2011.02.15

Abigail Levin

The Cost of Free Speech: Pornography, Hate Speech, and Their Challenge to Liberalism

Abigail Levin, The Cost of Free Speech: Pornography, Hate Speech, and Their Challenge to Liberalism, Palgrave Macmillan, 2010, 213pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780230237681.

Reviewed by Susan Dwyer, University of Maryland


Liberty-maximizing political regimes produce, perforce, inequalities. Thus a central challenge for egalitarian liberal political theorists is to articulate principles that can serve as norms regarding how particular states may manage or negotiate those inequalities. With respect to economic inequality born of free markets, Rawls' difference principle is paradigmatic. In The Cost of Free Speech, Abigail Levin is concerned with a different, though arguably related, kind of inequality, namely, 'cultural oppression' that is constructed through and maintained by a largely unregulated marketplace of ideas. For the most part, liberals maintain that unless some speech is proven to cause demonstrable harm, the state must refrain from interfering in liberty of expression on pain of violating neutrality -- that is, on pain of endorsing one set of views, values, or a conception of the good over others. This gives rise to an embarrassing tension for liberals who acknowledge that social inequalities like racism, sexism, and homophobia are in no small part due to the exercise of expressive liberties. For, how can a resolutely neutral state maintain a commitment to both equality and liberty?

Levin's primary thesis is that liberal egalitarians are mistaken to think that the state ought (and thus can) remain neutral with respect to certain kinds of speech. Indeed, she argues, the liberal egalitarian commitment to treating citizens with equal concern and respect entails that the state ought to use its power qua source of speech actively to combat hate speech and pornography.

Levin's defense of this thesis covers a lot of territory, and not all of it will be either familiar or congenial to every reader. Two chapters canvassing classical liberal thought (focusing on Mill) and a number of contemporary views (focusing on Joseph Raz and Ronald Dworkin) that serve to situate Levin's project are followed by a chapter that admirably outlines the ways in which J. L. Austin's speech act theory has been appropriated by feminist and critical race theorists to render intelligible their claims that certain types of speech can literally subordinate and silence. Less successful, in my view, are Chapters 5 and 6, which Levin herself takes to represent a signal virtue of her work: its weaving together of Anglo-American analytic liberal political philosophy with work from the Continental tradition (represented here by Foucault, Derrida, and Judith Butler). It is not at all clear that Levin's main argument requires anything like this arsenal, and this reader, at least, found a good deal of this material distracting rather than illuminating. In the final two chapters, Levin compares U.S. First Amendment jurisprudence and Canadian and European approaches to problematic speech. These are of particular interest, especially as they serve to illustrate how Levin's theoretical picture might be realized in actual policy. In sum, the capacious scope of the book ensures that, whether or not one accepts Levin's conclusions, most readers will learn something new or, equally valuably, come to see something familiar in a different light.

To bring out some of the novelty of Levin's account and to illustrate some of the useful questions the book raises, I'll focus my remarks on just two issues -- both as they are connected to speech: first, Levin's claim that a commitment to treating citizens with equal concern and respect entails an 'activist [non-neutral] state', and second, given the reality of democratic politics, whether Levin's optimism about the efficacy of such an activist state is justified.

Dworkin, to whom we owe the idea that a just liberal democratic state will treat its citizens with equal concern and respect, insists that this requirement entails that the state respect a fundamental individual right to what he calls 'moral independence' that, in turn, requires the state to remain neutral about competing conceptions of the good. Thus, for Dworkin, stringent protections of speech are vital in liberal democracies. How does Levin argue to the contrary?

According to Levin, Dworkin rather under-describes how equal concern and respect are related. He thinks that our capacity for suffering and frustration warrants the state's treating us with equal concern as well as grounds the state's treating us with equal respect, where this just means its leaving us alone to make our own plans regarding the good life. Quite correctly, Levin points out that this vision ignores that some of the "suffering and frustration that is visited upon a minority by a majority is of such a nature as to be systemic and institutionalized (33)." Adopting the subordination and silencing arguments advanced by some feminist critics of pornography and by critical race theorists, Levin argues that racist and sexist speech renders affected minorities "incapable of remedying [their] situation" through the traditional channels of remedy (33). In short, individuals internally and externally constructed as inferior by discriminatory speech simply cannot confront or undo its effects by engaging in more speech. Cultural oppression undermines its victims' confidence that they have the power and authority to speak, while promoting their oppressors' power and authority to ignore or fail to respect whatever counter-speech victims do engage in. The state manifests a meaningful commitment to treating its citizens with equal concern and respect when it acknowledges that it has the unique power and authority to level the attitudinal playing field, as it were.

Crucially, Levin does not think that the state's intervention in speech should take the form of censorship. Rather, she holds that the state should engage in persuasive, non-coercive advocacy, publicly countering the anti-egalitarian attitudes and practices evident in and enacted by hate speech and pornography. This does not mean that Levin is opposed to laws regulating speech. On the contrary, she argues that judicial speech about inegalitarian speech (that is, free speech jurisprudence) is "the most powerful weapon [in the liberal egalitarian's] arsenal (170)." Indeed, Levin contends that, to the extent that the liberal state does not deploy the law to articulate its alleged commitment to treating all its citizens with equal concern and respect, it is itself complicit in maintaining cultural oppression.

Levin deploys two strategies to convince us of the unique role that the state, through law, can play in addressing and (perhaps) eliminating cultural oppression. The first is theoretical. Drawing on Foucault's notion of a discourse and Butler's view of the essential historicity and semantic elasticity of linguistic terms, Levin argues that state speech can never be neutral. Hence, specifically with respect to juridical speech -- that is, the discourse of law -- the state itself constructs and maintains social categories and, more importantly, sets a meta-framework for how individual speech acts are to be understood. So, for example, in the United States, the state is responsible, through its judicial branch, for hate speech and pornography being protected speech under the First Amendment. Every case in which First Amendment concerns are taken to trump equal protection, say, further reinforces the state's particular view about what speech is sanctioned. If the state's discourse manifests these powers, then the state can use its discursive powers to undo or reconstruct societal attitudes and beliefs.

One need not, I think, adopt ideas from Continental thinkers to see the point. The law is a seat of power and influence, and U.S. Supreme Court opinions are rarely overturned. However, there is the 'small' issue of the U.S. Constitution. It does not 'speak' as clearly and comprehensively as some would like regarding contemporary issues, but there is no getting around its controlling force. No matter how well-intentioned the judiciary, judges may not uphold unconstitutional laws on the grounds that doing so improves the lives of some citizens.

Levin, of course, acknowledges that the U.S. legal system is, by contrast to the Canadian system, less amenable to putting into practice the kind of state activism she would like to see with respect to problematic speech. Her second strategy, then, is descriptive, showing us how the Canadian Supreme Court working with the Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms does indeed allow for the required activism. The Charter's first clause reads, "The Canadian Charter of Rights and Freedoms guarantees the rights and freedoms set out in it subject to such reasonable limits prescribed by law as can be demonstrably justified in a free and democratic society." Under the Canadian regime, rights are not primarily conceived, as they are in the United States, as abstract, individual protections presumed by default to be inviolable by state action. Rather, from the outset, it is clear that what rights citizens have and the ways in which those rights may be exercised are subject to contextual review.

Levin provides a succinct and very useful comparison between two U.S. cases, Brandenburg v. Ohio (1969) and R.A.V. v. St. Paul (1992), and the Canadian hate speech case, R. v. Keegstra (1990). In Brandenburg, the U.S. Supreme Court struck down Ohio's criminal syndicalism law as overbroad. Brandenburg's speech at a KKK rally, it opined, was not directed at inciting violent action against Jews and African Americans and thus did not constitute 'fighting words'. Indeed, Brandenburg's speech was political speech and deserving of First Amendment protections. Lack of viewpoint neutrality, rather than over-breadth, was the problem said to face St. Paul's hate crime ordinance. The ordinance would outlaw hateful speech directed at particular subjects (e.g., racial or religious minorities) but not at others, and it is for that reason unconstitutional.

It is precisely this kind of deference to neutrality that Levin wishes to contest, and Keegstra illustrates what can happen when a court is not so constrained. Keegstra was charged under the Canadian hate propaganda statute for using his high school classroom as a forum to espouse anti-Semitic views. The Canadian Supreme Court acknowledged that the hate propaganda law infringed on citizens' right to freedom of expression in a content-specific way but held that such an infringement is justified in a 'free and democratic society' committed to equality and multiculturalism. Then Chief Justice Dickson was quite explicit about the power of the Court and law to mold societal values. Levin quotes him:

[The hate propaganda statute] serves to illustrate to the public the severe disapprobation with which society holds messages of hate directed towards racial and religious groups. The existence of a particular criminal law, and the process of holding a trial when that law is used, is thus itself a form of expression, and the message sent out is that hate propaganda is harmful to target group members and threatening to a harmonious society. (181)

There is no doubting, then, that the kind of activism vis-à-vis problematic speech that Levin recommends is possible in Canada. However, its chances in the United States are nowhere near as good. There is a deep divide here, not just about the status of rights (individual and almost absolute vs. instrumentally valuable), but also about the proper role of the state. So-called perfectionist liberals will find Levin's thesis most congenial. However, those of us who cannot ignore the substantive political and economic interests of those particular human beings who make up the U.S. Senate, House of Representatives, and, yes, the United States Supreme Court, will remain unconvinced by Levin's clear and passionate argument that the state qua speaker can enact a 'more equal' Union.

The Cost of Free Speech is certainly worth its price. Clear, well organized, and thoroughly argued, it simultaneously provides a non-superficial introduction to the central theoretical issues at the intersection of political philosophy and free speech and significant food for thought for those more familiar with the relevant topics. While, in the end, Levin's activist liberal state may never be realized in the United States, this book makes vivid that liberals can move past the impasse they have thrown up for themselves in construing debates about free speech in terms of an absolute and inevitably irresolvable conflict between liberty and equality. Abigail Levin says, 'Come on, let's really take equality seriously, and see where it leads us.'