2011.01.14

John Kekes

The Human Condition

John Kekes, The Human Condition, Oxford University Press, 2010, 272pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199588886.

Reviewed by Jussi Suikkanen, University of Birmingham


It is difficult to imagine a more ambitious philosophical project than the one which John Kekes pursues in his book The Human Condition. Kekes aims to provide, from an internal humanist perspective, nothing less than a comprehensive description of our lives as human agents in the natural world we happen to live in. In doing so, he also addresses the traditional philosophical problems related to free will, practical reason, value, well-being, human nature, evil, moral responsibility, and so on. Kekes discusses all these topics in a unified and original way. This kind of bold system-building is surely to be applauded in the current problem-centred philosophical climate. Below, I will attempt to give a very rough outline of the sophisticated picture of the world painted by Kekes.

Personally, I find Kekes’ understanding of the world and our place in it strangely alien. It is nothing like the practical reality I seem to face or the way in which I navigate in it. I’ll sketch my reasons for thinking this at the end of this review. The upshot of this difference between our practical perspectives is that either Kekes fails to capture the human condition from the properly internal perspective, or I’m failing to function as a human agent.

Kekes begins from a dilemma which we seem to face when we attempt to understand our situation (7-8). Our first option is to believe that a supernatural Creator has placed us in the centre of a moral order in which both our lives have a purpose and our attempts to carry out that purpose are rewarded. Unfortunately, given the great advances of sciences, few of us find this image appealing any more. However, if we give up that image, aren’t we then left with a mere law-governed world in which things only happen but nothing has any meaning?

Kekes’ main aim is to provide a third alternative. At the centre of this view lies the notion of well-being. Even if we live in a morally neutral world which by itself does not care about our happiness, our lives can still go well or badly for us. The crucial point, in this situation, is that we have at least some limited control over what happens to us in this world that doesn’t care about us. By acting in different ways, we can be more or less successful in coping with the indifferent external circumstances we face.

The next step is to think that the more we can bring circumstances under our control the more likely it is that we will be able to achieve what we want (9-10). Therefore, increasing control over our lives is a crucial means for promoting our well-being. Kekes’ central thesis is that we can increase such control over our lives by engaging in what he calls ‘critical reflection’ (63-64).

How we act depends on our attitudes: beliefs, emotions, and motives. Therefore, also how much control we have over our lives depends on the particular nature of these attitudes. According to Kekes, these attitudes are real the objects of the critical reflection. Critical reflection aims at recognising and correcting mistakes in our attitudes, because this usually (but not always) leads to increased control and well-being (19-23). We are more assailed by the contingencies of life when our beliefs are false, emotions misdirected and inappropriate, and motives inconsistent, destructive, or directed towards unattainable objects. If by critical reflection we can come to correct these mistakes, our actions will be more often successful and our control over the world will increase. Kekes also emphasises how this process of correcting attitudes is itself a part of the law-governed natural world and how it must proceed piecemeal, attitude by attitude, without relying on any universal principles (ch. 3).

According to Kekes, we can correct our attitudes by investigating their historical origin (63). We inherited most of these attitudes through the values of our society, and our attitudes continue to be informed by them. A central part of our action-guiding attitudes is our conception of well-being which we construct from our society’s system of values (ch. 7). Critical reflection then requires us to consider whether our society’s system of values is reasonable and whether we have constructed our own conception of well-being from these values in a reasonably sound fashion.

Kekes classifies all values under two categories (ch. 5). Firstly, there are human values which are related to the satisfaction of the basic physiological, psychological, and social human needs (sec. 5.1). The reasonableness of these values is assessed by whether they actually succeed in protecting those needs. Secondly, any society will have a vast range of conventional aesthetic, literary, moral, philosophical, political, and religious modes of assessment which Kekes calls ‘cultural values’ (sec. 5.2). These values have to do with the interpretation of the human values and the accepted forms of expression and conduct in the society. The reasonableness of these values is assessed by whether they can support a shared cultural identity, which too is a central precondition of well-being.

Out of these materials, we must construct our own conception of well-being (which Kekes calls the third, personal dimension of value (sec. 5.3)). We do this by committing ourselves to a specific combination of human and cultural values out of all the alternatives available to us in our society. These can be unconditional commitments (which thereby set the limits of what is ‘unthinkable’) or conditional commitments which vary in strength (ch. 3). The reasonableness of the resulting conception of well-being depends not only on the coherence of our commitments to values, but also on whether the resulting conception of well-being matches our psychological make-up and the surrounding social conditions (ch. 4).

The role of critical reflection is then to correct the mistakes in our attitudes and conception of well-being by (i) evaluating the reasonableness of the values out of which that conception is constructed and by (ii) making our commitments to those values more coherent and also more fitting to our circumstances. We will also need to be able to make context-sensitive judgments when we face conflicts between different values. These judgments, which can be more or less reasonable, also need to be critically reflected upon (sec. 5.5). If we are successful in this whole process of critical reflection overall, we will increase the control we have over our lives. This is likely to lead to happier and more successful lives.

Should we then be optimistic about our prospects? Not necessarily, according to Kekes. This is because there are many things that can also go wrong in our lives (chs. 6-10). For one, we can all observe how much evil (monstrous actions that violate universal human needs) there is in the world. According to Kekes, the prevalence of evil reveals our ‘dark side’. Not only are we motivated to pursue well-being and good, but we are also moved by cruelty, aggression, greed, envy, and selfishness (191).

Kekes provides an original explanation of why these destructive motives so often also lead to evil actions (6.4). Evil-doers become disenchanted about the values of our society. They can no longer believe in the grand illusion of a moral order in which their lives matter. This leads to the state of utter boredom. However, in this situation, if there are grand ideologies around that can seemingly justify otherwise evil actions, the easiest way out of the boredom is to pursue the thrills of evil actions. They provide an outlet for our natural motives that are usually suppressed by the conventions of our society.

Can we do anything to prevent evil from being an obstacle to our well-being? Kekes suggests that there are at least two things. Firstly, we can deter potential evil-doers by holding them responsible for their actions (ch. 7). Kekes offers a new, less demanding theory of moral responsibility. For blameworthiness, his view only requires accordin to his view that the evil-doers take account of the easily foreseeable consequences of their actions. Secondly, we can encourage potential evil-doers to choose the promotion of well-being by familiarising them with the inspiring aesthetic, literary, moral, philosophical, political, and religious exemplars that can be found from the classic works of our culture.

In these ways, we can try to prevent evil actions. If we succeed in this, we can create circumstances in which we can increase our control over our lives through critical reflection. As a result, we should be moderately optimistic about our future (ch. 10). Of course, there will still always be some natural contingencies which will remain beyond our control.

The above was a mere sketch of Kekes’ rich and comprehensive investigation of the human condition. I can recommend his book to anyone who is interested in any of the many traditional philosophical problems which he tackles during that investigation. He always has something original and controversial to say. However, I want to finish by giving some reasons why I find his general view of the world and our place in it alien.

Firstly, I do not understand what it would be to take my own attitudes as the objects of critical reflection. Imagine that you were in front of a large and colourful tapestry in an art gallery. Now, imagine also that someone asked you to describe what visual experiences you are having of the tapestry. In this situation, it is impossible to turn your focus solely inwards to your own attitudes. All you can do to answer the question is to look outward to what the colours and shapes of the tapestry are, and describe them. This is how we can only indirectly come to know our experiences of the tapestry by being acquainted with the tapestry itself as an external object. This idea is often called the transparency of our attitudes.

The same goes also for our practical attitudes and critical practical reflection. Try to come to a conclusion about what you desire to have for breakfast. All you can think of are the different qualities of the different foods you could have and how desirable they are because of those qualities. You will not be able to access your practical attitudes by looking inside to your mind (it is not even clear what this would be like). This also goes for the process of correcting our practical attitudes such as desires. It too must be directed outwards — for instance, to the reasons why toasts are better than cereals — rather than to anything inside us. Because of this kind of transparency of our attitudes, I cannot image what it would be to take only all my attitudes as objects of thought and to correct them, where this would not be considering the world outside me and the reasons out there.

Secondly, I find Kekes’ emphasis on both our conceptions of well-being and well-being itself as some sort of a master value alien. When I consider my own attempts in living, these are never guided by the thought of what would increase my well-being. My own practical reflection is focused on the external features of the world; the qualities of the people I could be friends with, the natures of the different careers I could pursue, and so on. In the end, these considerations (friends, work, and so on) might together constitute my well-being in some sense.

However, the importance of these considerations for me is not based on or reducible to the fact that they could perhaps increase my well-being. Rather, these considerations are significant because of the particular characteristics of the people I know, the philosophy I am able to investigate, and so on. And, in the conflict cases, I never consider which option would better fit my conception of well-being (I am not even sure I have one). All I can do is to consider the external features of my options as reasons.

Finally, I find Kekes’ discussion of values confusing. There are many things one could call ‘values’: (i) the human artefacts that are good and have value; (ii) the goodness and value of those objects; (iii) my own admiring reaction to these objects and/or their goodness; (iv) our society’s admiring majority-reaction to those objects and/or their goodness; (v) the actual standards which I use to ascribe evaluative properties to objects; or (vi) the actual standards which the majority of people in the society use to ascribe evaluative properties to objects. Yet, when Kekes talks about human and cultural values, he seems to be talking about all these things (i)-(vi) together and, at the same time, about something that is separate from each one of them. Unfortunately, it is left quite unclear what these values are then supposed to be. I suspect that no simple disambiguation of the term would fit Kekes’ theoretical purposes.

These human and cultural values are then supposed to be something out of which I should be able to form my own conception of well-being. By critically reflecting on the attitudes which constitute that conception, I should be able to increase my control over the circumstances in which I live. This should increase my level of well-being. The problem is that, even if I knew how to do any of this, it’s not clear why I should change my practical way of living in this radical way.