2011.03.08

David V. Ciavatta

Spirit, the Family, and the Unconscious in Hegel's Philosophy

David V. Ciavatta, Spirit, the Family, and the Unconscious in Hegel's Philosophy, SUNY Press, 2009, 264pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781438428703.

Reviewed by Timothy Brownlee, Xavier University


In the Phenomenology of Spirit, Hegel famously argues that self-consciousness depends essentially on the recognition of others and that active engagement in practices of recognizing and being recognized by others is a necessary condition for being an agent or a self. In recent years, interpreters have worked to couple Hegel's early treatment of reciprocal recognition with the account of rational institutions that Hegel offers in the Philosophy of Right by arguing that recognition in fact requires institutional mediation. One of the primary virtues of David V. Ciavatta's Spirit, the Family, and the Unconscious in Hegel's Philosophy is that it provides a concrete account of how one particular institution, that of the family, provides an enduring framework for recognition between subjects. Indeed, Ciavatta contends that the family constitutes, for Hegel, the "most foundational, comprehensive … form of recognition" structuring and informing our experience of ourselves, others, and the world, and he demonstrates that this recognition is importantly unique, insofar as it is primarily unreflective and unconscious, the product more of affective relations than of reflective endorsement. (2) Ciavatta's book will be of interest to students of Hegel's practical philosophy and German idealism, to phenomenologists (especially those concerned with embodiment, intersubjective relations and sociality, and identity), and to those with interests in the intersections between philosophy and psychoanalysis.

Methodologically, Ciavatta's work falls within a long phenomenological tradition of interpreting Hegel, and he stresses "Hegel's unswerving commitment to describing the concrete, lived experience of human practical existence on its own terms." (2) Thematically, he demonstrates that Hegel shares the view, common among phenomenologists, that the unreflective and affective dimensions of our experience disclose "certain truths about our relation to the world that can only be appreciated in [an] unreflective, lived way." (10) At the same time, Ciavatta argues that, in place of a transcendental ego, Hegel conceives of the self who experiences as essentially social and, in fact, constituted through concrete relations of recognition. By consequence, he stresses that, for Hegel, intersubjective relations inform not only our identities as selves, but even our most basic perceptual experiences. Drawing on the account of mastery and slavery in the Phenomenology as exemplary, Ciavatta claims that the slave's "very contact with the concrete world is informed and contextualized on all sides by the presence of the master, and, in particular, by his recognition of the master as the only true center of experience." (34) It is in this sense that "spirit," which Ciavatta takes to consist in "the concrete practices of recognition that join selves concretely to one another," indelibly informs and shapes our experiences of ourselves, others, and the world. (37) However, Ciavatta stresses that these enduring patterns of recognition themselves depend essentially on unreflective habits and customs, which are expressed just as much in immediate affects and feelings as they are in explicit and reflected beliefs and convictions. Ciavatta therefore argues that the habitual and customary domain of "ethical life" (Sittlichkeit) informs not merely our practical relations to one another, but also our own sense of self and our relationship to the world we encounter through perception.

Having established, in Part I, the centrality of spirit -- practices of intersubjective recognition grounded in the settled customs and habits of ethical life -- to the constitution of our identities and experience, Ciavatta turns, in Part II, to show how the family constitutes an essential and relatively autonomous sphere of ethical life in which unconscious and unreflective affect provides the primary medium of intersubjective relationships. His account of the family as an ethical institution focuses on the significant discussions of the family from the Phenomenology and the Philosophy of Right. While each discussion addresses different historical configurations of the family (the Phenomenology account considers the institution of the family in an early form of the ancient Greek polis, while the Philosophy of Right account considers the modern bourgeois family), Ciavatta argues that both share a number of features. Most importantly, he stresses that Hegel consistently portrays the family as an institution governed by the "law of singularity," according to which the kinds of ethical obligations governing family life are not universalizable, but rather particular to those concrete individuals to whom one is related.

The kind of recognition which participation in the family both affords and requires is itself singular and non-substitutable. Unlike in civil society, where everyone is recognized as the equal bearer of a shared identity, that is, as a person, "Family relationships are, on Hegel's account, primarily oriented around a commitment to recognizing the ethical weight of family members' concrete singularity as such -- their concrete 'thisness' and 'non-substitutability' as selves." (57) At the same time, being a member of a family shapes the individual's identity, such that she comes to identify herself as a member of a tightly-woven social unit of which she is essentially only a part. Finally, Ciavatta argues that the family plays an important role in transforming nature, which is otherwise indifferent or even hostile to us, into a meaningful and properly human domain. Through funeral rites, the family "spiritualizes" our experience of death by transforming it into a site of intersubjective recognition. Ciavatta presents an original account of the way in which marriage transforms our natural desires and bodies such that one spouse comes to experience his or her own body as mediated by the will and perspective of the other spouse.

Since the primary bond of family life is the unconscious one of affect, Ciavatta provides, in Part III, a detailed account of Hegel's treatment of "feeling" in the Philosophy of Spirit's "Anthropology." Ciavatta stresses that feeling constitutes "a manner in which the world's import discloses itself at a prereflective, preconscious level," prior to the division between subject and object characteristic of consciousness. (13) Ciavatta focuses on the ways in which feeling informs one's own "sense of self," and because felt experience is not completely reducible to conscious reflection, he suggests that the discussion of feeling can help us to understand Hegel's conception of individual character, "that distinctive, enduring, and essentially unreflective way of approaching the world that underlies and colors our every involvement with our circumstances." (134) Ciavatta exploits this notion of feeling as a kind of experience that does not rest on a conscious distinction between subject and object to make sense of the experience of "being at home" -- in which we do not experience the objects around them as alien and separate, but rather as continuous with our own sense of self -- and the unique intersubjective relationship which Hegel identifies as being in "rapport" with other selves. Ciavatta shows that both experiences, essential to family life, demonstrate important ways in which the self is "porous" and is in fact constituted through experiences structured by relations of intersubjective recognition.

The book concludes with a discussion of the role that property plays in family life. In contrast to the individualist conception of ownership that we find in Hegel's most extensive treatment of property in the Philosophy of Right’s discussion of "abstract right," Ciavatta stresses that the family owns its property collectively and that the family's property in fact provides an objective embodiment of its shared identity. Ciavatta contends that, as an institution of spirit, property should be understood essentially in terms of recognition. He interprets Hegel's notion that familial property constitutes a Vermögen (a capacity to act or do, which can also be understood as a "resource" or, as Knox translates it, "capital") to indicate that Hegel believes that property is important not simply because of its "economic" function in addressing natural needs, but also because of its role in "entrenched practices that build and affirm affective bonds between members (for instance, family dinner rituals, celebrating social occasions, parents playing with children, perusing photo albums, etc.)." (186) At the same time, Ciavatta also argues that property indicates the "dialectical limits" of the family as an ethical institution that rests on and is sustained by public, civic institutions, governed by a "universal logic" at odds with the privileging of singularity which we find in the family. (194) From the standpoint of the family, singular objects (for example, family heirlooms) possess a spiritual significance that no other object could have insofar as the family's self-identity is embodied within them. By contrast, in civil society, property is understood to be alienable from the individual and exchangeable for other goods of comparable value.

On the whole, Ciavatta's book is a valuable contribution to a vibrant conversation in current Hegel scholarship. Given the importance of the connection between recognition and institutions in the recent literature, Ciavatta's careful attention to the details of Hegel's accounts of the family in the Phenomenology and the Philosophy of Right does much to illumine how concrete institutions might actually contribute essentially to the accomplishment of a condition of mutual recognition. Perhaps most importantly, Ciavatta provides a plausible and compelling account of some of the important senses in which Hegel believes that the social institutions and practices of ethical life are grounded in unreflective and unconscious dispositions. He does an admirable job of showing how self-consciousness and reflection arise only against the habitual and unreflective backdrop of settled customs. While Ciavatta stresses that the family best exemplifies this unconscious foundation of ethical life, his account provides a plausible point of departure for showing how participation in other institutions, such as those of civil society and the state, where reflection seems to play a more significant role, also depends on unreflective affects and practices.[1] At the same time, Ciavatta may underplay the extent to which reflection and universal public recognition are essential not only to civic and political institutions, but also to the family. For example, while Ciavatta is no doubt right to stress that marriage cannot be understood exclusively as a pure expression of the married individuals' volition, Hegel insists that the affective bond between spouses becomes a spiritual relationship precisely through the marriage ceremony, specifically through marriage vows, which depend on the public medium of language.[2] That is, even though the family may depend essentially on unreflective affective ties, Hegel insists that, in marriage at least, those ties find their fullest realization in the reflective and concerted resolution of the two spouses.

While Ciavatta's attention to the role that the "law of singularity" plays in the accounts of the family in both the Phenomenology and Philosophy of Right highlights important similarities between the two accounts, he does not address significant differences between them. However, the differing aims of the two works bear importantly on the roles that ethical life and the family play in each. The Phenomenology is supposed to constitute an account of how the standpoint of consciousness -- according to which the distinction between knower and known is fixed and absolute -- can be consistently overcome. Hegel appeals to the idea of recognition there to account for the way in which that standpoint can be left behind even when the object to be known is another knower, and he invokes the idea of ethical life to show how customs and mores mediate relations of intersubjective recognition. However, the idea of intersubjective recognition plays a much less significant role in the account of ethical life in the Philosophy of Right. (We find no significant discussion of "recognition" or any of its cognates in the introduction to the work or in the introductory discussion of "ethical life.") Rather, in the Philosophy of Right Hegel appeals to the idea of ethical life to show that participation in ethical institutions is necessary in order to be free. Since Ciavatta acknowledges that not all relations of recognition are ones of freedom (the relationship between master and slave is an excellent example), it is unfortunate that he does not do more to show how the mature account of freedom can be reconstructed in terms of the idea of recognition.

These differences raise several significant questions for Ciavatta's account of the family. First and foremost, if Hegel's primary aim in the Philosophy of Right is to show that the central institutions of modern social life are free institutions, the specific contribution that the family makes to the achievement of a condition of freedom requires further explanation. It may be that Ciavatta's treatment of the family could provide the materials for such an account. Since he shows that the family makes possible a unique kind of recognition of the individual's singularity and that that recognition is in turn constitutive of the individual's selfhood, it seems reasonable that being a free self depends, in some way, on the family. However, connecting the account of the family in the Philosophy of Right to freedom in this way would require further comment on the specific role that recognition plays in that work.[3] Is the family an institution of freedom simply because it makes possible a kind of recognition, or is its contribution to freedom different?

Second, we find different presentations of the relationship between the family and other ethical institutions in the early and late accounts. Hegel goes to great pains in the Philosophy of Right to show that free institutions stand in harmonious relation to one another. Even though each constitutes a separate sphere which promotes a different good and contributes to the realization of freedom in a different way, he stresses that ethical institutions are mutually supporting, constituting a system. However, the ancient Greek family that Hegel describes in the Phenomenology comes to stand in a negative relationship to the public institutions of the state. This negative relationship is the source of the tragic conflict in which Antigone finds herself. Does the family simply promote different goods than other social institutions do, or is the relation between the family and other institutions one of conflict and struggle?

Finally, in addition to the fact that we do not find these same kinds of tragic conflict in modern ethical life, Hegel's argument in the Philosophy of Right also seems to indicate that we can give a kind of justification for the institution of the modern family that was not available in the ancient world. In the Phenomenology, Hegel stresses that the basis of familial obligation is a mysterious divine law whose source and justification are simply unknown.[4] However, if Hegel's primary interest in the Philosophy of Right is to show that the family is an institution of freedom, then it should be clear that we can give a rational and reflective justification for the obligations which we immediately (and often unquestioningly) experience as family members. Even if our felt responses to familial obligations are immediate and unreflective, is it possible to give a rational account of those responses, or must they remain shrouded in mystery?

These questions concerning the family aside, Ciavatta's account of the foundational role that unreflective and unconscious affects and dispositions play in Hegel's conceptions of agency and selfhood is nuanced and insightful. His discussion of the "Self-consciousness" chapter of the Phenomenology ably demonstrates the sense in which Hegel believes that recognition not only contributes to our constitution as selves, but also shapes our experience of the objective world. His treatment of the discussion of feeling in the Philosophy of Spirit throws helpful light on Hegel's view of both the unreflective character of ethical life and the sense in which one's affective involvements in the central institutions of social life play such an important role in the development of individual identity and character. (That discussion also does much to clarify some of the more puzzling discussions in the "Anthropology," like those of magic and animal magnetism.) Finally, the treatment of familial property and ownership provides a helpful account of how otherwise individualistic institutions like property in fact come to acquire an ethical significance when they are incorporated into concrete social practices. On the whole, Ciavatta's account of the contribution of the family to the establishment of relations of intersubjective recognition is phenomenologically sensitive and thoughtful, and his book constitutes a valuable contribution to our understanding of Hegel's practical philosophy.


[1] Hegel suggests that the "ethical substance" generally (and not just the family) is what provides individual subjects with their "feeling of self" (Selbstgefühl). G. W. F. Hegel, Philosophie des Rechts, in Theorie Werkausgabe 7, ed. Eva Moldenauer and K. M. Michel (Frankfurt a. M.: Suhrkamp, 1970), §147, p. 295. The honor that one derives from membership in a "corporation" or work association and the patriotic feeling that one experiences as a citizen of a particular state seem plausible candidates for the ways in which unreflective feelings and dispositions provide the backdrop for participation in these other institutions.

[2] Hegel, Philosophie des Rechts, §164, p. 315.

[3] We find several such accounts in the recent literature. See Robert Pippin's account of the role that recognition plays in the mature Philosophy of Spirit in Pippin, Hegel's Practical Philosophy (New York: Cambridge University Press, 2008), Chapters 2 and 7 especially.

[4] The ancient attitude toward the law, at least as Hegel portrays it in the Phenomenology, is one that countenances this mystery. The law of the ancient world counted "as the unwritten and unmistakable right of the gods: not something of today and yesterday, but rather living forever, and no one knows from whence it appeared." Hegel, Phänomenologie des Geistes, ¶437, p. 311.