2011.03.15

Nir Eisikovits

Sympathizing with the Enemy: Reconciliation, Transitional Justice, Negotiation

Nir Eisikovits, Sympathizing with the Enemy: Reconciliation, Transitional Justice, Negotiation, Martinus Nijhoff Publishers, 2010, 154pp., $49.00 (pbk), ISBN 9789089790187.

Reviewed by Jack Russell Weinstein, University of North Dakota


The renewed interest in Adam Smith as a philosopher is partially fueled by the need to develop a philosophically sophisticated method for communicating across cultural differences. Smith's account of sympathy in The Theory of Moral Sentiments (TMS) provides a flexible framework for imagining the situations and perspective of others, and many find his eighteenth-century approach useful for twenty-first-century problems. Martha Nussbaum used it as a basis for judicial compassion in Poetic Justice,[1] and in Distant Suffering, Luc Boltanksi relied upon it to examine the media's role in getting people to understand the plight of distant communities.[2] In Sympathizing with the Enemy: Reconciliation, Transitional Justice, Negotiation, Nir Eisikovits attempts the ambitious task of building a Smithian method for reconciling peoples after deep, protracted conflicts.

Eisikovits aims to provide an account of reconciliation that is "both normative and descriptive," one that "will provide both the minimal conditions of what we should count as reconciliation and illuminate the successes and failures of specific cases" (p. 7, italics in original). He does so by building on "sympathy" as Smith describes it in the first section of TMS (p. 1): any "fellow-feeling" a spectator has with an agent.[3] For Smith, sympathy is a natural process that makes the happiness of others necessary to people although they derive "nothing from it except the pleasure of seeing it."[4] It is cultivated through education and proximity, the first of which is a major theme in Sympathizing with the Enemy.

The first two sections of Eisikovits's book are devoted to the definition of reconciliation and its defense, the next provides an account of how people become sympathetic, and the last three (about half the book) focus on actual cases: war crimes trails, truth commissions, and the conflict resolution profession itself. The book is short, mostly an easy read (I mean this in the most positive sense), and the prose is efficient with a personable authorial voice. It is organized thoroughly and easy to follow. As such, it can be used both as a classroom primer and as a means for furthering the reconciliation discourse.

Eisikovits defines the term reconciliation narrowly. He argues that it should be reserved for cases in which "formal questions have been resolved fairly and, in addition, some significant shift has occurred in the way the two sides perceive each other" (p. 8). Simple coexistence is not a sufficient condition for reconciliation. Instead, he claims, communities and individuals have to "coexist fairly," and "begin sympathizing with each other" (p. 10), where sympathy in Eisikovits's parlance is "a conscious attempt to put ourselves in the place of others before we make up our minds about them" (p. 11).

Sympathy, according to Eisikovits, "requires specific, detailed knowledge about the lives of others" (11). It differs from affinity in that the latter involves "the endorsement of an action because of an agreement with the ideology, commitments, or world-view of the actors" (12). In short, affinity involves feeling connections with those with whom one agrees but doesn't know much about, while sympathy necessitates learning about others despite disagreement. Sympathy "involves a critical element. The sympathizer asks herself: 'now that I know exactly what X was facing, what would I have done in his place?' Affinity does not involve such reflection" (p. 13).

Eisikovits argues that sympathy is a moderating approach, not an unreachable ideal. It is therefore a "useful buffer against the temptations of absolute justice" (p. 24), by which he means "rigid, unwavering demands to receive everything that is due to us, whether such performance is practical or not" (p. 23). It is a pragmatic virtue, and against "the uncompromising cry 'I am right!' sympathy replies with a more hesitant question, 'how do I make life bearable?'" (p. 24). Amartya Sen argues a similar point in his most recent work, The Idea of Justice, claiming that Smith's account offers a more pragmatic alternative to ideal conceptions of justice such as Rawls's.[5] For Eisikovits, because reconciliation is non-ideal, it requires other pragmatic actions such as cultivating generosity (pp. 72-77) and recognizing the merits of imperfect processes such as the Nuremburg trials (p. 89). It also challenges the idealistic ambitions of those who seek to define reconciliation as "healing" because healing is too "nebulous" a concept, especially when applied to communities (p. 122).

Eisikovits prefers truth commissions to war crimes trials:

By limiting the amount and quality of information the two sides can obtain about each other, and by discouraging the practice of political generosity, trials eliminate the possibility of sympathy, and sympathy is a precondition for political reconciliation. War crime tribunals may have substantial benefits. They can be instrumental in ending impunity, setting standards for the protection of human rights, and under some circumstances, deterring future assailants and giving the victims a sense of acknowledgement and renewed civic self worth. But whatever their benefits may be, trials, by their very nature, do not promote reconciliation (p. 101).

In contrast,

a South-African-style truth commission can be justified because it creates the preconditions for sympathy, which, in turn, is constitutive of political reconciliation… . Such bodies are morally defensible because they can generate the detailed information and the kind of political generosity required for the development of sympathetic attitudes (p. 126).

Here again we see the centrality of sympathy as well as its limits. Truth commissions do not necessarily lead to forgiveness, for example,[6] but Eisikovits aims for more modest ends. He seeks transitional justice, not permanent principles. And while he seeks more than tolerance, he is not asking that people become friends. He simply wants people to recognize in others, and utilize in themselves, that which Smith would have called "humanity."

The middle ground between toleration and friendship is addressed early on. Perhaps the strongest aspect of the book is Eisikovits's frequent use of compelling examples (a trait it shares with The Theory of Moral Sentiments). This may be because Eisikovits emphasizes that which he knows well -- the numerable pervasive and intractable conflicts that involve Israel. He explains,

I have lived in Israel most of my life. I was five when the peace treaty with Egypt was signed. For more than thirty years, there have been almost no violent incidents between the countries. And yet, I have been to Egypt once, for a short stay, in a completely westernized resort in the Sinai desert. For all practical purposes, I have never seen an Egyptian or talked to one. The same is true of almost every other Israeli I know. Egyptians are even stricter in their insistence upon staying away from their Jewish neighbors. Israelis and Egyptians have no claims against each other. Most of the time they have no complaints against each other, either. They simply want nothing to do with each other. It strikes me as implausible to describe this state of affairs as one of reconciliation (9).

From a pluralist point of view, this account is heartbreaking. From a realist point of view, it is a major victory. Eisikovits's judgment, however, lies somewhere in between. He aims to describe the transitional step that takes people from toleration to care, a noble goal. Except for momentary lapses such as the above quote's characterization of Israel and Egypt as westernized and non-westernized, respectively (a dichotomy many people don't find objectionable, but I find false to say the least), Eisikovits himself has nothing but his own sympathy and generosity for both sides of each issue. His illustrations are models of restraint and compassion, including, incidentally, his treatment of other philosophers, most of whom he disagrees with. This is yet another reason to consider using the book in the classroom.

However, despite its many virtues, Sympathizing with the Enemy feels superficial at times. Eisikovits's responses can seem too easy and too anachronistic. Take for example the criticisms he addresses when he calls for detailed imagery of suffering, pedagogical representations designed to force people to recognize the circumstances of others. He cites two specific objections to his approach: first, electronic imagery can easily be forged, and second, over-exposure can lead to apathy (pp. 64-71). To the first he responds by conceding that care and discernment are needed in the face of technological manipulation, but reminds us also that the technology for creating fake images has also made it easier to detect them. He then adds, citing the well-publicized photos of Abu Ghraib, that "the so-called 'digital revolution' has not only made it easier to forge pictures. It has also made it easier to take them" (p. 66). The goods of digital media outweigh the bad.

To the second, the concern about apathy, he responds with a more detailed rebuttal, concluding that "the risk of apathy arises only if the same people are subjected to the same images over and over," and adding that "there is no reason to assume that this is what actually happens" (p. 69). But this is too easy an answer. People do not become desensitized to individual pictures only; they become inured to similar acts. Seeing one corpse makes it easier to see others. We see this pattern most commonly in pornography where the viewer's search for new sexually explicit images is accompanied by the need for increasing intensity and more specific requirements. Desensitization necessitates explicitness; for the habituated, only the most extreme images trigger the brain's pleasure centers.

Eisikovits also leaves out a third objection, one that follows directly from the second: as we see in contemporary cinema and literature, suffering often becomes pornography. If detailed electronic imagery is required for sympathy, what is to prevent people from being attracted to the violence itself, for wanting to see it? Long running video series such as Faces of Death and websites such as www.vbs.tv specialize in the titillating presentation of real violence and real suffering. If sympathy is to be the basis of reconciliation, there must be a bulwark against the enjoyment of the suffering of the enemy. The temptation to enjoy the misery of those we hate is powerful.

My comments above are a quibble and should be understood as such. My main concern with the book is its depiction of Smith, which is much too abbreviated to be meaningful. While I am tremendously sympathetic to the claim that Smithian sympathy can overcome otherness, Eisikovits does not do the requisite work to establish the Smithian foundation. Take, for example, his claim, cited above, that sympathy involves asking oneself "now that I know exactly what X was facing, what would I have done in his place?" This formulation is both trite -- we must walk in another person's shoes before we judge them -- and, as a claim about what Smith wrote, inaccurate. Smith does not require the spectator to ask what he or she would do if he or she were in the agent's place. Instead, he asks how the spectator would judge the agent if he or she could imagine being the agent him or herself:

When I condole with you for the loss of your only son, in order to enter into your grief I do not consider what I, a person of such a character and profession, should suffer, if I had a son, and if that son was unfortunately to die: but I consider what I should suffer if I was really you, and I not only change circumstances with you, but I change persons and characters. My grief, therefore, is entirely upon your own account, and not in the least upon my own.[7]

This is a crucial difference between a spectator asking what something might feel like to him- or herself and what something actually feels like to the person being watched, because only the latter requires that the spectator inhabit the personhood of the other. Only the latter necessitates becoming someone else and making decisions as they do. It demands more than just the informed judgment of education; it requires an imagination-based existential commitment to the reality of the other and the psychology that lies at the core of the suffering.

Smith acknowledges a complication with this process. Each person is trapped in his or her own physical separateness,[8] but Smith embraces this fact as an essential tension within the human sympathetic experience. And, as an extension, while individuals sympathize most easily with those with whom they have regular contact -- sympathy becoming more difficult as one extends outward from family to neighbors, to community members -- Smith complements the sympathetic process with duty, justice, and the market. Eisikovits acknowledges none of this, making sympathy more powerful than even Smith thinks it is. He claims, for example, that "forgiveness, forgetfulness, and recognition are, for all practical purposes, irrelevant when the battle still rages. Not so sympathy" (p. 16). Contrast this with Smith's comments: "Instruments of war are agreeable, though their immediate effect may seem to be in the same manner pain and suffering. But then it is the pain and suffering of our enemies, with whom we have no sympathy."[9] Here, Eisikovits and Smith simply disagree.

Eisikovits may be able to claim that his book is Smithian, but he cannot rightly claim that it is rooted in Smith. There are moments when it feels as if Eisikovits only read the first description of sympathy in TMS, not the several hundred pages of qualifications that followed. Nevertheless, I do not mean to suggest that Eisikovits is barking up a wrong tree. I think the two works are largely compatible. There is great potential in the Smithian foundation and much more to learn from Smith himself. Consider one final example. In discussing the possibility of sympathizing with serial killers, Eisikovits reminds his readers that

sympathizing, as we have construed it, can be a critical process. It involves an imaginative attempt to switch places with another and consider how one would have acted in her place. It is perfectly legitimate to conclude the act of imaginative identification with a sense of nausea, pronouncing: 'I would never have done that.' What is illegitimate is to be nauseated before the exercise is carried out (p. 45).

This is, of course, another instance of his overly simplistic account of sympathetic identification. More importantly, though, had Eisikovits chosen to do so, this would have been an excellent moment to discuss Smith's theory of the impartial spectator, the mechanism through which Smith avoids relativism, preserves the possibility of challenging community standards, and creates a dynamic theory of conscience.

Like sympathy, the impartial spectator is a product of the imagination. Creating it, the spectator divides "as it were, into two persons" and, adopting as much as possible an impartial community-based and informed perspective, judges his or her own actions.[10] In other words, the impartial spectator is the normal spectator pretending to be the person imagining to be him or her. Through this, he or she is able to judge his or her own actions more effectively. Smith's is a sophisticated and influential account of intersubjective moral discovery and practices. It is this that allows an individual to react to the nausea that comes from imagining oneself as a serial killer.

Furthermore, Eisikovits claims that one should not be nauseated in advance -- that it is "illegitimate to be nauseated before the exercise is carried out" -- but Smith has a mechanism for dealing with this as well: the general rules of conduct. These are moral prescriptions developed, by an agent, over time, to guide actions in absence of the individual moments of sympathy. One need only follow this rule; one need not sympathize with every monster out in the world. Yes, sympathy may be required to re-examine the general rules of conduct over time (Smith never claims actors or spectators are infallible), and sympathy may be useful in creating a mechanism for reconciling with the serial killer, but sympathy is not necessary for the moral condemnation Eisikovits describes here.

I conclude by remarking, again, that the book is interesting, constructive, well-written, compelling, and, I think, both an excellent primer for the issues involved and a useful piece of research for the reconciliation community. I recommend that people read it. However, it is also sometimes too superficial and too quick to dismiss deep controversies, a fact most explicitly seen in its treatment of Smith's account of sympathy. Sympathizing with the Enemy may be of little use to those scholars who struggle with Smith's own texts, but if it gets a new and different community to open The Theory of Moral Sentiments then I, for one, welcome its publication.


[1] Nussbaum, Martha. Poetic Justice. Boston, Beacon Press, 1995.

[2] Boltanski, Luke. Distant Suffering. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1999.

[3] TMS I.i.1.5. All references to Smith advert The Theory of Moral Sentiments. Ed. A.L. Macfie and D.D. Raphael. Indianapolis: Liberty Press, 1982.

[4] TMS I.i.1.1.

[5] Sen, Amartya. The Idea of Justice. Cambridge: Harvard University Press, 2009.

[6] Griswold, Charles L. Forgiveness: A Philosophical Exploration, Cambridge University Press, 2007.

[7] TMS VII.iii.1.4.

[8] TMS I.i.3.10.

[9] TMS I.ii.4.

[10] TMS III.1.6.