2011.01.20

Nick Huggett

Everywhere and Everywhen: Adventures in Physics and Philosophy

Nick Huggett, Everywhere and Everywhen: Adventures in Physics and Philosophy, Oxford University Press, 2010, 217pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195379501.

Reviewed by Valia Allori, Northern Illinois University


Space, time, motion and identity: these are Nick Huggett's main topics in Everywhere and Everywhen: Adventures in Physics and Philosophy. The book has nineteen chapters. The introductory first chapter presents the problem of change. The second and the third chapters discuss the arguments against the mathematical description of change proposed by Zeno and their connection with the notion of time ("an arrow cannot move during any instant because an instant has no duration. But if it doesn’t move at any time then how does it move at all?" [ix]). The book thus begins with something fairly simple, intuitive, fun and engaging which successfully hooks the reader. The following five chapters deal with space and its nature. The discussion first concentrates on whether space is bounded or infinite (what is the overall shape of space? Does it have an edge, or is it closed up on itself?) and on the number of its dimensions (does space have more than three dimensions?). Then the focus shifts to the geometry of space (is space flat or curved?) and finally to the question of what space really is.

The next three chapters are devoted to time: first, the differences between space and time (does time pass while space does not?), then the possibility of time travel. Here is where Einstein's theories of special and general relativity, together with their implications for our understanding of space and time, are explained simply, yet more rigorously than usual. The last chapters address the more untraditional (and therefore in this sense more interesting) questions of what distinguishes right from left ("what is it about a left hand, or a left-handed glove, or a left-handed screw that makes it left rather than right?" [ix]), what identical particles are, and whether they are indistinguishable ("the particles of physics are exactly alike, so does it make any difference if they swap their locations, say? Are they like money in a bank or are they like people?" [ix]). The final chapter closes with an overview of the questions that are left open and discusses what needs to be done to (begin to address) them, inviting the physicist and the philosopher to inform each other and work together.

The choice of topics and the depth and precision of the discussions make the book suitable as a textbook in a philosophy of physics course. But it is not for a restricted audience. In fact, Huggett manages to engage topics of general philosophical interest as well as specific topics in the philosophy of physics. These general topics include the notion of free will, the nature of scientific laws of nature, and the concept of scientific explanation. In addition, he presents the material in a rigorous way. Although his style is very straightforward, Huggett is not shy about introducing more mathematical and technical material if he thinks that it is important for solving (or providing hints to the solutions of) metaphysical dilemmas (such as the nature of space, time, motion and identity). For instance, he discusses the mathematical concept of dimensions, introduces the notion of group transformation, explains what topology is and what its importance is for the puzzles of infinity, and presents non-Euclidean geometries to clarify the nature of geometry and of mathematical truths. The book therefore successfully combines general issues and technical material. This feature is, I believe, impressive because it allows you to see both how the work of the philosopher of physics fits into the big philosophical picture and how it can contribute to a particular topic.

Huggett's fun, entertaining, and informal style, full of jokes and personal anecdotes, and the clarity and the accessible way in which he presents the arguments( usually with examples and plenty of supplementary figures and drawings) make the book exciting not only for the philosopher but also for the interested reader, Since, as already mentioned, some of the topics are technical, and Huggett does not back down from presenting the material rigorously, I find this to be a truly substantial achievement.

As to content, Huggett makes peculiar and interesting choices. As I previously mentioned, his main topics are space, time, motion and identity, and he presents and explains the physical theories that seem relevant to these topics. Two chapters are dedicated to the special and general theory of relativity, which have been thought to provide insight into the nature of time and space. Much less space is dedicated to quantum mechanics, the other great theory of the twentieth century: the only chapters in which the theory is mentioned are those about indistinguishability and identity, since in quantum mechanics it is common to talk about indistinguishable and identical particles. This part of the book is, in my opinion, the most original since it presents pioneering research that is not much discussed in the literature and therefore is most exciting. At the same time, though, it is the part that is most difficult to follow, and would maybe require a lengthier discussion if it were to be better or more fully appreciated by the general reader.

Interesting, and I believe ultimately successful, is Huggett's decision not to use footnotes, but rather to have a list of suggested readings at the end of each chapter. As a result, the reader doesn't have to go back and forth between the main text and the footnotes, which can become very distracting, especially for the non-specialist.

Content aside, the book's most impressive feature is that it is guided by the belief that philosophy of physics answers metaphysical questions and by the idea that science and mathematics can be a guide to metaphysics. While this approach is certainly not new, it has frequently been challenged (in principle and in practice) by both scientists and philosophers. It is very common, for instance, to find scientists who judge philosophy a waste of time and are not interested in the fundamental ontological questions connected with the theories they work on. It is also common (if maybe less common) to find metaphysicians who try to provide answers to their questions without even bothering to look at the sciences.

Setting aside the scientists' motivations for their attitude, it seems to me that from the point of view of the professional philosopher this behavior is irresponsible. If it is possible to have a realist attitude towards science then science is supposed to provide constraints on our metaphysics. So it seems at least advisable to know what the sciences are telling us about metaphysical questions in order to do metaphysics properly! And that is what Huggett does in this book. He provides a simple but rigorous presentation of the main claims of the relevant physical theories and then draws the metaphysical implications of the theories he analyzes. He discusses the complex interactions between physics and philosophy, and he invites physicists and the philosophers to join forces and work together to solve, or to come closer to a solution to, the most fundamental questions about space, time, motion and identity: "The topics are technical enough that philosophers alone are unlikely to supply the key, but philosophers working with physicists could, I believe, help show the way" (214).

To conclude, Huggett writes that, just like any philosopher of physics, he has always had trouble explaining what he does to the layman. He decided to write this book to:

explain to all those people some of the ways in which physics and philosophy can be in fruitful dialogue… . This is not a book that just seeks to explain recent developments in philosophy of physics -- though we will talk about some of them -- but one that aims to help the reader really think philosophically about physics and the physical world (vii-viii).

His idea is that everyone who is willing to do some careful thinking will be able to be introduced to the subject through his book. I think that Huggett is successful. The book is suitable for the interested layman, but also for the professional philosopher, and it truly emphasizes the deep connections between physics and philosophy. So, have fun reading it!