Steve Fuller


Steve Fuller, Science, Acumen, 2010, 170pp., $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781844652044.

Rice University

Reviewed by Melinda Bonnie Fagan, Rice University

Steve Fuller's Science challenges widely held assumptions about scientific values, the relation of science to religion, and the significance of the Intelligent Design movement. The book is part of Acumen's Art of Living series, aimed at a general audience. Each volume in the series is a personal reflection on the question: "How should we live?" as this relates to a specific topic: Work, Pets, Faith -- here, Science (ii). Fuller fulfils his brief with a bracingly heterodox account of the values animating scientific inquiry. Science consists of nine substantive chapters, a brief introduction, and a concluding bibliographic essay. Each chapter expands on an overall thesis: "the art of living scientifically involves taking theology much more seriously than either practicing scientists or religious believers are inclined to do" (1). Fuller construes science as a long-term, social enterprise of knowledge-production, which requires justification and support. He locates values necessary for these in the Western intellectual tradition, specifically Christian theology. This characterization of science underwrites Fuller's polemical claim that intelligent design and creationism are more in tune with the ethos of science than some currently established theories, notably Darwinian evolution. Science is thus a rejoinder to recent popular works championing scientific atheism on Darwinian grounds.[1] Though many of its ideas appear in Fuller's previous publications, Science updates earlier arguments and presents his distinctive views to a general audience.

Chapter 1 begins with the question: why value science? One traditional answer is that science improves human life. But as "science's actual track record" includes "mass extinctions, forced sterilizations, gas chambers," and other horrors, our support for science must be on other grounds (5-6). This argument is extremely quick, omitting mention of useful and beautiful products of science. Nonetheless, the conclusion is one many will accept: science aims at "the most comprehensive understanding of reality that is potentially available to all rational beings" (65-66). From this starting point, Fuller articulates an ethos of science grounded in Christian theology. The key idea is that our continued striving toward this lofty goal is sustained by the belief that humans occupy a "cognitively privileged place" in the universe in virtue of having been made in God's image (6). Scientific progress is thus anchored in a specific theological doctrine. On Fuller's view, science and religion do not conflict -- not because they deal with separate domains, but because they are inseparable.

The remaining eight chapters offer support for this unified view of science and theology by indicating correspondences between science and Christian theology at different moments in Western intellectual history. Chapter 2 identifies the university as the institution in which the distinctive features of science as "an art of living" first converged, initiating an inter-generational, long-term project aimed at advancement of knowledge. Chapter 3 examines the rise of scientific disciplines and professional expertise in the nineteenth century, distinguishing three senses of "living scientifically" that came to prominence, respectively, in Germany, England, and France.[2] Chapter 4 introduces "Protscience," the scientific counterpart to Protestant dissent leading to the Reformation. Fuller envisages such projects as alternative medicine, open-source software, and intelligent design as recapitulating the Protestant shift in expert-lay relations, from reliance on expert authority to direct, personal engagement with "the highest form of knowledge" (62). Chapter 5 extends the parallel between science and Protestantism, contrasting their "literalism" in textual interpretation with Catholic interpretive flexibility. Chapter 6 critiques atheism as a scientific worldview. Chapter 7 discusses theodicy, "the original science of intelligent design," which aims to account for our manifestly imperfect world as the product of an all-knowing, all-powerful, and benevolent God (113). Core ideas in contemporary ethics and economics, in particular tolerance of mass suffering for some greater good, are traced to theodicies of Leibniz and Malebranche. Chapter 8 argues that Christian doctrines of grace and imago dei make better sense of the ideal of scientific progress than secular interpretations, which rely on authority of elites. Chapter 9 discusses how future possibilities for science can be altered by engagements with history, "leveraging the past to catapult into the future" (138). The reflexive point is left implicit: Science aims to intervene in the imaginative process of articulating the nature and value of science.

This brief review can do no more than gesture at the many provocative ideas and historical arguments put forward in the interconnected essays of Fuller's Science. I will discuss only two key issues here: Fuller's historical unification of science and religion, and his critique of Darwinism.

Much of Science is historically erudite boundary work.[3] Regarding science and religion, Fuller makes an incisive point: a strict separation of the two today cannot be unambiguously read onto the past or projected into the future. For example, Galileo's telescopic observations are commonly taken to have empirically disconfirmed Biblical doctrines, contributing to scientific progress by advancing a naturalistic worldview. This version of history presumes opposition between science and religion. Fuller gives an alternative interpretation: Galileo suspected Biblical inaccuracy on theological grounds which counseled direct experience of nature as the better guide to knowledge. Theologically glossed, the episode involves no secularization; science and religion remain continuous. The book as a whole recasts science along these lines, demonstrating that an internally consistent view of science as continuous with (Christian) religion is possible.

However, mere consistency is not enough to recommend a view, if alternatives exist. Fuller's claims are controversial, and the arguments in Science are not such as to compel assent. So his unification of science and religion appears somewhat arbitrary. The critique of atheism exemplifies this problem. Fuller begins by distinguishing Atheism, "explicitly anti-God belief in the West," from mere atheism, "the simple denial of religious authority on matters of knowledge and morals" (86-87). He then argues that, while the latter has been fruitful for science, the former has not. To "earn its right … as a positive faith," Atheism must assert something more than the rejection of established religious authority (atheism) plus "the specifically cognitive demands of religion" rooted in Abrahamic theology: "reality as a whole constitutes (i) a universe (not simply multiple realities) with (ii) ontological depth (not simply the sum of direct experience), all of which is (iii) potentially intelligible to the human mind, by virtue of our (divinely?) privileged place in reality" (111). One way Atheism could satisfy this demand is to commit to (i-iii), minus the last parenthetical, plus the thesis that there is no God. Fuller suggests that such a position would be 'mere' atheism: "a secular version of the theological justification for science" (110).

But, assuming Fuller's historical reconstruction is correct, it is not obvious that interpretations of (i-iii) consistent with the Atheist thesis are unavailable. The "specifically cognitive demands of religion" need not be specific to religion. Put another way, why assume the theological stamp on (i-iii) is indelible? A concept of 'objective reality' and criteria of human cognitive distinctiveness are needed to make sense of these theses, and specifying these is a challenging task to be sure. But it is not obvious that the only candidates for success are theological (and Christian). More generally, Fuller does not show that the optimism required for science demands that our cognitive privilege be conceived in relation to a divine creator. This weakens his rebuttal of Atheism, making the unification of science and theology appear coherent but arbitrary.

Another facet of this problem appears in "time travel scenarios" in which past Heroes of Science are transposed in imagination to the present-day. Fuller's rationale for this argumentative device is solid. To make sense of science as a long-term aspirational enterprise, we must be able to represent its ethos as continuous. This requires that past Heroes recognize our science as the descendent of their own inquiries. Time travel scenarios are a literal way of respecting this requirement, respectably Protestant (in Fuller's sense) and calculated to appeal to a general audience. But what should we infer from such thought experiments? Galileo, Fuller reports, would liken our national and international scientific societies to the Vatican (83). This analogy in turn supports an article of Protscience dissent: our current scientific institutions are authoritarian "shackles" on the progressive scientific spirit (62). Even if these counterfactual claims are true (and who could judge this?), if the Vatican is the closest analog of the NAS available to temporally-shifted-Galileo, why should we judge our current situation by the specific points of his (hypothetical) analogy? Continuity with the past does not demand correspondence or identification with it. Fuller indicates one possible interpretation of historical 'experiments' but is silent regarding alternatives. Perhaps his intent is to provoke readers into articulating their own, but the text as written does not invite them.

Another of Science's important and contentious theses is that our scientific establishment brands intelligent design (and other Protscience) 'anti-science' just as Church authorities branded Protestant dissenters 'atheist.' There is, however, a straightforward sense in which intelligent design and young earth creationism (which Fuller also supports as deserving of public funding; 78) are 'anti-science.' Both aim to undermine well-confirmed scientific theories, notably Darwinian evolution. Understandably then, Fuller's defense of intelligent design as "anti-authority yet pro-enquiry" is accompanied by thoroughgoing rejection of Darwinism (146). Though this rejection increases the internal coherence of Fuller's view, his critique of Darwinian evolution is problematic, decreasing the appeal of his position. One problem is that Fuller's conception of Darwinism is ambiguous. His main objections are to "universal Darwinism;" that is, Darwinian evolutionary theory elevated to a comprehensive worldview.[4] But young earth creationism and intelligent design are proposed as alternative explanations for biological phenomena.[5] The arguments in Science conflate Darwinism as a comprehensive worldview with Darwinism as a scientific theory that provides satisfying explanations in a more limited domain. Fuller has little to say about the latter, suggesting that the only explanation it can offer for knowledge-seeking is "curiosity," and that its only models are adaptationist (34, 43). This sweeping indictment ignores the diversity of models in contemporary evolutionary biology, as well as ongoing research in evolutionary epistemology, animal cognition, and integrative models of biological and cultural evolution. But the general audience for whom the book is intended might take Fuller's arguments to address current evolutionary theory rather than an ideology that is sometimes associated with it. In this way, the book could propagate misrepresentations of evolutionary theory.

Fuller's treatment of 'non-evolutionary biology' raises similar concerns. He begins with a valuable insight: not all biological inquiry rests on Darwinian premises. In particular, molecular biology often proceeds without reference to evolutionary models.[6] But the lesson Fuller draws from this is not that biology (among other scientific fields) is pluralistic, but that the unifying role of the Modern Synthesis is a sham, a defensive posture taken when "biologists feel collectively under threat" (79). Fuller seeks to drive a wedge between Darwinian ideas and highly innovative fields associated with "an engineering approach": molecular biology, nanotechnology, bioengineering, and computational and synthetic biology.[7] He rightly notes that these fields are rife with "design language," relatively autonomous from evolutionary biology, and proceed by creative experimentation, innovating new ways of gaining knowledge (41). By highlighting these features, Fuller seeks to align these fields with intelligent design and against Darwinism, underwriting the claim that design language advances science in general (39). But this boundary work ignores evolutionary biology as a distinct field of study with close ties to genetics, in effect treating evolution as a bit of branding for the current scientific establishment. This is not a fair representation of the science we have.

Fuller's most principled objection to Darwinism is that it rejects "humanity's privileged position vis-à-vis a divine creator" (105). Natural selection entails "metaphysical leveling" -- we are just one species among many, doomed to eventual extinction, with no "divine spark" animating our efforts to know and act (112). Fuller suggests that, consistently applied, a Darwinian worldview leads to resignation, skepticism, and despair; an existential situation he attributes (with perhaps more confidence than current Darwin scholarship warrants) to Darwin himself. But this characterization ignores another fundamental component of Darwinian processes: variation. That all species are subject to the same natural processes does not entail that all are alike. Fuller assumes that the only reasonable normative position a Darwinist could take is "species equality" -- and that, since all have equal status, there is nothing distinctively valuable about humanity. This is one way to apply Darwinian ideas to normative questions, but hardly the only one. The bearing of natural selection on human values is currently unsettled. Working out these relations is an exciting joint project for biology, psychology, and philosophy, among other fields. It is far from obvious that Darwinian explanations of our capacities for understanding and morality will end in resignation and skepticism, though current accounts are speculative and incomplete. But this is the inevitable situation of all "living science."

Fuller's tendency to ignore variation (in Darwinism) and pluralism (in science more generally) is consistent with the theme of monism, which runs throughout the book. Its basic premise is that science is unified by a single ethos, oriented toward a single ideal end. In seeking historical understanding, Fuller looks for the single point of origin of an idea; support for science converges on the source narrative for the main monotheistic religions (the story of Abraham). Historical periods and moments are discussed in terms of a single exemplar; a Great Man who represents the dominant scientific ethos of his place and time. This consistent monism gives Fuller's argument a powerful internal coherence. But it leads him to ignore normative prospects for values associated with pluralism -- notably tolerance, an idea with powerful implications for both religion and science.

Fuller's Science offers a distinctive and provocative perspective on the value of science. It will be of interest to those concerned with history of science, relations of science and religion, and the role of values in science. Written in an informal style, the book (or portions thereof) would be suitable for undergraduate courses in history of science, science and society, or philosophy of biology. But its intended audience is not limited to the classroom. The book is brief and accessible, its first and last chapters peppered with references from popular culture as well as Western intellectual history. Its striking analogies and vivid examples will provoke responses from any reader: Dr. Strangelove as the apotheosis of faith in scientific progress (7); Eddington's Two Tables prefigured in the duality of the Eucharist (45-46); computer simulation as a form of counterfactual "middle knowledge" approximating the mind of God; the prospect of "post-Christian biotechnology" removing the taint of Original Sin by genomic intervention (140). Fuller's Science should succeed handily in its aim: to spur philosophical thought in the general public.

[1] E.g., Dawkins, R. (2006) The God Delusion. Boston: Houghton-Mifflin; Dennett, D. (2006) Breaking the Spell. New York: Viking; Dawkins, R. (2009) The Greatest Show on Earth. New York: Free Press.

[2] Chapter 3 is organized in triples -- or trinities.

[3] Gieryn, T. (1999) Cultural Boundaries of Science: Credibility on the Line. Chicago: Chicago University Press.

[4] Dennett, D. (1995) Darwin's Dangerous Idea. NY: Simon & Schuster.

[5] It is on these grounds that intelligent design proponents argue for its inclusion in US high school biology classes.

[6] There is also plenty of research that deals in both; e.g., molecular evolution and (more recently) Darwinian systems explanations.

[7] Pauly, P. (1987) Controlling Life: Jacques Loeb and the Engineering Ideal in Biology. New York: Oxford University Press.