2011.01.13

Thomas L. Carson

Lying and Deception: Theory and Practice

Thomas L. Carson, Lying and Deception: Theory and Practice, Oxford University Press, 2010, 280pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199577415.

Reviewed by James Edwin Mahon, Washington & Lee University


Back in the 1980s, Tom Carson followed-up a co-authored article on bluffing in labor negotiations with a sole-authored article on the definition of lying.[1] Years later, in 2006, he came out with an influential article, "The Definition of Lying", as well as a subsequent article on the lies of the Bush administration, "Liar, Liar".[2] His latest book, Lying and Deception: Theory and Practice, brings together his work on lying and deception with his work in ethical theory and in business ethics.

The book is divided into three parts. In part I, "Concepts", Carson advances definitions of lying and deception, as well as the related concepts of 'keeping someone in the dark', withholding information, concealing information, 'putting spin on a story', telling a 'half-truth', and bullshitting. In part II, "Moral Theory", he considers arguments against lying and deception from Kant, act-utilitarians like Mill (at least, Mill under an act-utilitarian interpretation), rule-consequentialists like Brad Hooker, and the intuitionist W. D. Ross. Rejecting Kant's absolute prohibition against lying and arguing that the prohibition is not entailed by any formula of the categorical imperative, he concludes that the arguments against lying that rely on appeals to intuitions or considered moral judgments (Ross and Hooker, especially) reach a "dialectical impasse" because "ostensibly reasonable people disagree in their moral intuitions and considered moral judgments" (p. 122) about lying and deception. He then advances a theory of rationality and a theory of consistency in moral reasoning (for those who actually make moral judgments) that entails a version of the Golden Rule, and he argues that,

The moral principles and moral judgments about lying and deception that survive consistency and rationality tests support a moral presumption against harmful lying and deception that is at least as strong as that endorsed by (welfare-maximizing versions of) act-utilitarianism (p. 8).

In part III, "Applications", he considers lying and deception in sales, advertising, negotiations, and various professions, as well as the lies told and deceptions practiced by politicians in order to precipitate wars (especially the Iraq War) or prevent wars, and the lies and half-truths told in the rewriting of history, including the blaming of socialists and Jews for the defeat of Germany in WWI, and the recasting of the Civil War as a war "for states' rights and constitutional liberties, not to defend the institution of human slavery" (p. 243). He concludes this final part with a discussion of honesty as a virtue, both in the negative sense -- a "strong principled disinclination to tell lies or deceive others" -- and the positive sense -- "being candid, open, and willing to reveal information" (p. 257) in addition to having this disinclination -- and defends honesty as a virtue in the negative sense. I will focus on the first two parts of the book.

Carson accepts that "no definition of deception can be consistent with everyone's linguistic intuitions about all cases", but he does hold that "The morally salient feature of deception is that it involves intentionally causing others to have false beliefs that one believes to be false or does not believe to be true" (p. 49). (Note that Carson is not concerned with self-deception). He offers several pairs of definitions, the differences between them concerning whether deception must involve intentionally causing another person to believe or persist in believing what is false and what is believed to be false, or merely what is not believed to be true, and whether the causing can be causing of any kind, including that which bypasses a person's agency (such as stimulating a person's cortex, or hypnotizing or drugging another person), or whether the causing must consist in bringing about evidence on the basis of which the false belief is created or maintained. In allowing for a definition of deception according to which it may involve intentional causing of any kind, Carson argues against what I have said on this matter.[3] However, upon reading this chapter, I became convinced that intentionally operating on your brain while you are asleep with the result that you believe a falsehood when you wake up should at least be up for consideration as a case of 'deception'.

In general, I have no problem with the definitions of deception defended in chapter 2 of the book. My concern is with what Carson says about the following case: I believe X to be completely true; I also believe that there are "serious reasons for doubting the truth of X"; "I assert the truth of X on a solemn occasion"; I intend to cause others to believe X; and "I intend to cause others to (falsely) believe that there is strong, unambiguous evidence for the truth of X" (pp. 52-53). About this case Carson says that, "withholding information about the counter-evidence constitutes [attempted] deception" (p. 53). I agree that, as given, this is a case of attempted deception, but I do not see it as a case of withholding-information-as-attempted-deception. In this case, I intend that others believe what is false, namely, that "there is strong, unambiguous evidence for the truth of X"; hence, this is attempted deception about evidence for X. I should not be said to be withholding information (about evidence for X).

Carson also says that,

withholding information can constitute deception if there is a clear expectation, promise, and/or professional obligation that such information will be provided. If a tax advisor is aware of a legitimate tax exemption her client can claim that would allow the client to achieve considerable tax savings, her failure to inform the client about it constitutes deception. She thereby intentionally causes her client to believe falsely that there is no way for him to save more money on his taxes (p. 56).

Of course, if the tax advisor "intentionally causes her client to believe falsely [etc.]", she deceives her client; the question is whether, by failing to inform a client about a legitimate exemption when there is a clear expectation/promise/professional obligation to do so, she thereby intentionally causes her client to believe a falsehood. If it is possible, in general, for someone to withhold information without intending to deceive, as Carson does allow, then I am not sure that the fact of the existence of such a clear expectation entails that the tax advisor has a deceptive intention. The question is about when a person may be said to possess an intention. Later, Carson says about this case that it is "tantamount to deception" (p. 260), but that does not help.

In addition to allowing for withholding information, etc., without an intention to deceive, Carson allows for lying without an intention to deceive. Importantly, then, Carson does not consider lying to be a form of (attempted) deception, although the vast majority of lies are attempts to deceive (p. 56, figure 2.1). As he says, if he is a reluctant witness called to testify about a murder, it can be the case that

I make the false statement that I did not see the defendant commit the crime, for fear of being killed by him. However, I do not intend that my false statements deceive anyone… . Giving false testimony is necessary to save my life, but deceiving others is not; the deception is merely an unintended "side effect" (p. 20).

This is his main reason for rejecting other definitions of lying in chapter 1 and replacing them with his own pair of definitions. Carson's first definition, defended originally in 2006, requires that a liar (i) make a false statement to another person that she believes to be false or probably false, and (ii) makes the statement "in a context in which" she thereby "warrants the truth" of the statement to the other person, and does not take herself to be not warranting the truth of the statement (p. 30). To warrant the truth of a statement is to promise or guarantee, either explicitly or implicitly, that the statement is true (p. 26). His second definition, defended in face of criticisms of the original (since it ruled some seeming lies as non-lies[4]), introduces an intention. Requirement (ii) is replaced with the requirement that the liar (ii*) "intends to warrant" the truth of the false statement to the other person (p. 37).

While the second definition of lying manages to avoid certain objections, to my mind there remains a problem with the notion of 'warranting' in both definitions. Carson says that "when one warrants the truth of a statement or assertion the default is that one invites others to believe it" [italics in original], and "Warranting the truth of a statement presupposes that the statement is being used to invite or influence belief", and "Because warranting the truth of a statement is necessary for lying, when one lies one thereby invites others to believe it, short of doing or saying something to nullify or call into question the implicit invitation conveyed by warranting the statement" (p. 36). I did not understand Carson to hold, originally, that warranting involves implicitly inviting one's audience to believe what one is saying. If warranting (or warranting in non-ironic (etc.) contexts) involves implicitly inviting others to believe one's statement to be true, then the witness on the stand in the murder trial, who is warranting the truth of what he says, is implicitly inviting the jury to believe his falsehood to be true. I am no longer sure, now, what it means to say that the witness invites the jury to believe his falsehood to be true, but does not intend that they believe his falsehood to be true (and hence, lacks an intention to deceive).

Carson's denial that lying is a form of attempted deception does raise the question of what is distinctively wrong with lying. He holds that (all) lying "involves a breach of trust" (p. 3), where this is different from intending to deceive. However, Carson does not argue that there is a moral presumption against lying as such. He argues that there is a moral presumption against harmful lying. It does seem, therefore, that lying is wrong, when it is wrong, for the same reason that attempted deception is wrong, when it is wrong, namely, when it harms. As he says, "there is a strong moral presumption against lying and deception when they cause harm" (p. 2), and "We are (generally) harmed when we are deceived because we cannot effectively pursue our ends and interests if we act on the basis of false beliefs" (p. 5). It seems that the moral presumption against harmful lying that Carson defends is derived from the more basic moral presumption against causing or intending harm,[5] and that there is nothing wrong with a lie otherwise. There is little consideration given to the idea that telling a lie is wrong because, for example, it is manipulative and violates a person's autonomy, or it abuses a person's trust and is disrespectful.

Carson does argue, against Christine Korsgaard (on Kant on lying), that "Recognizing and respecting you as an autonomous agent is compatible with recognizing that coercing or deceiving you might be appropriate in certain circumstances" (p. 85). That is, he holds that not all lying violates a person's autonomy. This may be so if consensual lying is possible,[6] but it does not answer the question of whether, in cases in which a person is lied to without her consent, where the lie is not intended to harm her and doesn't harm her, it is still possible for the lie to be wrong. About such a case ("Suppose that I lie about my age to a stranger on a train … It is hard to see how being misinformed about my age could possibly harm her or anyone else" (p. 106)) there seems to be little moral concern. The case only becomes morally relevant when harm is re-introduced in the form of harm to the liar: "my lying to the stranger is likely to harm my character by making me less honest" (p. 106) ("The good and bad consequences of lying include the serious problems that lying often creates for the liar" (p. 98)).

I do not say that Carson must or should hold that it is wrong to tell such a 'harmless' lie, just that the default position on lying is not that of hardliners such as Kant and Paul Griffiths,[7] who defend an absolute prohibition against all lying, but that of Ross and Hooker, who hold that there is a moral presumption against lying. This is different from what seems to be Carson's much more permissive position that there is (only) a moral presumption against harmful lying, such that there is nothing morally objectionable whatsoever about a harmless lie. I say 'seems' because Carson later says that there is a "strong" moral presumption against harmful lying, and that his theory leaves open "the possibility that lying and deception are wrong in a broader range of cases as well" (p. 157). That would indeed eliminate the difference between him and Ross/Hooker. The difference between the more and less permissive non-absolutist positions needs to be highlighted and debated at the normative ethical level, I believe. This is true even if it is agreed to by all that the claim that it is self-evident that it is wrong to tell such a 'harmless' lie is unhelpful (Carson quotes his own students as saying, in response to Ross, "'What's the harm of lying?' [!] or 'What's the big deal?'" (p. 111)). Here I must add one final point about his opponents. Carson says, several times, that "Hooker never mentions deception, and I take it that, like Ross, he does not think that deception is prima facie wrong" (p. 116). The fact that Ross (and Hooker) do not separately address the wrongfulness of deception should not be taken to mean that they hold that there is no moral presumption at all against deception.

I cannot here do justice to Carson's defense of the Golden Rule, according to which "if I claim that it is permissible for someone to do something to another person, then, on pain of inconsistency, I cannot object if someone else does the same thing to me (or someone I love) in relevantly similar circumstances" (p. 135), nor to his application of his definitions and moral arguments to the range of issues considered in the final chapters. I suspect that many will be sympathetic to his conclusions here. This book is important insofar as it is a lengthy treatment of a topic that is too often relegated to parts of books or articles. Thankfully, this situation is changing, and Carson has done much to bring about this change.


[1] Thomas L. Carson et al., “Bluffing in Labor Negotiations: Legal and Ethical Issues”, Journal of Business Ethics 1 (1982), pp. 13-22; Thomas L. Carson, “On the Definition of Lying: A reply to Jones and revisions”, Journal of Business Ethics 7 (1988), pp. 509-514.

[2] “The Definition of Lying”, Noûs 40 (2006): 284-306; “Liar, Liar”, International Journal of Applied Philosophy 22 (2008), pp. 189-210.

[3] James Edwin Mahon, “A Definition of Deceiving”, International Journal of Applied Philosophy 21 (2007), pp. 181-194.

[4] One other problem with the first, original definition of lying is that in a situation in which one is compelled to speak by an aggressor, one cannot lie, since, in such a context, the truth of what one says cannot be warranted: “the statement in question is not a lie, as one does not warrant the truth of what one says” (p. 76). Carson points this out himself.

[5] As Shelly Kagan wonders: “whether or not all plausible constraints -- including the constraint against lying -- can be derived from a more basic constraint against doing harm” (Normative Ethics (Boulder, CO.: Westview Press, 1998), p. 113).

[6] Carson does make a contribution to the debate about this question in Kant scholarship.

[7] In Lying: An Augustinian Theology of Duplicity (Grand Rapids, MI: Brazos Press, 2004), Paul Griffiths argues that lying is always wrong -- even, for example, to prevent someone from killing a million people.