2011.02.34

Peter Sloterdijk

Rage and Time: A Psychopolitical Investigation

Peter Sloterdijk, Rage and Time: A Psychopolitical Investigation, Mario Wenning (tr.), Columbia University Press, 2010, 248pp., $34.50 (hbk), ISBN 9780231145220.

Reviewed by Duane H. Davis, The University of North Carolina at Asheville; Pontificia Universidade Católica do Paraná, Brazil


Peter Sloterdijk is a clever man. His fame and infamy hinge on his keen ability to provoke controversy and serve up a feast of grilled sacred cows -- most recently in his critiques of the welfare state and genetics. His 2006 work, Zorn und Zeit, now appears in English translation as Rage and Time. This book will delight and infuriate readers; and it will certainly entertain. It is perfect for an audience who can't quite fathom Žižek's jokes.

There is a legion (or lesion?) of intellectual critics who were once radical thinkers -- or considered themselves to be, at any rate -- but eventually each one lost faith in the ability to change the world: Jean Baudrillard, Bernard-Henri Lévy, and Sloterdijk do not agree with one another in their provocative socio-political critiques. Unfortunately, all too frequently, they do not bother to agree with themselves in their mass-production of glossy-covered pap. These popular essayists are less concerned with wisdom than provocation and persuasion -- and the only love visible in their works is self-love. Of course, not all books need to be rigorous or philosophical.

Please do not misunderstand: if you have never read one of these sorts of books, you must! Each one provides a picture of our hellish world complete with a free hand basket. One is more likely to find them in popular bookstores than academic ones. Here, Sloterdijk argues that our age is doomed because of our inability to understand and address our rage. He turns our attention back to Plato's account of thymos (all too briefly) as an integral part of our soul and of our society. Contemporary society, by contrast, has either relegated our spirit and its rage to political incorrectness or else appealed to rage in unfortunate and often destructive ways. Along the way, Sloterdijk offers glosses on Marxism, capitalism, psychoanalysis, Christianity, Judaism, and Islam. He frames each of these movements in terms of what he terms their "thymotic" aspects. His accounts are irreverent, often interesting, playful, perhaps dangerously misleading, and worst of all obstructive of real critique.

The book is divided into a long introduction, four chapters, and a tiny conclusion. The introduction begins with the historical observation that rage has figured into our literature from the beginning. "Europe's first word" is the rage of Achilles. Sloterdijk describes our heroes as "guardians of rage." (p. 11) Our ancient heroes and our gods rage, and the depth of our literature and presumably our culture are found in the understanding of rage. Rage is not an accidental affect, but bespeaks our existential situation -- hence the playful allusion to Heidegger's Sein und Zeit in Sloterdijk's title, Zorn und Zeit. He implies that we must re-think our modern conceptions of society, self, and justice in thymotic terms. Thus, psychoanalysis is correct to disclose the depth of the soul beneath consciousness, but wrong in its reduction of thymos to eros. Thymos, Sloterdijk asserts, is fundamental rather than a by-product of erotic energy. Society, and not only the self, needs to be rethought in thymotic terms. Sloterdijk insists that political states are "thymotic unities" best analyzed in terms of tensions of spirit, resulting in rage. The introduction continues in a historical manner, addressing the ways Nietzsche, capitalism, Marxism, and religions have dealt with rage. Sloterdijk calls for a return to Platonic attention to thymos (though not to his idealism) in order to refocus on the thymotic aspects of our lives and overcome the destructive aspects of modernity and postmodernity. This sets the stage for Sloterdijk's analysis in the subsequent chapters.

Chapter One, Rage Transactions, asks us to acknowledge that we see today a disturbing hostility in all aspects of our society. Domestic politics leads us to hostile impasses, while international politics are fraught with menacing acts of terror and revenge. Sloterdijk interestingly frames these phenomena in terms of structures of rage. Revenge is the project of rage. Revolution is described as a rage bank, where rage is stored up as capital. Marxist readers will be infuriated by the deliberate use of capitalist metaphors throughout the book to describe topics like alienation, revolution, class consciousness, etc. Sloterdijk offers an amazingly tendentious gloss -- even for him -- of Lenin and Mao as "the most successful entrepreneurs of rage," (p. 64) who propagated pure negativity designed to produce revolution, "a day of mass rage." "With [Lenin] begins the century of the big business of rage." (p. 68) Presumably revolutionaries of all types are to be understood as making transactions in a rage bank. Sloterdijk continues this direction of analysis in chapter three.

Chapter Two, The Wrathful God, turns our attention to religion as an instrument of rage. Religion is depicted as a "metaphysical rage bank." As ever, Sloterdijk provokes readers of all types with his irreverent accounts of all three major Western religions as well as current tensions related to religious dogma. For example, he likens the way Duchamp shook up the art world to Osama bin Laden's political actions. (p. 75) God is depicted as the "king of rage," while religions create narratives of their plights that draw interest in their rage banks. Christians, Jews, and Muslims all have been persecuted, and therefore deserve to rage, just as their God has raged, against their persecutors. The irreverent rhetoric is delicious, and no doubt infuriating to believers. Sloterdijk considers various aspects of religious dogma in light of his account of rage banks. For example, his cleverly titled section "In Praise of Purgatory" describes the sublimation of expressions of rage in economic and physiological metaphors.

Chapter Three, The Rage Revolution, continues the attack upon Marxism and deepens the framing of the history of Marxist revolutionaries as irresponsible propagators of negativity. Sloterdijk quips that in the 1960s and 1970s youth in Europe and the United States identified themselves as Maoists, for example, solely out of ignorance and naiveté -- "coquettish admirers." (p. 175) He lashes out at any and all advocates of Marxist thought in the past century. Most often these broadsides are clever, if unsupported. For example, Sloterdijk asserts that Jean-Paul Sartre was "a master in the sublime art of not being willing to learn." (p. 175) This name-calling and provocation is somehow alluring while being distracting and vacuous. After having finished the third chapter of the book, the reader will most likely react in the same manner as to a marathon series of re-runs on late night television: eyes glazed, transfixed, and inert, one turns to the next chapter.

Chapter Four, The Dispersion of Rage in the Era of the Center, begins by framing our current situation as a transition from the twentieth-century failure of top-down theory to the twenty-first-century failure to generate a bottom-up reaction. Thus, Sloterdijk tars the Marxian theorists of the previous century and the current post-Marxist collectivists with the same brush: the fruit of their labor is a generation of disgust. They have spawned a cultural malaise that produces a "molecular civil war." (p. 211) Presumably the molecularization typical of the malaise of our age is manifest in that "nowhere do we find an articulation of a vision that would provide perspectives for an accumulation capable of action." (p. 184) That last passage, incidentally, might serve as an apt description of Sloterdijk's book. At times, one almost wonders whether Sloterdijk is pining for some authentic kind of solidarity. It is clear that everything is all wrong, but remarkably unclear as to what would make it all right -- or even the least bit better.

While it may be unclear quite what he means by "molecular civil war," it is all too clear that he blames all collectivists as irresponsible pot-stirrers and troublemakers -- as if capitalism were a bastion of responsibility in its own calls to arms. It seems that rage-traders like Sarah Palin, Glenn Beck, and Rush Limbaugh are fine examples of irresponsible provocation to violence; i.e., the suicide attack on the tax building in Texas or the attempted assassination and mass murder in Tucson. There really is a market for rage, and there really are consequences to the incendiary invective of these tycoons of the rage-slaves.

Sloterdijk seriously underestimates both the promise and the peril of various de-centered political movements. If one thing has emerged in recent geo-political discourse, it is the recognition that a variety of people have been disenfranchised by traditional accounts of who has standing in the discussion. This is nothing to glibly dismiss! Worse, his glosses of Marxists, Christians, Jews, and Muslims are tied together only to assert that they didn't manage their investments well in the rage banks. He condemns all of these movements reductively, cavalierly, and cynically as bringing about their own demise: "the self-destruction of the superfluous." The chapter strings together a series of caustic assertions about a variety of unrelated topics from Ponzi schemes to Albanian and Romanian post-communist rip-offs. But one is left to wonder what does matter -- or if, by his account, anything could matter anymore.

Of course, Sloterdijk misses no chance to indict. So he includes an account of four reasons why no solution could emerge to the abuses of capitalism from within, either: (1) "In the present, no movements and parties are visible that could once again take on the function of a world bank for the utopian-prophetic use of thymotic impulses"; (2) "contemporary conditions … defeat most various variations of fundamentalist thinking"; (3) "the change of [rage's] collection media and its organizing myths"; and (4) "the conversion of money-directed civilization to the primacy of eroticism." So: no one is stepping up to lead, the leveling of our age prevents anything with an edge to be taken seriously, the ideological structures are inescapably self-perpetuating, and we have reduced the value of our goods to a love of goods. This all is intended to show that contemporary "neo-con" society is powerless to provide a way out of our situation.

However, having taken a token jab at the right, Sloterdijk returns to place the blame squarely on the left for creating the situation, as he has done throughout his works.

Retrospectively, this spreading disgust makes clear the extent to which the traditional left -- especially its Bolshevist wing but also its more liberal forms -- can be blamed for anthropological and political negligence since it had always assumed that its members of the so-called masses indiscriminately affirmed a neutral and ambivalence-free human community in large social associations. (p. 211)

Sloterdijk's claim here is nothing more than the sophomoric taunt that Marxism is utopian and that it ignores the danger of the proximity of other people. It is remarkable that we have worked through over two hundred pages to get to this point. At least there were pretty witticisms along the way.

Sloterdijk concludes this chapter by turning his attention to the threat of political Islam to be a "potential successor to communism." (p. 220) He states that its alluring mission, its "grandiose worldview," and its demographic field of recruitment make Islam as effective at fomenting discontent as Marxism. (pp. 220-1) Clearly Sloterdijk reduces the significance of political Islam to the same structures he has tendentiously imposed upon all other movements only to dismiss them. Yet he goes further -- dangerously further -- in his rebuke of political Islam. He states that the analogy with communism has its limits.

The coming adherents of the Islamic goal of expansion do not at all resemble a class of workers and employees who unite to seize governmental power in order to put an end to their misery. Rather, they embody an agitated subproletariat or, even worse, a desperate movement of economically superfluous and socially useless people for whom there are too few acceptable positions available in their own system, even if they should get to power through coup d'état or elections. (p. 223)

Obviously, Sloterdijk reduces all aspects of Islamic culture to a univocal economic agency -- one which he goes on to say manifests "an antimodern disposition and dissynchronicity with the modern world." Apparently the crux of the matter is that he thinks Islam will lack market appeal…

And at the end of the chapter, in the final paragraph, Sloterdijk comes to the not so surprising conclusion that "only global capitalism" can serve as the arbiter of its own excesses. "It alone could grow to become its own enemy during the next round of the game, an enemy that excites itself to the point where it has to take itself seriously as a contender who is deciding who is to be and who is not to be." (p. 226) There is at least a little dialectical twist here. But the fact the Sloterdijk reduces the value of all of the other movements he disparages to the values assigned by global capitalism does not establish the familiar hegemony -- the hegemony discussed by the very Marxian and post-Marxian critics he dismissed as superfluous. That Capitalism may consume itself and hence (re)produce itself is an interesting, though hardly original, point. That it is the only story to tell of our age is another matter entirely.

The conclusion, Beyond Resentment, is advisedly short, since Sloterdijk has so very little to conclude. There will be regional collections of rage rather than a monolithic collective. Each of the attempts to forge a grand collective has failed. Yet this failure could be instrumental in the emergence of a new transvaluation of rage. Sloterdijk makes the analogy of contemporary revenge and retributive unhealthy expressions of rage to Nietzschean ressentiment. Sloterdijk muses that this revenge could make for more interesting expressions of rage that overcome the current unhealthy ones. We might begin to respect one another, he seems to say, if we reinterpret our capacity to rage, though as one well suspected from the outset he has absolutely no vision of what this will entail or how to go about it. He ends with whimsy and platitude. This rethinking of rage will allow for us to "stay in balance," to learn to "see oneself always through the eyes of others," to establish "a culture of rationally built second-order observations," and allow us to establish "a new set of interculturally binding disciplines" that could create world culture for the first time. (p. 229)

One does not need to consult the original German to see that Mario Wenning's translation is inadequate in places. Sloterdijk's pithy prose comes through at times, but it is a clunky imitation in many others. Indeed there are some real howlers. For example, when Sloterdijk means to play on Heidegger's dictum that thinking is thanking, to turn our attention to rage and to imply that Heidegger was a bit of a flâneur in the ways that he called our attention back to the Greeks, Wenning renders this very interesting sentence: "Heidegger, who we imagine to be a thoughtful tourist on the planes [sic] of Troy, would probably say: fighting is also thanking." (p. 11-12) I know that I have never been able to get a good flight into Troy! One wonders what the airport code might be…

In an interview after his famous Critique of Cynical Reason appeared, Sloterdijk reportedly shrugged-off criticism of the work and said he did not think it should be taken all that seriously. But he literally banks on the opposite reaction. The danger of his work, and that of the others like him, is that their ironic treatises take the place in the public mind of the work of genuine critique. Pandering obstructs pondering. Rage and Time continues Sloterdijk's meta-cynical exploitation.