2011.01.31

Paul Guyer (ed.)

The Cambridge Companion to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason

Paul Guyer (ed.), The Cambridge Companion to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 461pp., $32.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521710114.

Reviewed by Corey W. Dyck, University of Western Ontario


The Cambridge Companion to Kant's Critique of Pure Reason (CCCPR) is the latest installment in a Companion series devoted to a single philosophical text rather than a philosopher. Like the Companions to Locke's Essay, Hobbes' Leviathan, and Spinoza's Ethics, this volume collects essays by leading scholars on many of the central topics of the work in question. The CCCPR consists of an introduction (which looks at the development of the Critique during the silent decade and provides an overview of its aims) and 17 essays arranged under three headings: the background, the arguments, and the impact of Kant's first Critique. Obviously, a brief review such as this cannot consider each of these essays in detail, nor would commenting on a handful of essays provide much of an understanding of the quality of the entire volume. In what follows I will provide a brief summary of each chapter and limit myself to critical comments on the volume's main sections.

The two essays in Part I consider Kant's Critique in light of the background supplied by the rationalist and empiricist traditions. In his essay, "Kant's Copernican Turn and the Rationalist Tradition," Desmond Hogan argues that, some overlooked continuities notwithstanding, Kant's conception of a priori knowledge as extending to non-analytic necessities represents a fundamental shift from that of the antecedent rationalist tradition. According to Hogan, Kant claims that such knowledge is possible (only) with respect to appearances given that we must admit an absolute contingency among things in themselves (on account of Kant's doctrine of freedom), which is just to say that they cannot be known a priori. On the other hand, the empiricistic backstory to Kant's transcendental deduction is presented in Kenneth Winkler's "Kant, the Empiricists, and the Enterprise of Deduction." Winkler claims that, in spite of taking all concepts to be occasioned by experience, Kant does not fall prey to the temptation of empiricism in taking this to imply that a concept can be derived from experience in a way that completely legitimates its use. Instead, Kant claims that a transcendental deduction is necessary to demonstrate the legitimacy of all of our concepts, including empirical ones. This is because empirical concepts are not objectively real without pure concepts that condition the possibility of their objects, and the objective reality of pure concepts cannot be established by an empirical deduction inasmuch as the feeling of necessity traceable to experience is not adequate to the necessity thought in the concept.

Hogan and Winkler both succeed in illuminating the points of convergence and divergence between Kant and his predecessors, yet I find that there is something of a missed opportunity in the decision to limit the consideration of background to the old opposition between the rationalists and empiricists. There is some, but only some, justification for this since, as both Guyer in his introduction and Winkler point out, Kant himself makes use of (a version of) this distinction when he contrasts intellectual philosophers or noologists (Plato and Leibniz) with sensual philosophers (Aristotle, Epicurus, and Locke) or "empirists [Empiristen]" (A853/B881-A854/B882; cf. also AA 5:13). Yet, this rather simplistic classification hardly captures the complex rationalism of the eighteenth-century German tradition that constitutes the most proximate context for the Critique and which, especially as elaborated in the systems of Christian Wolff, J. H. Lambert, and J. N. Tetens, aimed precisely at a syncretism of key elements of Leibnizian and Lockean thought, thus anticipating Kant's own grand synthesis.[1] Given that Eric Watkins' recent book (Kant's Critique of Pure Reason: Background Source Materials [Cambridge, 2009]) has now made central portions of these texts from this tradition readily available to students, it is to be regretted that this volume was not bolder in challenging the exhaustiveness of this rather stale historical distinction when it comes to understanding the background to Kant's text.

The second part of the volume focuses on key sections of the Critique, the first group covering the Introduction and the Transcendental Aesthetic. R. Lanier Anderson's contribution, "The Introduction to the Critique: Framing the Question," advances accounts of apriority and analyticity in order to better understand the nature, and motivation, of Kant's guiding problem of the possibility of synthetic judgments known a priori. Regarding Kant's account of the a priori, Anderson maintains it applies not to concepts or propositions but to warrants for their use such that what Kant means when he claims that a given proposition is known a priori is that my warrant for believing it holds whatever the course of my experience (and where universality and necessity are only sufficient conditions for some a priori element in the warrants for a proposition). With respect to Kant's account of analyticity, Anderson claims that of the three accounts the definition in terms of containment is primary and can be defended from charges of obscurity and that this account makes clear why Kant claims that the truths of mathematics are not analytic (since such truths cannot be captured through the highly restrictive conception of containment analyticity).

Following this, Lisa Shabel focuses on laying bare the general argumentative structure of the Aesthetic. Shabel outlines the arguments of the metaphysical exposition, taking their collective conclusion, that space and time are pure intuitions, to be a synthetic cognition known a priori. Following this, the transcendental exposition argues that this principle grounds other synthetic a priori cognition inasmuch as, for instance, the axioms and definitions of geometry depend upon the representation of spatial regions which in turn depend upon the original pure representation of space and, further, that space and time are subjective conditions of sensibility given that such cognition precedes the objects to which they apply. Lastly, it is from these expositions, and the claim that transcendentally real determinations cannot be intuited a priori, Shabel claims, that Kant draws the stronger conclusion that space and time do not pertain to things in themselves.

The other group of essays in Part II cover the Transcendental Analytic. Guyer's contribution tackles the entire Transcendental Deduction chapter (in both editions), the overall goal of which he takes to be to demonstrate that pure concepts legitimately apply to all experience that we can have. Guyer begins with an initial consideration of the metaphysical deduction which, he claims, argues that, because all cognition of objects takes the form of a judgment and all judgment presupposes that their objects are conceived in certain ways, at least some categories must be employed whenever we have cognition. According to Guyer, rather than setting out from the results of this argument, Kant instead proceeds in the A edition transcendental deduction by trying to show that concepts involve a necessity that can only be grounded in the transcendental unity of apperception and that this unity, as proper to the understanding, must involve the categories. This is unsatisfactory, however, as it fails to establish an explicit connection between apperception and judgment. In the second edition version Kant accordingly attempts, in the first phase of the argument, to tighten the connection between the unity of apperception and judgment (and with it the categories) in the abstract and, in the second phase, to demonstrate that the categories condition the representation of the unity of (objects in) our specific forms of intuition, space and time. Guyer argues that only the second step avoids serious inconsistencies, and even then must still be supplemented by the arguments of the Analytic of Principles.

The Analytic of Principles is the topic of the next two essays. Watkins takes up its second chapter, the "System of all principles of the pure understanding" and Dina Emundts considers the Refutation of Idealism. Watkins explores the principles of the Axioms, Anticipations, and Analogies insofar as they state the conditions under which categories must be applied to appearances and contends, with special emphasis on the Analogies of Experience, that the arguments betray certain (non-Humean) ontological and epistemological commitments. Emundts argues that the Refutation demonstrates that all inner experience (as opposed to inner perception) requires the existence of absolutely persistent objects of outer experience and that, as such, it only amounts to a novel application of the conclusions of the Analogies, and of the First Analogy in particular.

As might be clear from the foregoing summaries, CCCPR's coverage of the first half of the Critique, and particularly of the Transcendental Analytic, is rather uneven. Some chapters, for instance, are treated in detail by multiple authors, as is the case with the First Analogy in the chapters by Watkins and Emundts, and the Transcendental Deduction in the contributions from Winkler and Guyer (though, in the latter instance at least, these prove fairly complementary). Of more concern is the fact that there are important sections of the Transcendental Analytic that go entirely untreated or which are significantly under-treated. Among the oversights are the Schematism chapter (as well as the Introduction to the Analytic of Principles with its well-known discussion of rules) and the Amphiboly of the Concepts of Reflection with its discussion of metaphysical error that will prove crucial for the Dialectic. Foremost among the under-treated sections is the metaphysical deduction which, despite a surge of recent interest, is only briefly taken up by Guyer, who refers readers to Jonathan Bennett's text of 1966 for further discussion while relegating more current, and influential, treatments to a lone footnote. The A edition of the Transcendental Deduction meets a comparable fate as Kant's initial distinction between subjective and objective sides of the deduction is simply ignored[2] and the argument itself is assessed only unsympathetically from the vantage of the B edition version. Finally, the Phenomena and Noumena chapter is quickly discussed only in relation to the Refutation of Idealism and without attention to the significant changes made from the first to the second edition.

Fortunately, the Transcendental Dialectic does not suffer the same uneven treatment. Instead, CCCPR departs from what had been a longstanding tradition in Anglo-American Kant scholarship of ignoring the complexity and defensibility of Kant's theory of reason, as five chapters are devoted to the major arguments of the Dialectic. In "The Ideas of Pure Reason," Michael Rohlf considers Kant's theory of reason and doctrine of transcendental illusion as outlined in the Introduction and then presents the account of the ideas of reason as given in the first book of the Dialectic. Rohlf follows recent influential studies in emphasizing the strict demarcation between reason and the understanding, and in distinguishing between the natural and unavoidable transcendental illusion from the unnatural and avoidable metaphysical errors consequent upon it. Moreover, Rohlf defends Kant's metaphysical deduction of the transcendent ideas by claiming that reason does not generate the ideas of the soul, world, and God from the forms of syllogistic inference, as is often charged, yet the ideas are associated with those forms and it is this that tempts the metaphysician into drawing unwarranted objective conclusions regarding them.

Julian Wuerth leads off the treatment of the extensive arguments of the second book of the Dialectic with a detailed analysis of the Paralogisms of Pure Reason within the context of the Critique itself and of Kant's later (published and unpublished) pronouncements on the topic. As Wuerth explains, the rational psychologist's claims to cognize the soul are rejected inasmuch as Kant takes the consciousness of ourselves in pure apperception to amount only to the consciousness of an indeterminate thing in itself and not of a determinable object in space and time, where the rational psychologist's mistake is attributed to his failure to make this distinction. Even so, Wuerth contends that Kant's criticism of the rational psychologist is limited only to assertions of the soul's substantiality, simplicity, and identity insofar as these are taken in their determinate and useful senses, i.e., as implying permanence, incorruptibility, and personality, and does not entail that Kant rejects any ontologically significant (if indeterminate) sense in which the soul can be said to be a simple, identical substance.

Allen Wood considers the next chapter, the Antinomy of Pure Reason. After laying out the general problem behind the Antinomy, namely, the unavoidable but incompatible conceptions of the world arising from reason's thought of an infinite series of conditioning relations for a given existing thing, Wood considers the specific cosmological problems and their relevant historical background. He goes on to offer a number of criticisms of Kant's treatment, doubting, for example, the soundness of the arguments for the theses and antitheses (particularly in the First Antinomy) and, more controversially, questioning whether what he takes to be the positive metaphysics of transcendental freedom are consistent with the strictures of the Critique or in any way required for Kantian ethics.

The Ideal of Pure Reason is taken up by Michelle Grier, who explores the connection between the ideas of the ens realissimum and a necessary being in Kant's criticism of rationalist theology. As Grier argues, in accordance with a natural demand for a necessary being, reason takes the idea of the ens realissimum, the illusory representation of that sum-total of reality presupposed for the use of the principle of thoroughgoing determination of things, and inserts it into the space cleared in the Fourth Antinomy. It is the "coincidence" of these two ideas (of a necessary being and the ens realissimum) which, in turn, grounds the first two strategies for proving God's existence: so, the ontological proof involves the inference from the idea of an ens realissimum to its necessary existence, whereas the cosmological proof involves the inferences from the claim that a necessary being exists to its identification as the supremely real being. Nonetheless, as Kant argues in the Ideal, the demand for a necessary existence is merely subjective and the consequent idea of a necessary, supremely real being can only admit of regulative use, which Grier claims suffices to undermine the physico-theological proof for God's existence.

Lastly, Fred Rauscher explores Kant's account of the positive use of reason as presented in the Appendix to the Dialectic and the Canon of Pure Reason but also in the Doctrine of Method. Rauscher distinguishes two legitimate theoretical uses of reason, corresponding to the two sections of the Appendix. The first involves mundane ideas generated through reason's use of the methodological principles (of homogeneity, specificity, and continuity of forms) in the course of systematizing the cognitions of the understanding and which prompt further investigation. The second involves the pure ideas of reason that serve as the imaginary foci for this systematizing activity. Rauscher then turns to the Canon which he takes to assign a similar role to the practical ideas of God and immortality in systematizing moral experience and prompting action. The remainder of the Doctrine of Method is taken up by A. W. Moore, who focuses on the exposition of transcendental argumentation (in the section entitled "The Discipline of Pure Reason with Regard to its Proofs") and points out a number of difficulties involved in drawing the boundaries implied by the idealism on which Kant's transcendental arguments rely.

With regard to the third and final part of CCCPR, concerning the impact of the Critique, it will be possible (and necessary) to be brief. Rolf-Peter Horstmann considers the reaction to Kant's Critique primarily as found in the early work of Fichte, Schelling, and Hegel, a reaction which he characterizes generally as dissatisfaction with the merely epistemological import of the principles of Kant's theoretical philosophy. Konstantin Pollok considers the Neo-Kantian counter-reaction to post-Kantian idealism, with special attention to debates regarding the role of the thing-in-itself and to the effort to de-psychologize Kant's text. The last pair of chapters trace the impact of Kant's Critique on continental and analytic philosophy respectively. Daniel Dahlstrom focuses on Heidegger's interpretation of the Critique (particularly the account of transcendental imagination) in Kant and the Problem of Metaphysics. Kenneth Westphal focuses on the Critique's influence on analytic thought as evidenced in the work of C. I. Lewis, Peter Strawson, and Wilfrid Sellars. Despite the challenge of gauging the broader impact of the Critique alone, outside of its place in the Critical philosophy, these are without exception insightful studies on neglected topics.

While CCCPR is touted as the "first collective commentary on [the Critique] in English," it is not without competition since (without mentioning the multitude of non-collective commentaries) there are a number of collections which cover much of the same territory in comparable detail despite lacking the form of a commentary. Of note here are A Companion to Kant (ed. G. Bird, Blackwell, 2010) and Kant and Early Modern Philosophy (ed. P. Guyer, Cambridge, 2006), and even the original Cambridge Companion to Kant (ed. P. Guyer, Cambridge, 1996). Against these, CCCPR generally stacks up well, particularly due to its thorough treatment of the Dialectic and its uniquely thorough consideration of the Critique's impact.[3] Its deficiencies, however, particularly in its treatment of the Analytic means that it complements, rather than supersedes, these other collections. Thus, even granting that CCCPR lives up to its boast of being the first collective commentary in English, it leaves enough work to be done that it should not (and undoubtedly will not) be the last.


[1] For a particularly good example of this attempted syncretism, see Tetens' Über die allgemeine speculativische Philosophie of 1775 (reprinted in volume IV of the series Neudrucke seltener philosophischer Werke, ed. W. Uebele [Berlin: Reuther & Reichard, 1913]). For one appraisal of Wolff's achievements in this regard, see L.W. Beck, Early German Philosophy: Kant and His Predecessors (Cambridge MA: Belknap, 1969), 266-69.

[2] For a treatment of the subjective deduction that accounts for its distinction from, and dependence upon, the objective deduction, see my "The Subjective Deduction and the Search for a Fundamental Force" in Kant-Studien 99 (2008): 152-79.

[3] It must be noted that among collective commentaries that are not (solely) in English, the gold-standard is Immanuel Kant, Kritik der reinen Vernunft (eds. G. Mohr and M. Willaschek, Akademie, 1998).