Andrew S. Mason


Andrew S. Mason, Plato, Acumen, 2010, 224pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844651740.

Reviewed by Frisbee C. C. Sheffield, King's College London

The aim of the Acumen series in which Mason's Plato appears is to provide fresh and engaging introductions to some of the great thinkers and schools of antiquity. This book certainly delivers. It covers some central areas of Plato's thought in individual chapters -- 'Plato's Metaphysics: the Theory of Forms', 'Knowledge', 'The Soul', 'Ethics', and 'Politics', and also includes some less traditional topics for an introduction, such as a chapter on 'God and Nature', and one on 'Aesthetics'. Mason argues that such topics should be included because they have had a particularly important historical impact (13). They also reflect recent scholarship in these areas. By including such a range of topics, Mason manages to cover a broad range of Platonic dialogues, ones not often discussed in an introduction, such as a subsection on cosmology in the Laws. There is also a chapter on 'Plato's Development and Plato's Socrates', which discusses some of the interpretative difficulties involved in reading the dialogues, without weighing the reader down too heavily with the 'Socrates question'. Such breadth of coverage, and clarity when dealing with controversial matters of interpretation, is matched with an engaging and readable style. The book is perfectly pitched to undergraduates new to Plato and graduate students who want to broaden their understanding.

Mason's focus is on 'Plato's mature thought'; this is partly because there is another book in the series promised on Socrates, but also for interpretative reasons. Mason argues that:

there is a real contrast in Plato's works between two points of view. It also seems that the first of these points of view -- the intellectualist and egalitarian one -- is found mainly in works that have the other features commonly seen as Socratic: an exclusively ethical concern, an exploratory rather than dogmatic outlook, and the absence of metaphysical theories about Forms and the soul … .it is reasonable therefore to divide Plato's works into roughly two groups, reflecting different ways of thinking. What is not yet clear is whether these represent two stages in Plato's development or whether one of them expresses the thought of the real Socrates. (19)

Since he does take those in the earlier group to express the thought of Socrates (21), his focus falls on Plato's later development (24). Mason argues that we can see some stability in Plato's central ideas in works traditionally held to be middle or late dialogues, which he summarizes as follows: the existence of Forms and a creator god, the immortality of the souls and the centrality of virtue. These are convictions that stay with Plato through most of his career, though he was 'open to changing positions' in response to argument, and even appears to have abandoned positions he returned to later (26). Exploring this intellectual flexibility allows Mason to give the reader a sense of one of the virtues of the non-dogmatic nature of Plato's use of the dialogue form.

Individual dialogues are treated within themed chapters, which allows Mason to bring dialogues together so that one develops a sense of his Plato with a core set of preoccupations. But the individual sub-sections devoted to particular works allow him to explore changes and differences of approach in a range of comparable dialogues. In this way the book provides a more detailed focus than books which opt to be more of a survey. It is within this roughly unified framework that Mason charts significant changes and differences between approaches in different works. He navigates these two positions well, arguing for elements of continuity even in those places where change seems most apparent. For example, even the separation of Forms, he argues, something which has traditionally been taken to divide a strongly Socratic from a Platonic approach to a range of epistemological questions is something that can be seen as 'implicit in Socrates' thought' (53). It soon becomes clear what he means by this: Forms are the sort of things that Socrates would have been committed to had he reflected on some of the issues Plato raises about the status of objects of definition.

Mason is refreshingly upfront about his approach to some of the thorny issues of how to read Plato. There are sections on 'Plato's Writings' and 'The Dialogue Form' in the introduction, which highlight some of the difficulties in extracting doctrine from the dialogues and clarify Mason's approach: 'Certainly we should be cautious in ascribing views to Plato on the basis of what his characters say. He need not be committed to every point that they make; the dialogue form allows him to put ideas forward while standing at a remove from them'. Mason goes on to defend the articulation of some of the key themes in Plato's dialogues with the claim that 'when the same ideas turn up in the mouth of the chief speaker in several dialogues, it is likely that they are fairly settled features of Plato's thought'. Or perhaps they are recurring Platonic preoccupations. Whatever one's views on that issue, Mason flags the issue for the reader, is open about his own interpretative commitments, declares his preference with the proviso that 'my readings are certainly not the only ones possible' and gets on with the business of reading the texts.

The book navigates a path between a Plato who writes from a very different perspective from our own and Plato the philosopher who can make a relevant contribution to modern debates. In so doing Mason manages to deliver on those details and puzzles that are so difficult to communicate in an introduction. Arguments are compared with, for example, Russell and Moore for Forms and their status, Hume for arguments about the existence of God, and Kant for ethics. Mason does this in a way which presupposes no prior philosophical knowledge and which genuinely illuminates some of the distinctive features of Plato's works. For example, after taking the reader through some of the arguments in the Timaeus for the existence of God, Mason persuades that it is informative to explore Plato's arguments for the creator in the Timaeus alongside more recent versions of the argument for design in Hume's Dialogues Concerning Natural Religion. This not only allows Mason to clarify the distinctive way in which Plato argues for a creator, but also leads Mason to mention ways in which Plato's account can overcome some of the problems with, for example, arguments from design attacked by Hume.

When Mason does develop Plato's ideas with the aid of modern philosophical tools (as he does, for example, when distinguishing between different kinds of predication, 46) he is upfront about the fact that he is not suggesting that Plato had a well-worked out theory along such lines, but 'that this will help to make sense of much of what he says' (46). Mason develops critical arguments against some of Plato's central claims and yet is also keen to highlight their 'inclining force' (108). Even in those areas that might alienate a modern reader Mason draws the reader in by including sections such as 'Why immortality matters' (109). In this way the book is not only an introduction to some of Plato's key ideas, but a model for the combination of scholarship, sensitive reading, and philosophical skill which introduces students to some of the skills required to read ancient philosophy.

This is an introduction that makes you want to read Plato. If you are already familiar with him it will make you want to read Plato again and ask new questions generated by Mason's overview. How do Plato's views on God in the Timaeus and the Laws relate to the material on the Form of the Good in the Republic? What is the significance and scope of the theory of recollection? Was Plato committed to this idea throughout the dialogues, or did he change his mind? (84). If the ideal state is a pattern for ordering one's life (11), then how seriously should we take its political proposals? Should one read the Republic as a political or an ethical work? The fact that one asks these sorts of questions in an introduction shows the standard of scholarship on offer here. Mason encourages us to make such connections between works, without diminishing the novelty of each dialogue's treatment, to encourage the reader to see new connections, whilst remaining sensitive to differences between works. I spotted only one error in the whole book. The index is helpful, and there is a section on 'Further Reading', which is divided into reading for specific dialogues and reading for specific issues. It guides the reader to much up-to-date reading on the central issues raised in the book. Plato is an excellent introduction, which I would be delighted to recommend to students of both philosophy and classics.