2011.02.08

Mitchell Aboulafia

Transcendence: On Self-Determination and Cosmopolitanism

Mitchell Aboulafia, Transcendence: On Self-Determination and Cosmopolitanism, Stanford UP, 2010, 202pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804770200.

Reviewed by Colin Koopman, University of Oregon


The difficult work of negotiating the relation between individuality and sociality has been one of the central philosophical problematics of our times. This has been the case since at least the nineteenth century. Philosophical attention to the difficulties therein only escalated over the course of the twentieth century. And as our new century dawns, there remains an increasing sense that this remains one of the central philosophical challenges of our times. How do we reconcile these two sides of our selves, the one pulling inward toward autonomist self-determination (with all the insularity and exclusiveness implied) and the other outward toward the sympathetic sensibility of the cosmopolitan (involving us in ever-more inclusive patterns of action)? There are no obvious knock-down solutions to this problematic in the contemporary marketplace of philosophical ideas. But the marketplace itself is clearly obsessed with the problematic. One might look at the number of titles addressed to this issue as a supply glut. Or one might recognize the steady stream of attempts to address these matters as a reliable indicator of the great importance of this problematic for us today. On the latter view, it is hard to imagine a way in which one might reasonably defend the claim that too many philosophers are addressing themselves to this difficulty. On the contrary, we need more works of this kind, and now more than ever.

Taking this latter view, it is easy to recognize the importance of the project mapped out by Mitchell Aboulafia's latest offering, Transcendence: On Self-Determination and Cosmopolitanism. Aboulafia clearly states at the outset his three primary goals:

(1) to demonstrate the relevance of the concept of transcendence to credible notions of individual self-determination and cosmopolitanism; (2) to articulate a cosmopolitan sensibility that is attuned to cultural diversity and individual self-determination; and (3) to address conceptual affinities between philosophers from both sides of the Atlantic by examining the idea of transcendence. (p. 3)

The second and third are familiar efforts in the context of contemporary professional philosophy. The first goal is the most interesting effort, because it is an attempt to develop a new spin on a set of ideas already discussed by many of those professional philosophers who have addressed themselves to the second goal. What makes Aboulafia's approach novel is the way in which he draws on the idea of transcendence to speak to the familiar problematic of reconciling individual self-determination and cosmopolitan sociality.

A quick summary of the book's structure will give a sense of the way in which this novel contribution shapes up in a multiplicity of forms across eight chapters. The book is divided into three parts. Part One is largely an effort in comparative exegesis. The first chapter is devoted to Richard Rorty and Sartre, the second to Dewey and Sartre, and the third to George Herbert Mead and Pierre Bourdieu. Aboulafia's attempt to satisfy his third goal takes the form of comparative exercises across the divides that unfortunately continue to separate scholarship on twentieth-century American and French philosophies. In the course of satisfying this third goal, Aboulafia teases out conceptions of transcendence that speak to the problems basic to his first two goals. Part Two is largely an attempt to state the case for the importance of an idea of transcendence for any viable conception of cosmopolitanism that continues to respect individual self-determination. The argument is made across two chapters, both of which are largely exegetical, one focusing on Mead's cosmopolitanism and the other focusing on W. E. B. Du Bois's work on sympathy across the color line.

Part Three comprises three chapters, addressing various deterministic criticisms of the conceptions of novelty, creativity, and transcendence that Aboulafia developed in the first two parts. Chapter Six addresses sociological determinism as it persists in the work of Neil Gross's new sociology of ideas (as deployed in his recent and important book on Richard Rorty). Chapter Seven addresses psychological determinism by way of Herbert Marcuse's attempt to grapple with certain themes in Freud that seem to stand in the way of our seeing ourselves as free. Chapter Eight develops a novel reading of Hegel so as to criticize a purely culturalist conception of transcendence that would equate the biological with the deterministic, insisting instead that we can and should make room for an idea of naturalized transcendence.

Before considering the arguments developed across Parts One and Two (leaving aside for considerations of space a discussion of Part Three), a brief meta-comment on the form of the book is in order. The book on the whole is best read more as an effort in exegesis than in argument. This is neither an advantage nor a disadvantage, but insofar as the book at times presents itself as offering a single argument in the style of a monograph some confusion is bound to result. It is difficult to find one thread of argumentation that runs across all the chapters. Indeed three of the five chapters comprising Parts One and Two were previously published in various other volumes and together represent a drawing together of work that spans an almost ten-year period. This, to restate, is not a disadvantage. But sometimes, especially in reading the introduction, one has the feeling that Aboulafia wants to see the book as offering one line of argument. Were this the case, then the book would not fulfill his plan, because the arrangement of material is too diverse and disconnected to weave (in the reader's mind) into a single thread of argument.

But why emphasize the negative when there is plenty to be positive about in this volume? Rather than taking some of its introductory gestures as final, it is best to read it as a constellation of interwoven contributions on the theme of transcendence, all of which illuminate in important ways that broader problematic of individual self-determination and cosmopolitan sympathy named in the subtitle. Aboulafia himself urges this when he tells us in the introduction that the volume's central concept, transcendence, "does not have a univocal meaning in this book, although there is a family resemblance among its uses" (p. 6).

Reading the book as a constellation of contributions enables us to assess it as developing a set of arguments, many of which proceed exegetically. The arguments are informative, provocative, and in many respects persuasive. The exegeses are also interesting and provocative, but readers may find them problematic for two reasons. First, Aboulafia unnecessarily restricts the scope of his textual interrogations, for instance in Chapter One where he limits himself to Rorty's Philosophy and the Mirror of Nature without addressing Contingency, Irony, and Solidarity despite the centrality of Romantic themes of transcendence in the latter, or in Chapter Three where he neglects Bourdieu's discussions of Dewey and pragmatism in Pascalian Meditations. (The latter, to be fair, may be a function of the fact that this chapter republishes an article that was prepared before Bourdieu's book was translated into English. Yet the book itself would have been the perfect opportunity to revise this chapter and incorporate this important final work of Bourdieu's.) Second, Aboulafia develops his arguments and exegeses with very light attention to the existing secondary literature. I find this perplexing. But perhaps it is merely a matter of taste. A dense textual apparatus that loads a book down with footnotes and citations can appear, to put it squarely, ugly. Indeed the scholar is rarely a beautiful creature. Nonetheless, we philosophers ought to be possessed of sufficient humility to see ourselves as scholars more than as world-historical thinkers. It is my sense that our discipline ought to impose upon itself the discipline carried by the footnote, the citation, and the thorough review of one's secondary literature. This book does not exactly do that. But if some of us will find this disappointing, others will surely be pleased by it.

I have been stating a handful of concerns about the form of the book and its arguments. Having fulfilled my requisite reviewer's duty of noting such concerns, I would like to return to what I take to be the importance and insight of this volume, which is a function in no small measure of its developing a way of taking a novel perspective on that central philosophical problematic I described at the outset.

Part One offers a provocative and valuable set of engagements across familiar philosophical divides in order to develop and deliver a conception of transcendence. In Chapter One, Aboulafia offers compelling rereadings of Rorty and Sartre to show that, "any universe that closes off the possibility of transcendence, which denies us the opportunity to redefine ourselves and have alternative projects, would be an anathema to them" (p. 25). This point is registered in Rorty and Sartre in quite different ways; it is Aboulafia's insight to have teased out the connection. If Sartre's phenomenological existentialism takes as its point of departure a conception of freedom rooted in a conception of consciousness, Rorty's "linguistic existentialism" offers an idea of linguistic novelty rooted in a conception of sociolinguistic practice. This difference is a basic watershed characteristic of almost every twentieth-century philosophical tradition: it is the divide variously described in terms of experience and language, consciousness and discourse, mind and word. The conditions of transcendence matter to the way in which we conceptualize transcendence itself. But Aboulafia is right to point out that we can also reach across these familiar divides in order to discern nonessentialist and antifoundationalist conceptions of transcendence inhabiting a wide swath of philosophical thought across the twentieth century. Perhaps this commitment to transcendence is more important than the divides that so many of us so readily emphasize?

Chapters Two and Three continue along in the same vein, taking up the same theme of transcendence as it figures in the discourse (and experience?) of other key thinkers in American and French philosophy. In discussing Dewey and Sartre in Chapter Two, Aboulafia's effort is to note "a degree of similarity" in their otherwise different views "that has implications for our practices as agents" (p. 35). Both facilitate a reconceptualization of freedom as a practical activity resulting from choices we make in our lives, rather than as a static capacity that we are possessed with as if it were our essence. For both Dewey and Sartre, it is possible to not assume our freedom and slip into the incapacities of bad faith, and yet it is also always possible to find our freedom again and re-establish a more engaged relationship to ourselves and our world. This is a conception of freedom that seems to be at once philosophically robust and publicly accessible, two requirements for thought that Aboulafia locates in both Dewey and Sartre. As such, it is a conception of freedom that we may use to do important philosophical and public work with respect to pressing cultural problematics.

Part Two is, conceptually, the centrt of the book. Here Aboulafia puts his idea of transcendence to work in order to address himself to our broader cultural problematic of reconciling self-determination and cosmopolitanism. The discussion proceeds through analytical-argumentative engagements with Mead and Du Bois. The central idea of transcendence features here in a way that is invaluable both in its own right and as a springboard to further work along the lines that Aboulafia has begun charting. Though Aboulafia does not discuss recent work on cosmopolitanism by Kwame Anthony Appiah, J├╝rgen Habermas, Samuel Scheffler, Carol Gould, James Bohman, and others, his contribution can surely be seen as intervening in those debates. For he grasps the problematic in precisely the sense that so many of us today are aware of, namely that basic tension between individual allegiance and cosmopolitan sympathy described at the outset of this review.

How does Aboulafia figure transcendence as a conceptual intervention that might remediate this core tension we all inhabit today? The best claim of the book is this: "Mead, then, is advocating what might be called a contingent universalism, that is, the claim that individuals can move beyond the immediacy of local concerns by engaging others at different levels of abstraction" (p. 80). The slogan of transcendence is "to transcend the local," presumably without eradicating it. We begin where we are and move outward, proceeding through selfhood to sympathy. The tension between the individual demands of the self and the social demands of sympathy need not, then, be seen as opposed in principle. Even if they are sometimes, indeed too often, opposed in practice, they can also be practically mediated by acts of transcendence.

Aboulafia's idea of "contingent universalism" seems to me crucially valuable for his project. I wish he had developed it at greater length. Let me close by saying why I find the germ of his idea so appealing. In my own work (specifically in my manuscript Genealogy as Critique forthcoming with Indiana University Press) I make much of something quite like this idea in order to argue for a philosophical combination of Foucaultian genealogy (with its emphasis on contingencies) and Habermas' critical theory (with its emphasis on universality). Many will balk at Aboulafia's proposal, and mine, because we have all been trained to think of contingency and universality as opposed. But this is an error and, indeed, a rather basic one. Contingency specifies a modality (properly opposed to necessity). Universality specifies a scope (properly specified to particularity). There is nothing in anti-necessity that precludes universality, nothing in contingency that demands in each instance anti-universality. Humble examples help make this point. A standard measure, such as a yardstick or voltmeter, is a contingently-composed construct that can emerge only in a certain social-cultural-technological niche. But once it emerges, this measure can go anywhere, and that is the very point of the measure itself. Once you have the contingent construct of a yard or a volt, you can apply that measure universally. (We humans really are ingenious little creatures!)

A basic question we face today is thus the following: are other constructs, such as practices of human rights, more akin to such contingent universals as yardsticks or more akin to the laws of morality and science as theorized by modern philosophy in the fancy dress of necessity and universality at once? Are acts of transcendence whereby we redeploy practices and ideas of human rights in ever new contexts enough for us to confront the problems of our age? It is the hope of most of the philosophers covered in Aboulafia's book, and it is also my hope and I think Aboulafia's too, that it will be. Accordingly we might yet learn to think, through this array of philosophers, of transcendence as a process of transcending without the requirements we have always associated with the transcendental.