisely what Pieper has in mind, though it is clear that she fails to see that the choice of a normative theory and the choice of a metaethics are -- at least until (non-obvious) arguments are produced -- independent of one another. She attributes to Kant a seemingly magical ability to avoid the naturalistic fallacy, while other positions are presented in absurd caricature, as for instance when we are told that utilitarianism "elevate[s] an actual fact into a normative principle: what all human beings actually do becomes what is right" (181, cf. Shelly Kagan, The Limits of Morality). It is clear enough that Pieper thinks that Kant's appeal to freedom and insistence on moral principles that are a priori is what gives him an advantage over other theories, but it is never explained why this should be so. We are told for instance that "the 'first' act through which [practical reason] initially produces itself as practical reason consists precisely in the production of the law of freedom" (183). If the production metaphor is to be taken seriously, then something, once produced, must be "factical" (at least relative to that type of production). But then it is unclear why the model she attributes to Kant isn't another example of "the logical impropriety of ascribing normative force to the factical or intelligible domain in its own right" (182). Other places we find Pieper glossing "pure" as "normatively binding independently of all empirical interests" (188). Of course, for Kant there are interesting connections between apriority and normative authority. But part of what commentators need to do is to try to make those connections and Kant's arguments for them precise, rather than conflating them from the start.
Pieper sets up her second distinctive thesis by arguing that practical judgment cannot be determinative, "since the moral law is not a universal in the ontological order of things and is therefore inapplicable to the objects of nature as such" (190). Yet neither can it be reflective, since "the universal is already given" (191). The latter is correct, at least to a point (see below). The former is confused. The fact that the moral law tells us what ought to be (i.e., what is "absolutely good") instead of what is does not prevent us from asking which of the things that are (or can be, subject to our decisions) also ought to be.
Here again confusion reigns regarding the distinction between normative theory and metaethics. Kant might well be overly complacent about whether universalization suffices as a formula for subsuming particular actions under the moral law (i.e., a task in normative theory), but that is surely the principal task of the typic (pace 188f). Once one recognizes this, then Pieper's motivation for a third type of judgment beyond the determinative and reflective disappears. To recognize that a prospective action is either consistent or inconsistent with the moral law is not thereby to define the moral law as an ontic particular, nor to declare it identical with anything ontic, though only these latter moves would commit the naturalistic fallacy. Now I certainly don't wish to dismiss the suggestion that there might be a role for reflective judgment somewhere in Kantian ethics and its account of moral perception. Yet if so, this has nothing to do with the naturalistic fallacy.
A task for any commentary on Kant's Object-chapter, and one to which Pieper devotes a section of her essay, is to offer an account of the categories of freedom, one that explains their general function and place within Kant's practical project as a whole and also makes sense of Kant's choices of particular categories. Here, though I cannot go into any details, I will say that I was unable to determine a single framework that governs Pieper's more detailed claims regarding the categories. I should mention, finally, that in a major oversight for a piece that is presented as a commentary, Pieper is apparently unaware of the surprising fact that a footnote in the Second Critique's Preface tells us that the first pair of modal categories concerns permissibility with respect to "merely possible practical precepts (as, say, the solution of all problems of geometry and mechanics)," in contrast to the second pair, which concerns morality (5:11). Pieper simply assumes that the first pair concerns morality (187).
The final pair of essays on the Second Critique divides its Dialectic of Pure Practical Reason into two halves. Friedo Ricken treats the postulates of pure practical reason, primarily those concerning God's existence and the immortality of the soul. Förster's relatively short commentary focuses on Kant's developing notions of what sort of dialectic practical reason might be subject to, the nature and the resolution of the "antinomy" that Kant chooses to make the methodological backbone of the Dialectic-section, and fundamental notions such as the highest good. Förster's contribution does just what it is intended to do: it provides a helpful guide to the opening of the Dialectic, pitched neither to the beginner nor to the scholar already familiar with the secondary literature on the topic. This is not to say that all of Kant's central claims are made to seem as plausible as the author apparently intends. Take Förster's case against L.W. Beck's well-known dismissal of Kant's claim that we have a moral obligation to promote the highest good. This case features an appeal to Kant's distinction between natura archetypa and natura ectypa, as well as the idea that the moral law is contained in the highest good "in the way in which the ground plan is contained in the idea of a completed building" (202). This is helpful, and correct as far as it goes. Yet it avoids the crucial question of why the realization of the moral law within the sensible world should include, in those cases in which adherence to morality is lacking, happiness in proportion to virtue, as opposed to any number of other possible distributions, or no constraints whatsoever on the realization of happiness. Perhaps those characteristics of the highest good are in some way already included in the "ground plan," but in this case some of Kant's most famous claims preceding the Dialectic (e.g., Kant's characterizations of autonomy) are seriously misleading, and this is basically Beck's point.
Ricken's commentary is similar in type and is sprinkled with a number of helpful observations and references, but I did find it a bit more difficult to use and too often blind to lacunae in Kant's justifications. Take for example the Second Critique's argument that "the highest good is practically possible only on the presupposition of the immortality of the soul" (5:122). Among several absolutely key problems with Kant's argument is that it assumes that "the complete conformity of dispositions with the moral law," i.e., holiness, "is the supreme condition of the highest good" (ibid.), whereas in introducing the highest good Kant had told us that it was merely virtue (5:110). From Ricken we get no acknowledgement of this problem, as he simply claims that "without this postulate … we would thereby be renouncing our own moral vocation. And the moral law would simply become an unfulfillable and thus meaningless law" (225). But why isn't our moral vocation to be found in a project that is consistent with our identity as finite beings, such as progress toward an ideal of complete conformity?
In order to keep the review to a reasonable length, I can do no more than list the last four essays of this volume, which concern Kant's Doctrine of Right and would thus require more introduction and stage-setting than those covered above: Kristian Kühl, "On How to Acquire Something External, and Especially on the Right to Things"; Wolfgang Kersting, "'The Civil Constitution in Every State Shall Be a Republican One'"; Bernd Ludwig, "Commentary on Kant's Treatment of Constitutional Right"; and Volker Gerhardt, "Refusing Sovereign Power -- The Relation between Philosophy and Politics in the Modern Age." Each of these essays is a helpful, though also fairly challenging, contribution to the growing body of secondary literature on the Doctrine of Right.
 The first was published by Vittorio Klostermann (1989), the rest by Akademie Verlag in the series Klassiker Auslegen.
 The same holds for Schwaiger's generally quite helpful Kategorische und andere Imperative: zur Entwicklung von Kants praktischer Philosophie bis 1785 (Stuttgart: Frommann-Holzboog, 1999), 49ff.
 This is the third of the three senses in which Kant uses the term "metaphysics of morals," as Schönecker helpfully distinguishes (96f; cf. also his Kant: Grundlegung III [Freiburg: Karl Alber, 1999], 25ff).
 I recommend Rob Gressis' two-part "Recent Work on Kantian Maxims … ," Philosophy Compass 5/3 (2010): 216-239.
 Höffe first treats the somewhat technical question of how we should understand "form" in §4's Theorem. I found this discussion both difficult and problematic, but lack the space to cover it here.
 For a slightly more detailed presentation of Höffe's views on maxims, the reader can consult his introduction to Kant, translated as Immanuel Kant (Albany: SUNY Press, 1994), 149-156.
 This is commonly termed the "practical contradiction" interpretation, after Korsgaard in "Kant's Formula of Universal Law," Creating the Kingdom of Ends (Cambridge: Cambridge Univ. Press, 1996).
 For two earlier examples of this failure to explain why universalization is doing any work, see Immanuel Kant, op. cit., 153, 155. For an essay that covers some of the same ground as the present essay, though in more detail, see "The Prohibition Against False Promising," in Categorical Principles of Law (Univ. Park, PA: Penn State Press, 1992).
 "Die Kategorien der Freiheit bei Kant," in H. Oberer & G. Seel (eds.), Kant: Analysen-Probleme-Kritik (Würzburg: Königshausen & Neumann, 1988), 193-220. This article does not appear in Pieper's bibliography and she appears not to have consulted it, since at a minimum it would have saved her from the oversight concerning the first modal category that is detailed below.