2011.03.03

J. Angelo Corlett

The Errors of Atheism

J. Angelo Corlett, The Errors of Atheism, Continuum, 2010, 248pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441158932.

Reviewed by Bradley Monton, University of Colorado at Boulder and Rebecca Chan, University of Colorado at Boulder


J. Angelo Corlett's The Errors of Atheism is a compelling, nuanced look at why agnosticism may be a more tenable position than atheism. Corlett takes for granted that there exist successful refutations of orthodox Christian theism -- in fact, he maintains that the Christian brand of theism is not worthy of the amount of philosophical attention it has received. But he holds that, because atheists focus so much on this "highly problematic" traditional notion of the nature of God, what the atheists are actually doing is refuting "a straw person notion of the nature of God" (p. 92). Because standard atheistic arguments are not applicable to unorthodox theisms, Corlett says, atheists err in claiming victory over theism. Corlett puts on the table a theism that purportedly survives standard atheistic arguments: "hybrid minimalist process-liberationist theology". But Corlett does not definitively endorse this theology: he holds that there are no strong arguments for (or against) it and hence thinks that one should remain agnostic between atheism and the truth of this theology. He calls this position the "New Agnosticism".

In outline, the discussion of the book runs as follows. Chapter 1 defines theism, atheism, and agnosticism, and draws distinctions between weak and strong as well as epistemic and ontological variations of these three positions. Chapter 2 discusses various errors of atheism and lays out multiple fallacies commonly committed by atheists. Chapter 3 looks at Dawkins's specific brand of atheism and concludes the negative argument Corlett puts forth against atheism. Chapter 4 sets the initial stage for the positive portion of Corlett's argument by listing six desiderata for a New Agnosticism that is resistant to atheism. Chapters 5 and 6 present two aspects of a hybrid, minimalist theism that Corlett believes withstands atheistic attacks. These two chapters draw their essential features from, respectively, process theology and liberation theology. Chapter 7 anticipates and addresses potential objections to the hybrid minimalist theism. Corlett concludes by discussing the significance of his position in the dialogue between atheism and theism, maintaining that his New Agnosticism forces atheists and theists to consider less extreme, and more plausible, positions with respect to the question of the existence of God.

So what are the errors of atheism that the title of Corlett's book refers to? While Corlett presents various fallacies that atheists ostensibly fall prey to, they boil down to two main errors. First, he says that atheists commit the fallacy of equivocation between atheism and agnosticism. Corlett holds that atheists sometimes define atheism in probabilistic terms, but they are wrong to do so. In fact, according to Corlett, anyone who claims that it is improbable -- even highly improbable -- that God exists is an agnostic. Corlett says that prominent, self-proclaimed atheists commit this error and misidentify themselves as atheists when they are really agnostics.

The second main error that atheists ostensibly commit is that they treat orthodox Christianity as their most worthy, or sole, opponent. Defeat of orthodox Christianity is then treated as defeat of theism, which Corlett claims is an unwarranted conclusion due to the existence of more plausible, unorthodox theisms.

Regarding the difference between atheism and agnosticism, one might think that this is just a matter of terminology and hence not worthy of any sort of extended philosophical discussion. In fact, this is what we are inclined to think. But Corlett takes the distinction seriously. "Epistemological atheism" is defined by Corlett as the position that "one knows that it is not the case that God exists (weak version), or one knows that it is not the case that God's existence is even possible or that God can exist (strong version)" (p. 33). And "ontological atheism" is defined as the position that "it is not the case that God exists" (weak version) or "it is not the case that God's existence is even possible" (strong version). Corlett contrasts this with, for example, the position of a "positive ontological agnostic", who holds that "it is probable that God exists", and a "negative ontological agnostic", who holds that "it is probable that it is not the case that God exists" (p. 32).

This sort of presentation makes it sound as if one has to be subjectively certain that God doesn't exist to consider oneself an atheist. Indeed, in contrasting ontological agnosticism with ontological atheism, Corlett says that "The ontological agnostic claims that there is insufficient reason to affirm or deny with certitude (at least for the time being and lacking further evidence) either theism or atheism" (p. 32, our emphasis). We think that Corlett is setting an unreasonable standard for atheism (and, by parity, theism) if "knowing that it is not the case that God exists" involves absolute certainty in one's subjective degree of belief. This requires an atheist to be as certain about the non-existence of God as she is that 2+2=4. While there probably are some atheists who are like that, it seems reasonable to count people as atheists without requiring them to be so dogmatic.

Interestingly, while in Chapter 1 Corlett spends a lot of time justifying his extreme non-probabilistic characterization of atheism, in a footnote in Chapter 2 he presents a more moderate view. First, in the main body of the text he writes: "just as the responsible theist will be a fallibilist, so will the thoughtful atheist". Then, in the footnote attached to that sentence, he goes on to say:

One way in which atheism expresses its fallibilism is by stating the denial of God's existence in probabilistic terms, just as the theist might express the existence of God inductively. In this way, there is a certain agnostic tempering of theism and atheism, respectively. Only their infallibilist cousins seem to be quite different from agnosticism. (p. 60)

This sounds right to us, though it does raise the question of how to draw the line between fallibilist atheism and agnosticism. A reasonable position to take is that the distinction is in fact blurred and cannot be articulated non-arbitrarily, but that the distinction does exist. Those who assign a probability of 0 to the hypothesis that God exists are clearly atheists, and those who assign a probability of 0.5 are clearly agnostic, but whether those who assign a probability of, say, 0.25 are atheists or agnostics might be unclear. Perhaps a more fine-grained approach that takes degrees of belief into account is more appropriate than attempting to classify people as strictly atheistic or agnostic. (For some more arguably insightful thoughts on degrees-of-belief-based analyses of agnosticism, see Monton 1998, Hájek 1998, and van Fraassen 1998.)

Let's now turn to the second main error of atheism. Corlett holds that atheists myopically focus on orthodox Christianity and unfairly treat a defeat of that view as a defeat of theism. Corlett says that this is unwarranted because hybrid minimalist process-liberationist theology is more plausible than orthodox Christianity. We agree with Corlett here, to an extent. The philosophy of religion literature that contemporary Western English-speaking atheist philosophers tend to focus on is largely produced by contemporary Western English-speaking philosophers of religion, the majority of whom are Christians. It would be better if variant versions of theism were discussed more often in the contemporary Western English-speaking philosophy of religion debates.

Unfortunately, Corlett does a better job making the general point -- that atheists are too often focused on philosophers who endorse orthodox Christianity -- than he does getting into the details and pointing out specific errors that specific atheist philosophers have made. There is a section discussing Richard Dawkins, but atheist philosophers could reasonably maintain that Corlett's focusing on Dawkins is straw-personing atheism.

Moreover, even after reading Corlett we are not convinced that there is a widespread problem in the arguments of atheists here. At least some of the arguments that orthodox Christian philosophers give are actually arguments for theism more generally, without the requirements that the God being argued for is even omnipotent or omniscient (traits that God lacks according to Corlett's preferred version of theism). Consider for example William Lane Craig's (1979) version of the kalam cosmological argument, or Robin Collins' (2002) version of the fine-tuning argument, or J.P. Moreland's (2008) version of the argument from consciousness. In each of these cases we have Christian philosophers arguing for the existence of God, but they're not arguing distinctively for the existence of the Christian God, or even for a God who is omnipotent and omniscient.

Part of the way Corlett makes the point that atheists focus too much on orthodox Christianity is by presenting an unorthodox theism that purportedly withstands the atheistic critiques to which orthodox theisms are vulnerable. Corlett maintains that his preferred version of unorthodox theism, hybrid minimalist process-liberationist theism, is not convincing enough to generate theistic belief, but it is a theism that, according to Corlett, is untouched by extant atheist arguments. Thus he maintains that the best position to take is one of agnosticism.

Corlett presents his preferred theistic view by first, in Chapter 5, presenting an intriguing account of process theology and then, in Chapter 6, talking about liberation theology. These two chapters take up almost half the book.

According to Corlett, this process theology is compatible with our best science and understands God as the ground for the universe, but does not attribute to God the "hyperbolic" attributes of omniscience or omnipotence. Corlett does, however, say that God is omnibenevolent, and he offers a theodicy to account for the existence of evil. God, lacking omnipotence, does not possess the power to create a world that would be free of natural evil (p. 132).

One noteworthy version of process theology Corlett presents is panentheism, which holds that God is ever-present in the universe, though God and the universe are not co-extensive. Because God is immanent, panentheism seems robust enough to qualify as theistic, even though God is neither omnipotent nor omniscient. Panentheism is, according to Corlett, not obviously vulnerable to the standard atheistic arguments, so even if it is an unwarranted position to hold, denying it may prove difficult. Corlett says that until atheists demonstrate that there is sufficient warrant to deny it, agnosticism is the appropriate position.

Our main concern with Corlett's presentation of process theology is that he does not do a lot to actually argue for this view. To an extent, this is understandable, because he's not claiming that the view is true; he's just claiming that it's a reasonable position that's immune to the standard atheistic arguments. But even to defend his claim of reasonableness, we would like to see more in the way of argument.

While the chapter on process theology is focused on Corlett's ultimate goal of presenting agnosticism as a better position to hold than atheism, the subsequent chapter regarding liberation theology lacks comparable direction. Liberation theologies emphasize the political and ethical components of religion, and Corlett begins Chapter 6 by emphasizing the need for these components in any minimally adequate theism. He says that "a plausible theology must become political" (p. 150).

We'll raise three problems with Corlett's presentation of liberation theology. First, attributing a particular moral and political philosophy to God is not actually necessary for theism; for instance, there could (arguably) be a possible world without moral agents where God exists. Corlett seems to think that process theology benefits from being supplemented by a political theology, but we don't see how adding any sort of political theology helps with our fundamental understanding of God. The political theology might be important if it were being used to solve the problem of evil, but Corlett already has a solution (making reference to God's non-omnipotence). The account of justice Corlett puts forward is perhaps interesting, but it's not fundamental to understanding the nature of God.

Second, multiple times Corlett asserts that "to know God is to do justice" (e.g., p. 162). He asserts this without explanation or qualification, but it seems clear that he's treating this as a core idea of liberation theology. If this is taken as a literal identity claim, then the self-proclaimed atheist who is doing justice knows God. Presumably this is false, so Corlett's claim should not be interpreted that way. It's not clear to us how it should be interpreted.

Finally, Corlett says that his book is presenting a "minimal" unorthodox theism -- his stated goal is to not make the view too specific, so as to ensure that it is more plausible than orthodox Christianity. But Corlett's advocacy of his preferred versions of distributive and retributive justice, which makes up the vast majority of the chapter, is quite controversial. For example, Corlett endorses the ideology of Malcolm X over that of Martin Luther King and says that "some folk will and should receive their just deserts even by way of violence" (p. 155). He advocates revolution: "the Kantian moral permission to reform must at times be replaced with the Marxian call for revolt" (p. 160). Also, he says that Christian orthodoxy seeks to maintain the economic and political status quo and is "a theology of oppression", but "God's faithful will be identified and identifiable as those who side with los pobres, the struggling masses" (p. 159).

This preoccupation with the correct account of justice detracts from what we take to be Corlett's essential point -- that we might understand God as a being or force that, in some sense, moves people to act morally or justly. As Corlett writes, "God is that ultimate spiritual reality extant in the universe seeking to bring everything into a harmonious whole amidst the human frailties of greed, avarice, egoism, and all manner of wrongdoing motivated by them" (p. 215). In laying out his preferred version of theism, Corlett tentatively rejects the existence of an afterlife, so we can see how this version of God, focused on harmony in this universe, is an unorthodox one. Presenting this unorthodox conception of God does potentially help to demonstrate that there are unorthodox theistic positions that are not vulnerable to standard atheistic arguments.

In sum: Corlett's overall project, while not without its flaws, is worthwhile and compelling. Atheism and theism are not the only competitors in the game, and any fruitful dialogue about the existence of God must involve agnosticism. Moreover, process theology has not gotten much discussion in current philosophy of religion debates; perhaps Corlett's presentation of his particular version of process theology will help change that. Corlett doesn't present much of an argument for his preferred theology, but he doesn't have to -- he's an agnostic, not a theist. It's worth thinking about whether any plausible arguments for that theology could be given.

References

Craig, William Lane (1979), The Kalam Cosmological Argument, London: The MacMillan Press.

Collins, Robin (2002), "God, Design, and Fine-Tuning", in Raymond Martin and Christopher Bernard (eds.), God Matters: Readings in the Philosophy of Religion, New York: Longman Press. (Updated version available at http://home.messiah.edu/~rcollins/Fine-tuning/ft.htm.)

Hájek, Alan (1998), "Agnosticism Meets Bayesianism", Analysis 58: 199-206.

Monton, Bradley (1998), "Bayesian Agnosticism and Constructive Empiricism", Analysis 58: 207-212.

Moreland, J.P. (2008), Consciousness and the Existence of God: A Theistic Argument, New York: Routledge.

van Fraassen, Bas (1998), "The Agnostic Subtly Probabilified", Analysis 58: 212-220.