2011.03.28

Jody Azzouni

Talking about Nothing: Numbers, Hallucinations, and Fictions

Jody Azzouni, Talking about Nothing: Numbers, Hallucinations, and Fictions, Oxford University Press, 2010, 273pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199738946.

Reviewed by Joshua Spencer, Syracuse University


1. Introduction

In Talking about Nothing, Jody Azzouni defends the view, roughly, that there are true sentences apparently about numbers, hallucinations, and fictional characters which are in fact about nothing, or at least nothing existent. Although various philosophers, including defenders of Meinongianism, have endorsed similar views, Azzouni intends to formulate a novel theory of true sentences that are apparently about nothing. In order to get a better grip on the topic of Azzouni's book it might be helpful to look at some examples. Consider:

(1) Sherlock Holmes does not exist.

This sentence seems to express a truth and its content seems to have the same form as the content of the following sentence:

(2) Barack Obama does not exist.

However, whereas (2) seems to be about Barack Obama, (1) doesn't seem to be about anything or, at least, nothing existent. But, there are many examples other than negative existentials. The following sentence seems to express a truth:

(3) Sherlock Holmes is depicted in some short stories as living at 221B Baker Street.

Moreover, the content of (3) seems to have the same form as the content of the following:

(4) Barack Obama is depicted in some address books as living at 1600 Pennsylvania Avenue.

However, whereas (4) is about Barack Obama, (3) doesn't seem to be about anything or, at least, nothing existent. Sentences like (1) and (3), and whatever mental states share their contents, are the kinds of sentences and mental states that Azzouni is interested in.[1]

Azzouni believes that there is an important similarity between (1) and (2) and between (3) and (4). Just as (2) and (4) function in an object-directed kind of way, so too (1) and (3) function in an object-directed kind of way (25-28, 46-47). It just so happens that whereas there is an object to which (2) and (4) are directed, there is no such object, or no such existent object, to which (1) and (3) are directed. Moreover, in virtue of the fact that (2) and (4) function in an object-directed kind of way, they do not express fully general propositions. So too, in virtue of the fact that (1) and (3) function in an object-directed kind of way, they do not express fully general propositions. Azzouni suggests that the propositions expressed by (1)-(4) are all singular propositions and that this is true even though there is nothing, or nothing existent, that (1) and (3) are about. Finally, (1)-(4) all function in an object-directed kind of way because they all contain expressions, 'Barack Obama' and 'Sherlock Holmes', that function in an object-directed kind of way ('Sherlock Holmes', of course, does so even though there may be no object, or no existent object, to which it is directed). Moreover, these expressions are object-directed in a way that 'the president of the United States' and 'the greatest fictional detective' are not. Let's call any terms that function in this object-directed way 'singular terms'. Let's call any terms that either refer to nothing or refer to nothing existent 'empty terms'. Azzouni believes, then, that there are singular terms that are also empty terms.

But Azzouni also believes that some sentences containing such singular empty terms express truths. Moreover, some such sentences express truths and not solely in virtue of logical form or solely in virtue of some combination of logical form and referential defectiveness.[2] Sentence (3) is, according to Azzouni, an example of such a sentence. This view breaks the putative connection between semantics and ontology. In doing so it gives hope to the nominalist who wants various sentences like (1) and (3) to express truths.

The book is divided into two parts. In Part I, Azzouni considers sentences that seem to involve terms that refer to numbers, hallucinations, and fictional characters. In this first part of his book, Azzouni attempts to develop a positive view about the nature and content of these sentences. He does so primarily by comparing and contrasting his view with the many views of his opponents. Along the way, he addresses a number of related issues. Amongst many other issues, Azzouni considers the role that some sentences containing empty singular terms play in scientific explanation, and he also investigates predication and property attribution involved in such sentences. In part II, Azzouni assumes that some sentences containing singular empty terms express propositions that play important explanatory roles in science and hence are true. He then investigates the relationship between such sentences in different scientific fields. Azzouni believes that because certain true sentences involving singular empty terms play a central role in various scientific fields, the prospects of reducing all fields of science to just one field are extremely grim. He argues for the conclusion that, at best, we will be able to state gross correlational regularities between the various propositions of one scientific field and those of another. Finally, Azzouni, fully embracing the claim that some sentences containing singular empty terms play a central role in various scientific investigations, decides the scientific investigation of semantics is no different. So, in the final section, Azzouni provides a Tarski-style semantic theory using what, by his lights, are singular empty terms in the metalanguage.

2. Sentences Containing Singular Empty Terms are about Non- Existents

It turns out that the details of Azzouni's view are rather elusive. He believes that numbers, hallucinations, and fictional characters don't exist. However, contrary to what his title suggests, he does seem to believe that some things are numbers or hallucinations or fictional characters. One good way to discover some of the details of Azzouni's view is to look at some of the puzzles and arguments that interest him and determine his responses. In this section, I will consider a puzzle suggested by Azzouni's extensive discussion in chapter two. I will argue that Azzouni's discussion, at best, establishes that numbers, hallucinations, and fictional characters don't exist. In the next section, I will discuss Azzouni's response to indispensability arguments and some of his claims about semantics. The upshot of that discussion is that Azzouni does not (or should not) believe, contrary to his title, that when we talk about numbers, hallucinations, and fictional characters we are talking about nothing. Finally, I will conclude with a discussion that is intended to more clearly distinguish his view from certain Meinongian views already quite prominent in the literature.

Azzouni endorses four intuitions that he believes are in tension with one another. First, The Aboutness Intuition implies that sentences (1) and (3) above are about Sherlock Holmes. This intuition also suggests that, generally, sentences involving names are about whatever is named (even if the things named turn out to be non-existents) (52-54). Second, The Normality Intuition implies that the propositions expressed by (1) and (3) have, respectively, the same form as the propositions expressed by (2) and (4). More generally, it seems to suggest that sentences of the same grammatical form express propositions of the same form (55). This intuition seems to be closely connected to Azzouni's discussion of the singular or object-directed nature of sentences involving names. Third, The Truth Intuition implies that (1) and (3), and many other sentences that seem to be about nothing, or nothing existent, are true (55). Moreover, it seems that many such sentences are true not simply in virtue of logical form or some combination of logical form and referential defectiveness. Finally, The Existence Intuition implies that numbers, hallucinations, and fictional characters don't exist and don't have properties (55). In our particular example, the intuition implies that Sherlock Holmes does not exist and does not have the properties being attributed in sentences (1) and (3).

The tension in these four intuitions is not immediately obvious, but I think these intuitions support four parts of an inconsistent pentad. Consider sentences (3) and (4) again, along with the following five statements:

I. (3) is about Sherlock Holmes.

II. The proposition expressed by (3) is of the same form as the proposition expressed by (4).

III. (3) expresses a truth.

IV. If (I)-(III), then Sherlock Holmes exists and has the property expressed by 'is depicted in some short stories as living at 221B Baker Street'.

V. But, Sherlock Holmes does not exist and, hence, has no properties.

Although Azzouni doesn't explicitly address this inconsistent pentad, his four intuitions obviously support (I)-(III) and (V). But, those four statements are not inconsistent. The addition of (IV) does result in an inconsistent set of statements and, moreover, (IV) has strong theoretical support.

(4) is obviously about Obama and expresses a truth. Moreover, it seems that in order for it to be true, it must be that the thing it is about, namely Obama, exists and has the property expressed by 'is depicted in some address books as living at 1600 Pennsylvania Avenue'. Similarly, if (3) is about Sherlock Holmes and expresses a truth, then given that it has the same form as (4) it seems that it too can be true only if the thing it is about, namely Sherlock Holmes, exists and has the property expressed by 'is depicted in some short stories as living at 221B Baker Street'. This simple idea and the simple semantics it suggests provide strong theoretical support for (IV).

Following Azzouni a bit more closely, it seems that there is an ontological/semantic assumption behind (IV). This is an ontological/semantic assumption that Azzouni ultimately rejects (58). Being a nominalist, Azzouni is happy to reject (IV) by denying that Sherlock Holmes exists.[3] Interestingly, however, although in a number of places Azzouni claims that non-existents have no properties, it turns out that on his official view they do (82-88). I will come back to this below.

3. Sentences Containing Singular Empty Terms are not about Nothing

Here are three principles that are widely accepted:

VI. Any sentence that expresses a proposition which plays an indispensible role in scientific explanation expresses a truth.

VII. Any true sentence with ineliminable singular terms logically entails a sentence involving ineliminable particular quantification.

VIII. Any sentence involving ineliminable particular quantification carries existential commitment.

These theses provide powerful tools in ontology. They, or principles relevantly similar to them, have been used to argue for the existence of numbers.[4] The argument for the existence of numbers is pretty straightforward once one identifies a sentence that involves numerals (singular terms that apparently refer to numbers) and that plays an indispensible role in scientific explanation.

Azzouni believes, though, that there are also sentences involving singular terms that refer to hallucinations or fictional characters that play an indispensible role in scientific explanation (60-62, 118-120). With (VI)-(VIII) there is an easy argument for the existence of hallucinations or fictional characters. Of course, as we saw in the last section, Azzouni does not believe that numbers, hallucinations, or fictional characters exist. So, he must reject one of (VI)-(VIII).

Azzouni is happy to accept (VI). Moreover, he seems to accept (VII). At the very least, he provides a semantics for a language that involves a particular quantifier that seems to verify (VII) (222-227). It turns out that Azzouni rejects (VIII). According to Azzouni, a sentence has existential commitment only if it is about or quantifies over (in an ineliminably particular way) entities that are mind and language independent (14-17). However, some sentences are about or quantify over (in an ineliminably particular way) mind and language dependent things. No such sentence carries existential commitment. So, in some sense, Azzouni does accept that when we talk about numbers, hallucinations, and fictional characters we are talking about some things. It is just that those things are non-existents.[5]

4. Properties

Azzouni's view sounds a lot like Meinongianism. One may legitimately ask, then, what is it that distinguishes Azzouni from Meinongians? To answer this question, I think it is best to look back at statement (IV) of our inconsistent pentad and the semantic/ontological assumption that lies behind it. Azzouni claims Meinongians accept the semantic/ontological assumption that lies behind (IV) whereas he rejects that assumption.

Here is a principle that seems to bring out the semantic/ontological assumption that lies behind (IV) a bit more clearly:

(SO1) If (I)-(III), then the proposition expressed by (3) is true in virtue of the fact that Holmes exists and has the property expressed by 'is depicted in some short stories as living at 221B Baker Street'.

However, this is not an assumption that Meinongians share since they reject the claim that Holmes exists. Hence, the rejection of (SO1) cannot be something that helps distinguish Azzouni from Meinongians. Moreover, this raises an interesting point. Meinongians agree with Azzouni that (IV) is false. So, the semantic/ontological assumption that lies behind (IV), which Meinongians accept and which Azzouni rejects, cannot be an assumption that entails (IV).

One principle, which does not entail (IV) but which may naturally go along with (IV) is the following:

(SO2) If (I)-(III), then the proposition expressed by (3) is true in virtue of the fact that something is Holmes and has the property expressed by 'is depicted in some short stories as living at 221B Baker Street'.

But, it cannot be that the rejection of this principle is what Azzouni thinks distinguishes him from Meinongians since he thinks that it is an inessential part of the Meinongian view that various non-existents are objects of quantification (57).

Rather, Azzouni seems to think that he rejects something like the following principle whereas Meinongians accept it:

(SO3) If (I)-(III), then the proposition expressed by (3) is true in virtue of the fact that Holmes has the property expressed by 'is depicted in some short stories as living at 221B Baker Street'.

In fact, I think that Azzouni believes something even more radical. On a number of occasions, he says that non-existents have no properties (16, 82, 185). However, as I mentioned before, he also seems to believe that on certain occasions we can make true property attributions of non-existents (82-88). I believe that there is a way to reconcile these seemingly inconsistent claims. Let's say that an object fundamentally has a property iff some truth about it is true ultimately partially in virtue of the fact that that object has that property. I think Azzouni believes that although non-existents have properties, they don't fundamentally have any properties.

5. Conclusion

I have tried, in this review, to sketch what I take to be the central details of Azzouni's view. Admittedly, Azzouni's book is difficult and the details of his view are quite elusive. However, if my interpretation is correct, then Azzouni wants to break more thoroughly the putative connection between semantics and ontology. According to Azzouni, we should not conclude merely from the fact that certain sentences, indispensible to science, quantify (in an irreducibly particular way) over entities of a certain sort that those entities exist. We may conclude, however, that such sentences are true. This makes the view compatible with a nominalist position according to which no numbers, hallucinations, or fictional objects exist.

References

Braun, David (1993) "Empty Names", Nous 27: 443-69.

Putnam, Hilary (1979) "What is Mathematical Truth", in Mathematics, Matter and Method: Philosophical papers Volume 1, 2nd edition. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. 60-78.

Quine, W. V. (1953) "On what there is" in From a Logical Point of View, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press. (1980) 1-19.

Quine, W. V. (1976) "Carnap and Logical Truth" in The Ways of Paradox and Other Essays, revised edition, (1983) 355-376, Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press.


[1] For the remainder of this review, I will focus on the sentences that interest Azzouni and not on the mental states.

[2] Many philosophers might be willing to admit that 'either Sherlock Holmes is a detective or it is not the case that Sherlock Holmes is a detective' expresses a truth. But this is true solely in virtue of logical form. Moreover, some philosophers might be willing to say that 'Sherlock Holmes does not exist' expresses a truth in virtue of the fact that 'Sherlock Holmes exists' is referentially defective and, hence, expresses a falsehood and the fact that the first sentence is merely the negation of the second sentence. See Braun (1993) and Quine (1953) for very different examples of this kind of view.

[3] There is a snag in my interpretation of Azzouni. He says that part of his view involves modifying The Aboutness Intuition (59). However, on my interpretation of his view, there is no need to modify Aboutness. Perhaps he thinks that Aboutness lends some kind of support to statement (IV) in the inconsistent pentad and that whatever aspect of Aboutness lends such support must be modified.

[4] See, for example, Quine (1976) and Putnam (1979).

[5] It turns out that Azzouni's views may be far more complicated than I have made them out to be. He seems to believe our language is radically context sensitive. Our grammatically relational words express "real" relations in some contexts and not in others. Moreover, our use of the words 'something' and 'nothing' are also context sensitive. In some contexts we may infer by particular generalization and in other contexts we may not. Whether or not such an inference preserves truth depends on whether we are using an existentially loaded notion of 'something' and on whether we are expressing real relations by our grammatically relational terms. For more details see pp. 15, 43-45. It is unclear to me whether Azzouni also believes that our one-place predications are also context sensitive. Do they, for example, express "real" properties in some contexts and not in others?