2011.03.23

Bradley Monton

Seeking God in Science: An Atheist Defends Intelligent Design

Bradley Monton, Seeking God in Science: An Atheist Defends Intelligent Design, 2009, Broadview Press, 180pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781551118635.

Reviewed by Sahotra Sarkar, University of Texas at Austin


In 1968 Andy Warhol is supposed to have said, "In the future everyone will be world-famous for 15 minutes." The book under review appears to be one philosopher's attempt to cash in on that exciting possibility. Its claim for attention comes from Monton's self-portrayal as an atheist who thinks that some Intelligent Design (ID) arguments have enough force to make him less certain of his atheism, though not eschew it altogether. These ID arguments are primarily supposed to be those that are based on physics (especially cosmology), not those involving critiques of evolutionary biology. The result is a somewhat more philosophically sophisticated defense of the possibility of ID. The fact that this defense fails, in the sense that it does not make ID plausible (and even Monton claims that the best arguments are only "somewhat" plausible), underscores the difficulty of the task.

The book consists of four chapters. The first long one is devoted to a careful statement of the so-called theory of ID. Like some other fellow travelers of ID creationism (see, e.g., Fuller [2007], reviewed by Sarkar [2008]), Monton is convinced that ID's most vocal proponents (for instance, personnel from the Discovery Institute) do not formulate its central claims in their most precise and plausible form. After many pedestrian detours, this becomes:

The theory of intelligent design holds that certain global features of the universe provide evidence for the existence of an intelligent cause, or that certain biologically innate features of living things provide evidence for the doctrine that the features are the result of the intentional action of an intelligent cause which is not biologically related to the living things, and provide evidence against the doctrine that the features are the result of an undirected process such as natural selection. (p. 39)

Though biology forms part of this definition, Monton makes it clear that he finds ID arguments against evolution less compelling than those drawing on physics and other areas. Monton accepts ID proponents' assertion that their position does not entail accepting theism. The chapter ends with an attempt to refute an argument by Sober (2007) designed to show that ID requires positing a supernatural designer.

The second chapter addresses the question whether ID is science. Most of this chapter consists of an unedited version of a paper Monton has been circulating since 2006 which achieved some notoriety for arguing that Judge John E. Jones III's decision in Dover v. Kitzmiller was flawed to the extent that it relied on a sharp demarcation criterion between science and non-science. The rest of the chapter consists of some heavy-handed criticism of Pennock's (1999) arguments designed to show that methodological naturalism is central to the pursuit of science. Monton ultimately concludes by arguing that the question of whether ID is science or not is of little interest compared to that of its "truth."

The third and most substantive chapter presents five "somewhat plausible intelligent design arguments": fine-tuning, kalam cosmological, improbability of life from non-life, irreducible complexity, and computer simulation. Monton develops each of these arguments and then discusses and responds to objections. Only the last argument (from simulation) is unusual in the context of a discussion of ID, Monton's point being that, if we are really entities within a computer simulation, then some intelligent designer must have created that simulation. Typically, the objections to these arguments are expressed with considerable clarity, and Monton's response consists of noting that he is not fully convinced. Monton does a better job of developing the objections than the arguments themselves, which underscores the chapter's contention that they are at best somewhat plausible.

Finally, Chapter 4 turns to the even more controversial question of whether ID should be taught in schools and taught in science classes. Monton's affirmative answer is a change in his position from that of the paper reprinted in Chapter 2, in which he argued that ID should not be so taught because it would be bad pedagogy. The new position is defended here with one interesting argument and a variety of ad hoc moves (we need a new model for science education, ID arguments are interesting, students would hear about them in any case, and so on). The interesting argument is that ID would provide a foil for teaching scientific method which, according to Monton, is part of science teaching. Even if this is true, it remains unclear why a manufactured controversy, such as ID, serves as a better example than some genuine scientific controversy which remains unresolved (for instance, selectionism versus neutrality in the case of evolution) or one which, though scientifically resolved, remains politically controversial (for instance, anthropogenic climate change).

Turning to a more critical appraisal of the book, it is at best somewhat disappointing. Showing that popular statements of ID theory are imprecise is of little value; showing that these can be reformulated in a more precise form is hardly surprising provided we accept terms such as "intelligent" and "design" as unproblematic. I have argued elsewhere that these cannot be given plausible non-theistic interpretations (Sarkar 2011) and Monton's treatment does not assuage those worries (though Monton refers to the work in question). Similarly, Monton is not original in pointing out the problems with relying on a demarcation criterion to denigrate ID or other forms of creationism as non-science. (Indeed, he quotes Laudan [1982] copiously for originally making this point.) The arguments against methodological naturalism suffer from the lack of a precise statement of what that position is or what "supernatural" means (though Pennock [1999] is not any better on either of these points).

Monton should get credit for not ultimately relying on biological arguments for ID. The treatment of biology in the book leaves much to be desired. Natural selection is routinely called an undirected process (pp. 16, 17, 18, 51), which shows a rather unsophisticated lack of familiarity with what constitutes natural selection. The critical point is that the theory of natural selection is neutral about whether the origin of variation is blind (undirected) or not; all natural selection requires are (i) the existence of variation (whether or not these arose blindly), (ii) fitness differences between the variants, and (iii) inheritance of the variation (Lewontin 1970). Given these assumptions, the fitness differences lead to directional selection resulting in increased adaptation between an organism and its environment. It turns out that variation (mutation) is blind (random) in life as we know it on Earth, but that is only half the story.

No biologist I know denies that the origin of life remains an unsolved problem. The trouble is that, to argue that the existence of life is evidence for ID, Monton only offers ad hoc claims and estimates of the improbability of life arising without intelligent guidance. These probabilities are not based on a specification of the reference class against which all probability estimates should be founded. Critics of ID have routinely argued this rather elementary point (Fitelson et al. 1999; Shallit and Ellsbury 2004; Sober 2004; Sarkar 2007) and it is intellectually irresponsible for Monton not to have addressed these criticisms. What we see in this book is a failure to engage in the most sophisticated ongoing philosophical debates over ID (on which I will have more to say at the end of this review).

The arguments for teaching ID in schools (in Chapter 4) are particularly weak. Monton naively assumes that it is pedagogically possible to decontextualize the teaching of ID from the historical conjuncture in which it has arisen, viz., attempts to introduce theological considerations into science classrooms in the United States within its specific legal framework (consisting, most importantly, of the Establishment Clause). Throughout the book, Monton's strategy often consists of accepting the Discovery Institute's propaganda at face value, for instance, its recent claims that it opposed the teaching of ID creationism (pp. 12, 135). He ignores the evidence in essays by several ID proponents (who are associated with the Discovery Institute) (Campbell and Meyer 2003). Moreover, even by Monton's own lights, the conclusion should have been otherwise. Since students are bound to hear of ID (according to Monton), by refusing to countenance ID in science classes we would show them that even the question whether it is science is not scientifically interesting.

This book also suffers stylistically from appearing unusually pretentious. The Preface consists largely of claims about how Monton is attempting to rise above the debate between ID proponents and their critics as, allegedly, a philosopher ought. He adds:

Philosophers are trained to be dispassionate evaluators of arguments, so it's especially unfortunate that so many of the objections that so many philosophers give against intelligent design arguments are unfair, emotionally driven, or not that well thought out. My goal is to do my best to look at matters more objectively. (p. 7)

Strictly speaking, Monton is not accusing all philosophers of producing bad arguments. But, throughout the book, he only refers to the polemical writings of philosophers such as Forrest and Pennock (besides several non-philosophers). With one exception (Sober 2007), he ignores all philosophical arguments that have approached ID creationist arguments on their own terms and have treated them at least as seriously as anything found in this book (Fitelson et al. 1999; Sober 2004, 2008; Sarkar 2007, 2011). The book ends in the same vein:

I don't much care whether I change minds or win decisions in the public forum. What I care about is getting at the truth. I wouldn't want to change minds with bad argumentation, and whether I give good arguments for the views I think are right is more important to me than whether, say, intelligent design gets proselytized about in school. (p. 156)

Unfortunately, except in a few discussions of objections to ID arguments, the book never meets this intellectual standard.

References

Campbell, J. A. and Meyer, S. C. Eds. 2003. Darwinism, Design and Public Education. East Lansing, MI: Michigan State University Press.

Fitelson, B., Stephens, C., and Sober, E. 1999. "How Not to Detect Design: A Review of W. Dembski's The Design Inference." Philosophy of Science 66: 476 -488.

Fuller, S. 2007. Science v. Religion? Intelligent Design and the Problem of Evolution. Cambridge, UK: Polity Press.

Laudan, L. 1982. "Science at the Bar: Causes for Concern." Science, Technology and Human Values 7: 16 -19.

Lewontin, R. C. 1970. "The Units of Evolution." Annual Reviews of Ecology and Systematics 1: 1 -18.

Pennock. R. 1999. The Tower of Babel: The Evidence against the New Creationism. Cambridge, MA: MIT Press.

Sarkar, S. 2007. Doubting Darwin? Creationist Designs on Evolution. Oxford, UK: Blackwell.

Sarkar, S. 2008. Review of Fuller, S., Science v. Religion? Intelligent Design and the Problem of Evolution. Notre Dame Philosophical Reviews 2008.08.07.

Sarkar, S. 2011. "The Science Question in Intelligent Design." Synthese 178: 291 -305.

Shallit, J. and Ellsbury, W. 2004. "Playing Games with Probability: Dembski's Complex Specified Information." In Young, M. and Edis, T. Eds. Why Intelligent Design Fails: A Scientific Critiques of the New Creationism. New Brunswick, NJ: Rutgers University Press, pp. 121 -138.

Sober, E. 2004. "The Design Argument." In Mann, W. Ed. The Blackwell Guide to the Philosophy of Religion. Oxford, UK: Blackwell, pp. 117 -147.

Sober, E. 2007. "Intelligent Design Theory and the Supernatural: the 'God or Extra-terrestrials Reply'," Faith and Philosophy 24: 72 -82.

Sober, E. 2008. Evidence and Evolution: The Logic Behind the Science. Cambridge, UK: Cambridge University Press.