2011.01.25

Thomas Hurka

The Best Things in Life: A Guide to What Really Matters

Thomas Hurka, The Best Things in Life: A Guide to What Really Matters, Oxford University Press, 2011, 200pp., $18.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195331424.

Reviewed by Richard Kraut, Northwestern University


Thomas Hurka's The Best Things in Life is that rare thing: a philosophical work written with such simplicity and verve that it will engage beginning students, but with enough subtlety and sophistication that it will also reward careful study by specialists. Its author is well known for his many contributions to moral philosophy -- and especially for Perfectionism and Virtue, Vice, and Value. This new volume is his first book-length attempt to address primarily a wider audience. Those familiar with his earlier publications will find in this new one some abbreviated presentations of earlier ideas. But The Best Things (as I will call it) is by no means a re-hash. Although by design it lacks the precision and rigor of work intended solely for an academic readership, it is in its own right an important contribution to ethics.

The best things, according to Hurka, are pleasure, knowledge, achievement, virtue, and friendship. To pleasure he devotes three of his eight chapters; the other four goods receive one chapter each; and a final chapter asks whether different types of good can be compared, whether it is better to specialize in one type or to be more "well-rounded," whether a life in which the same steady but moderate quantity of goods is better than a life of great highs and lows, and whether a longer life is always better. The main theme that runs through the book is that of pluralism: there is not just one kind of good; within each general type of good, there are many varieties; and no one type of life is best for everyone. He engages briefly with canonical authors (Aristotle and Nietzsche are often his reference points), and the reader is guided at the end of each chapter to further readings. A light touch prevails throughout (epigraphs and section headings often refer to popular songs), and there are no footnotes or endnotes.

The remainder of this review will focus on those aspects of The Best Things that strike me as most deserving of critical scrutiny. There is much more of interest that I regretfully omit.

From Impersonal Good to Personal Good

Hurka's topic is one that he formulates in several different ways. Often he speaks of "what makes a life better" or "what makes a life worse," but he also speaks of the best things in life as "benefits" and as good (or better, or best) for the individual who has them. His opening pages emphasize the point that people are typically concerned, to some degree, about their own good, and that morality often allows them to care more about their own good than that of others. The Best Things, then, is a guide to the prudential component of decision-making and career planning, even if that self-interested component is only one of several factors that ought to figure in someone's practical thinking. So, when Hurka writes about "the best things," he is referring to the things in someone's life that are best for that individual.

A method used throughout the book for eliciting the reader's intuitions is a thought experiment in which two worlds are described and the reader is asked to decide which is better. Here, for example, is how Hurka argues (pp. 66-7) that pleasure is not the only good: Imagine one world in which everyone is purely selfish and a second in which benevolence is present to some degree. Suppose, further, that these two worlds contain the same amount of pleasure as each other. (The first world, let's suppose, has warmer weather and less disease than the second; those advantages exactly offset the disadvantage incurred by the absence of the pleasures of benevolence.) The hedonist must say that these two worlds, being equally pleasant, are equally good. But, Hurka suggests, most of us believe that the benevolent world is better; this is the world we would create, if we could opt for one or the other. What stands behind that hypothetical choice, he thinks, is our tacit assumption that benevolence (or more generally, moral virtue) is a good thing -- that it is in itself beneficial to be benevolent. We assume, in other words, that the lives of benevolent people contain something that is good for them, namely, their benevolence. Hurka is of course not recommending benevolence because he thinks it is a means to some further good. Rather, he emphasizes that it is "intrinsically good." Benevolence is non-instrumentally good and, he believes, good for the person who has that disposition.

Suppose we agree with at least this much of this argument: a world filled with people who lacked benevolence would be defective precisely because of that lack. A human being devoid of benevolence is, after all, a defective human being; so of course a world filled with such people is a defective world. But now let's ask: why is the absence of benevolence in a human being a defect? A simple and unadventurous answer, but one that seems perfectly correct, is this: there are situations in which one ought to feel benevolence, and it is a defect not to react as one ought. One's heart ought sometimes to go out to others; and one is a cold person if it does not.

Hurka is saying something bolder than this, however. He thinks his thought experiment shows that when your heart goes out to another, as it sometimes should, that is good for you. Why so? Because if you lack this quality, the world is thereby made a worse world; not only that, but the deficiency of that world can be located much more precisely: it occurs in your life. It is your life that has been made worse -- a fact that you should care about for self-interested reasons.

Hurka may be right that a lack of benevolence is non-instrumentally bad, at least to some degree, for the person from whom this quality is missing. But to my mind there is an illegitimate slide in the mode of reasoning by which he reaches this conclusion. When your heart rightly goes out to others because of their suffering, you are feeling as you ought because that feeling is morally appropriate. One cannot infer from this it is in your interest to have your heart go out to others. Hurka is not assuming that everything you ought to do is something you ought to do because it is (to some extent) good for you. But in the absence of that radical assumption, it is difficult to see how this thought experiment can establish that one reason for you to be benevolent is that this is good for you.

Admittedly, when benevolence is the fitting reaction to some situation, we can speak of it as "a good thing." Furthermore, when you benevolently react to someone's distress, that is a fact about your life. Putting these two points together, we might say that when your heart goes out to another, a good thing has entered your life. Hurka might think that this is all that he requires. He might ask: what else could it be for something to be good for you (a benefit for you) except its being a good thing that is part of your life? But if that is the thinking that lies behind his thought experiment, it faces the objection that benevolence can be "a good thing" without being an advantage to the benevolent person. Perhaps it is "a good thing" only in that it is the morally right way to feel. If so, a good thing enters the life of a benevolent person only in that he feels as he ought. One needs some further argument, beyond what Hurka has offered, if one wishes to speak of the benevolent person as a beneficiary of his benevolence.

It seems to me, then, that The Best Things continually employs a questionable strategy for drawing conclusions about the prudential aspect of decision-making. It moves too quickly from impersonal considerations (which of two worlds is better?) to conclusions about what is personally advantageous (are you better off if you do this rather than that?)

Pleasure

Hurka calls pleasure "one of the best things in life" (p. 16), but often he defends a more modest thesis: that pleasure is a good thing. He also describes it as having "lesser value" (p. 50). It's "not the most important good in life" (p. 50). These last two statements seem to me to be in some tension with the first. That tension would be resolved if Hurka means that although pleasure is among the best things, it is not among the very best. Perhaps that is how he means to be read. But in one important passage, his estimate of the value of pleasure seems not very distant from that of G. E. Moore, who holds that pleasure "has at most 'some slight intrinsic value'" (p. 56). That passage reads: "Imagine a world containing only intense mindless pleasures, such as those of eating chocolate… . If we ask whether it's a very good world or only somewhat good, it seems to me that it's only somewhat good" (p. 55). He says nothing that is similarly deflationary about knowledge or accomplishment, so my impression is that he thinks of the latter two items as superior in value to pleasure.

Hurka also asks us to "imagine a world containing only intense mindless pain, say, that of being tortured" and to compare it with the world containing only the equally intense pleasure of eating chocolate (p. 55). The upshot of this comparison, he holds, is that "pleasure of a given intensity is less good than pain of the same intensity is bad, and pleasure is a lesser good than pain is an evil" (p. 55). The world containing intense pain is a very bad world; the world containing only intense pleasure is only a somewhat good world. This is why Hurka is not a great champion of pleasure. "Even among feelings," he says, "it sits in second place" (p. 58).

Whether examples of this sort, which are so removed from the world as we know it, should play an important role in normative theory is a difficult question, and so Hurka asks his readers to imagine a more realistic case: Suppose we can make a small improvement in just one of two lives. In one life, we can reduce pain from minus 10 to minus 9; in a second life, we can increase pleasure from 9 to 10. "If pleasure and pain had equal value, it wouldn't matter which you did" (p. 56); but, Hurka points out, the correct choice is to reduce the pain rather than increase the pleasure. It follows, he thinks, that pain is a greater bad thing than pleasure is a good thing. Positing that difference in value, he assumes, is what explains why we should alleviate that amount of suffering rather than facilitate that amount of joy.

That argument presupposes a framework in which we are to look to the quantity of value as the sole justification for choosing one alternative over another. A familiar non-consequentialist alternative holds that we have a duty to rescue: we owe it to innocent people to alleviate their suffering, when we can, even when they are strangers. But we have no analogous duty to assist strangers in their pursuit of pleasure. Just as we do not think it right to break promises merely on the grounds that by doing so we can bring about more good than we could by keeping them, so it would be a poor reason to refuse to assist a stranger in pain on the grounds that our help was needed by someone who wanted to have even more fun.

As these examples indicate, Hurka sets great store on the intensity of a sensation as a metric for assessing its value. For him, the degree to which a pleasure is good is simply a matter of how intense a sensation of pleasure it is -- how much of a "buzz" it provides, as he often puts it. Similarly, bad pain is simply intense pain. He acknowledges the familiar point that pleasures are of many different kinds, but he holds to what he calls the "simple view" that the intensity of the buzz one gets from a pleasure is the sole measure of its value (pp. 21, 25). One might compare this to the idea that the spicier the food one eats, the better one's dining experience. Surely that would be too simplistic an approach to the enjoyment of food. Some kinds of food should be hot; but intensity of sensation is too narrow a criterion for culinary assessment. Why should it be any different when we ask ourselves whether certain pleasures are more worth having than others? Why should we isolate intensity of sensation and focus solely on that, rather than more subtle aspects of our experience, when we decide which of two pleasurable experiences gives us the better pleasure?

If Hurka holds that any "buzz" has at least some small degree of goodness, he is faced with the well-known counter-example of the sadist, whose enjoyment of seeing others in pain strikes many people as a state of affairs that is not good even to the slightest extent. Here is what he says about the torturer's pleasure: "Even if it's to some degree good because it's pleasant -- itself a controversial claim -- it's also bad because it's sadistic; and more bad than it is good. Its bad aspect outweighs any good it may contain, so on balance it's undesirable" (pp. 65-66). The idea here seems to be that torture is very wrong; insofar as it is greatly wrong, it is also extremely bad -- so bad, in fact, that the amount of badness that enters the world when people act sadistically is greater than the amount of goodness that also enters the world because of their pleasure. But that suggestion seems too ad hoc to bear much weight. And how can anyone know how to make such measurements? Obviously, the pleasure someone gets from torturing others is no reason at all in favor of what he does. We should therefore reject any theory that holds both that a "buzz" is always a good thing and that good things always give us reasons.

Knowledge

One of the most important lessons to be learned from Nozick's experience machine, according to Hurka, is that knowledge and achievement are among the greatest goods. The subject who is plugged into the machine may feel as though he has made a great scientific discovery or has climbed Mt. Everest, but this is the mere appearance of knowledge and achievement, not the real thing. What is highly valuable, according to The Best Things, is knowledge and achievement, not the illusion of these goods. Because someone who is plugged into the experience machine has no knowledge of the world and cannot bring his will to bear upon it, his life is severely impoverished.

Is every piece of knowledge a good thing? Hurka does not decisively answer that question. If you counted the number of blades of grass on your lawn, he says, "the resulting value (if any) wouldn't justify your effort: that kind of knowledge is trivial" (p. 76, emphasis added). What makes it trivial and worth little or nothing, he thinks, is that it lacks generality. It is a truth about one tiny portion of the world: your lawn. And it lacks generality in a second way: it has no explanatory power. Contrast this with the wide range and explanatory fruitfulness of the laws of physics. If you know the law of gravity, you have something that applies to the entire universe, and you can explain subsidiary laws of motion and many particular facts about moving objects. Explanatory generality comes in degrees, and for Hurka the higher an item of knowledge is on an explanatory chain, the more valuable it is. If four low-level items each have one unit of value, then a known truth that explains those four items will have five: one because it is a piece of knowledge and four more because it is explanatory of four lower facts. A still higher member of this chain will have immense value, because it will inherit all of the value of the intermediate nodes.

But it seems mistaken to count the spatial extent of a fact as a measure of the value of knowing it. It would not be more worthwhile to know the number of blades of grass in the universe than the number on your lawn, even if lawns could be found throughout the cosmos even unto its farthest corners. A more serious worry about Hurka's scheme is that it seems to push him toward the conclusion that the best lives are those of a small handful of people -- theoretical physicists and (if there are deep explanations to be found in metaphysics) a few philosophers. What laws, after all, are known by a historian of twentieth-century Germany -- someone who has written a biography of Hitler, for example? She is an expert on only one small portion of the world and one brief period of time, and her knowledge does not form an elaborate hierarchical structure. On the contrary, she may insist that the key to explaining the flow of events in Nazi Germany is to eschew generalities and to focus instead on unique and accidental confluences of independent events. Since her intellectual project does not involve a search for explanatory generality, Hurka will have to say that one of the good things in her life is not nearly as good as one of the good things in the life of a theoretical physicist. But that is an unpalatable conclusion, and it fits poorly with Hurka's claim that the best lives come in many different forms, with no one type of life as best. Despite its author's pluralistic intentions, The Best Things counsels us to devote ourselves to one intellectual discipline: the one that contains the longest chains of explanatory laws and has the most extensive spatial scope.

Against Hurka, I believe that valuable intellectual activity need not take the form of knowing that something is so and why it is so. Aristotle (or any other pioneer in the history of science and philosophy) provides a counter-example to that thesis. He did not possess any knowledge of the biological phenomena he studied, since his explanatory framework posits the existence of substantial forms, permanent species, and an eternal unmoved mover -- entities that someone who really knows biology must reject. Even so, we can admire the qualities of mind that sustained his interest in the natural world, and we can plausibly say that it is good for anyone to develop that depth of curiosity about nature. Hurka's framework seems to lack the conceptual machinery to explain our conviction that Aristotle was using his time well when he devoted it (however unsuccessfully) to the study of biological phenomena. Hurka can of course say that if Aristotle got a "buzz" from his study of biology, good for him. But to say only that would miss something: the search for scientific understanding is mind-expanding and not merely pleasant, and it is a desirable form of cognitive growth even when it falls short of its goal.

Achievement

When we search for knowledge, Hurka says, we try to conform the mind to the world, and this cannot be done if one is plugged into the experience machine, since it severs our contact with external reality. His account of the value of achievement is similar, but reverses direction: to achieve something is to make the world conform to the mind, and that too is something that cannot be done when one is confined to the experience machine. We can climb Mt. Everest, and that is far more valuable than merely having the illusion that one is doing so. In climbing, we transform reality, moving our bodies to where we want them to be. But the subject who merely has illusory experiences is not imposing his will on the world; he remains within the confines of his little world and has lost his agency.

I do not see why Hurka assumes that the mere imposition of one's will on the world, rearranging its furniture according to one's plans, is by itself something that is good for one to do. Is there something wrong with sometimes leaving the world as it is, and devoting oneself to a fuller appreciation of its beauty? When you achieve something, he says, "you've mastered reality by imposing an idea on it" (p. 97). But "master" and "imposition" are words that sometimes have sinister connotations.

He develops his theory in ways that parallel the quantitative and hierarchical approach he took in his earlier chapter on the value of knowledge. Just as he holds that some forms of knowledge are better than others because the propositions known have greater explanatory power, so he proposes that the more hierarchically structured a plan is, the more intrinsic value accrues to the process of carrying it out. Suppose four low-level goals each have one unit of value. If they are means to a higher-order goal -- a goal that, in itself, has one unit of value -- that superordinate goal inherits the value of the subordinate goals, and it therefore has a total value of five. Obviously, highly complex projects -- undertakings in which there are many levels of sub-goals -- will be better to undertake than simpler plans. Furthermore, Hurka holds that ambitions that aim at a wider transformation of the world -- affecting many people over long periods of time -- are better ambitions to have than projects that reach out over smaller portions of the world. (That corresponds to his assumption that physics is better than counting the blades of grass on your lawn, because it covers more territory.) This seems to commit Hurka to saying that it is better for someone to be the mayor of Los Angeles than mayor of Chicago (all other things being equal). The best political life would be the one in which one rules over the largest population.

A striking feature of Hurka's theory is that for a complex project to be valuable there does not need to be any reason to undertake its ultimate goal. There may, for example, be no point in developing and marketing a new soft drink. Perhaps the world has as many soda pops as it needs, and an entrepreneur's new drink may be only minimally different from the ones already on the market. Even so, it will be very good for her to undertake this project, if it is sufficiently complex and difficult. (It will be good for her even if she does not enjoy her work, although it would be better for her if she also got a "buzz" from it.) If someone had the project of carefully demolishing all the buildings in the world and preserving the materials from which they are made, that would be quite an achievement, in Hurka's sense of the word, even if it served no purpose. For that vast undertaking would require an immensely complex plan.

Hurka is attracted to this way of thinking in part because he thinks that it gives him a way of showing why games are valuable. Sports are complex undertakings; perfecting the skills of athletes, chess players, and other gamesters can require years of planning and discipline. Yet they have trivial goals: hitting a puck into a net more often than someone else is not by itself a worthwhile activity. Obviously, the value of hockey cannot depend on the value of the goal for which its players strive while they are competing in the ice rink.

There is no doubt that the qualities of mind and body that are required for success in competitive sports, mountain climbing, and certain other feats of endurance are worthy of admiration. Furthermore, it is often good for those who are involved in these activities to develop and exercise those skills. The topological and combinatorial mental agility of a good chess player are similarly remarkable and worth developing. What makes it plausible to say that these activities are good for people to engage in is that through them they perfect some of the capabilities inherent in the human mind and body. The best account of their value is not, as Hurka supposes, that in them someone imposes his will on the world by pursuing an intricate and hierarchical plan. If a plan calls upon nothing that we would recognize as a valuable mental or physical capacity, but is merely the complexly structured pursuit of a trivial goal, there is no value in carrying it out.

Friendship and Beauty

Hurka does not claim that the goods he examines in The Best Things form a complete list. His main point is that there are several of these best things: the ones he discusses "and maybe more" (p. 163). But a striking feature of his discussion of love and friendship is that this category has a high value because it "embodies more basic goods to a high degree" (p. 143). I take this to mean that the value of close personal relations can be reduced to that of the other items on his list: pleasure, knowledge, achievement, and virtue. Love, he notes, "can make you feel good" (p. 143). "It also involves knowledge, since the people you love are usually the ones you understand best in the world" (p. 143). It is also a "site of achievement" (p. 143), because with our friends we jointly undertake long-term and difficult projects. "Most important, love is where you're most virtuous" (p. 144). Love best combats our selfishness and so makes us better people; we ought to give our friends more attention than others, and in this arena we are very likely to act as we ought. Hurka does not mean that deep personal attachments are always good for us. Rather, his point is that it is only when love embodies these other values that it becomes a good thing. As a general rule, he thinks, it does bring us these other goods, and it is therefore correctly sought by most people.

One problem for this reductive analysis is that someone can feel very lonely even if he has a deep knowledge of physics, has organized many complex world-changing projects, is a moral exemplar because of his dedication to many good works, and gets a "buzz" from these and other activities. If he feels that, despite all this, he is missing something important because he has no close friends, it would be odd to tell him that there is nothing he can get from friendship that he does not already have. The most plausible account of close personal relations will be one that helps us understand why his sense of isolation is not misguided but rather an indication that something of great value is indeed missing.

I think Hurka is wise to leave open the possibility that there are more of "the best things in life" than he discusses, and that they are no less basic than the ones that are already on his list. In particular, as I briefly suggested earlier, he seems to me to have omitted the appreciation of beauty and other aesthetic qualities in nature, literature, music, the visual arts, and so on. Someone who loves the simple beauties of the natural world -- sunsets, trees, clouds, brooks, stars, birds and their songs -- may have little or no knowledge of these objects, and he may have no elaborately hierarchical plans to transform nature according to his ideas. But what he has is very good to have. Similarly, someone who loves novels and poetry and fills his days with appreciative understanding of exemplary works is surely doing something good, even though he does not thereby acquire knowledge of facts and does not make elaborate, long term plans about what to read. The "buzz" these people get from such activities may not be very intense, as buzzes go. But their habits of appreciative contemplation, it seems to me, can be no less valuable than are the restlessly striving, theory-constructing modes of existence that Hurka sees as the exemplary cases of life going well.